Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Conceptual Art

First published Thu Jun 7, 2007

The philosophy of art has confronted myriad issues relating to an equally diverse subject matter. From primeval painting to postmodern poetry, and from the problem of how music can convey emotion to that of nature of the existence of fictional characters, the whole spectrum of artistic activity has been considered by philosophers of art, and the questions they have sought to answer extend far into neighbouring philosophical realms and beyond. To date, however, philosophical interest in what may broadly-speaking be called conceptual art has been notably sparse. And this seems surprising. After all, both philosophy and the diverse kinds and styles of art and art-making that fall under the conceptual tradition all have one thing in common: they are both intended to make you think.

1. Conceptual Art – What Is It?

1.1 Introduction

Few artistic movements are surrounded by so much debate and controversy as conceptual art. For conceptual art has a tendency to provoke intense and perhaps even extreme reactions in its audiences. After all, whilst some people find conceptual art very refreshing and the only kind of art that is relevant to today's world, many others consider it shocking, distasteful, skill-less, downright bad, or, and most importantly, not art at all. Conceptual art, it seems, is something that we either love or hate.

This divisive character is, however, far from accidental. Most conceptual art actively sets out to be controversial in so far as it seeks to challenge and probe us about what we tend to take as given in the domain of art. In fact, this facet of evoking argument and debate lies at the very heart of what it is trying to do, namely to make us question our assumptions not only about what may properly qualify as art and what the function of the artist should be, but also what our role as spectators should involve, and how we should relate to art. It should come as no surprise, then, that conceptual art can cause frustration or vexation – to raise difficult and sometimes even annoying questions is precisely what conceptual art in general aspires to do. In reacting strongly to conceptual art we are, in other words, playing right into its hands.

The first difficulty that a philosophical investigation of conceptual art encounters has to do with isolating the object of examination, or at least the category of objects under scrutiny. In the words of the art historian Paul Wood,

[i]t is not at all clear where the boundaries of ‘conceptual art’ are to be drawn, which artists and which works to include. Looked at in one way, conceptual art gets to be like Lewis Carroll's Cheshire cat, dissolving away until nothing is left but a grin: a handful of works made over a few short years by a small number of artists… Then again, regarded under a different aspect, conceptual art can seem like nothing less than the hinge around which the past turned into the present. (Wood 2002, 6)

On a strict historical reading, the expression ‘conceptual art’ refers to the artistic movement that reached its pinnacle between 1966 and 1972 (Lippard 1973).[1] Amongst its most famous adherents at its early stage we find artists such as Joseph Kosuth, Robert Morris, Joseph Beuys and Mel Ramsden, to name but a few. What unites all conceptual art of that period is the absorption of the lessons learnt from other twentieth-century art movements such as Dadaism, Surrealism, Suprematism, Abstract Expressionism and the Fluxus group, not to mention the attempt to once and for all ‘free’ art of the Modernist paradigm. Most importantly, perhaps, conceptual art sought to overcome a backdrop against which art's principal aim is to produce something beautiful or aesthetically pleasing. Art, early conceptual artists held, is redundant if it does not make us think. Yet most artistic institutions are not conducive to reflection and continue to promote a consumerist conception of art and artists based on beauty and technical skill and this, conceptual artists in the mid-1960s to the early 1970s agreed, must be denounced. The job of conceptual artists is instead to encourage a revisionary understanding of art, artist, and artistic experience.

Whilst conceptual art in its purest form might arguably be limited to works produced during these five or six years nearly half a century ago, it seems overly narrow – certainly from a philosophical perspective – to limit our inquiry to works produced during that period alone. For although the work created during that time might generally be conceived as more directly anti-establishment and anti-consumerist than later conceptual art, the spirit of early conceptual art seems to have carried on relatively undiluted into the very late twentieth and twenty-first centuries, as witnessed by pieces such as Tracey Emin's Unmade Bed, Damian Hirst's The Physical Impossibility of Death in the Mind of Someone Living, and The Chapman Brothers' My Family.

The highly individualised character of the intellectual exploration that conceptual art urges us to engage in has always been such that any attempt to pinpoint a specific common denominator other than this general vision and approach to art, art-making and society at large invariably fails to catch its very essence. The means of artistic expression, we are told, are infinite and the topics available for questioning and discussion are limitless. It belongs to the very nature of conceptual art, then, to be – like Lewis' Cheshire cat – elusive and slippery. Conceptual artists, be it Joseph Beuys or Damian Hirst, pursue artistic originality and representation in every possible way. For that reason, one might find ourselves obliged to replace the slightly lofty cliché according to which there are as many definitions of conceptual art as there are conceptual artists with the further claim that there are, in fact, as many definitions of conceptual art as there are conceptual artworks.

Nevertheless, in the midst of this deliberately produced uncertainty about the nature of conceptual art, a handful of characteristics and general aims do seem to recur, and although they should not be seen as criteria for conceptual art strictly speaking, they may be considered tenets fundamental to (most) conceptual art.

1.2 The Limits of Art and the Role of Artists

First and foremost, conceptual art challenges our intuitions concerning the limits of what may count as art and what it is an artist does. That is to say, works of conceptual art encourage us to think about the kind of things that may be considered to be art, and about exactly what the role of the artist should be. It does so, on the one hand, by postulating ever more complex objects as candidates for the status of ‘artwork’, and, on the other hand, by distancing the task of the artist from the actual making and manipulating of the artistic material.

A characteristic way in which conceptual art explores the boundaries of the artwork is by questioning where the realm of the artistic ends and that of utility begins. Continuing the tradition of Marcel Duchamp's readymades such as Fountain, or Bottlerack, it sets out to overthrow our traditional conceptions of what an art object should be made of and what it should look like. The artwork is a process rather than a material thing, and as such it is no longer something that can be grasped merely by seeing, hearing or touching the end product of that process. The notion of agency in art-making is thus particularly emphasised. In many cases, the ‘art-making’ and the ‘artwork’ come together, as what is sought is an identification of the notion of the work of art with the conceptual activity of the artist. Conceptual art, politicised and influenced by events such as the ‘May Days’ in Paris (1968), the ‘Hot Autumn’ in Italy (1969), the Vietnam War, and the rise of feminism, promotes a rapprochement between art-making and criticism – both artistic and social – by raising questions about the products of artistic activities and the very purpose of art. To use the words of Joseph Kosuth, it ‘both annexes the functions of the critic, and makes a middle-man unnecessary.’ (Guercio 1999, 39).

1.3 Artistic Media

As a direct result of its examination of what may properly qualify as art and its ensuing very broad conception of what may constitute an art object, conceptual art rejects traditional artistic media such as conventional painting or sculpture. Instead, it adopts alternative means of expression, including performances, photography, films, videos, events, bodies, media, new ready-mades and new mixed media. In a nutshell, then, nothing whatsoever can be ruled out in principle as possible artistic media, as can be seen, for example, in Richard Long's photograph of a line made in the grass by walking[2]; Bruce Nauman's nine minute film of the artist himself playing one note on a violin whilst walking around in his studio[3]; and Piero Manzoni's act of signing a woman's arm[4].

1.4 Art as Idea

The most fundamentally revisionary feature of conceptual art is the way in which it proclaims itself to be an art of the mind rather than the senses: it rejects traditional artistic media because it locates the artwork at the level of ideas rather than that of objects. As process matters more than physical material, and because art should be about intellectual inquiry and reflection rather than beauty and aesthetic pleasure, the work of art is said to be the idea at the heart of the piece in question. In the words of Kosuth, ‘[t]he actual works of art are ideas’ (Lippard 1973, 25). For conceptual art, ‘the idea or concept is the most important aspect of the work’ (LeWitt 1967, 166). Art is ‘de-materialised’; art is prior to its materialisation and is ultimately rooted in the agency of the artist. If art is de-materialised in this fashion, it is less likely, or so the early conceptual artists held, to be institutionalised.

The claim that the conceptual artwork itself is to be identified with the idea that may be seen to underlie it has far-reaching ramifications. It not only affects the ontology of the conceptual artwork but also profoundly alters the role of the artist by casting her in the role of thinker rather than object-maker. Moreover, it calls for a thorough review of the way in which we perceive, engage and appreciate artworks. Further still, it links art so intimately to ideas and concepts that even a principled distinction between the domain of art and the realm of thought seems difficult to preserve.

1.5 Semantic Representation

For all these reasons, the kind of representation employed in conceptual artworks aims to transmit clearly formulated ideas and, moreover, to engage us purely cerebrally rather than, say, emotively. In conceptual art, the representation at work is generally semantic rather than illustrative. That is to say, it sets out to have and convey a strong meaning rather than to depict a scene, person or event. It is important to note that the representation favoured by conceptual artists is not merely semantic in the sense of words or language appearing quite literally on the work of art, but rather in the sense of representing a meaning, or having a meaning. So that even in cases where a work makes use of illustrative representation, conceptual art is still putting that representation to a distinctively semantic use, in the sense of there being an intention to represent something one cannot see with the naked eye. Accordingly, the conceptual artist's task is to contemplate and formulate this meaning – to be a ‘meaning-maker’.

2. The Philosophy of Conceptual Art – What is it?

The philosophical concerns raised by conceptual art can be divided into two main categories. First, there are specific questions to do with conceptual art itself, and the claims which underpin the project that drives it. Philosophical investigations might thus be called for not only in relation to the internal consistency and coherence of the project and its set goals, but also with regards to the particular tenets outlined above. For example, what does it mean to say that every single thing, person or event is a possible candidate for an artwork and does that claim not render the category of art redundant? Moreover, is it philosophically viable to hold that art is idea whilst retaining a distinction (if only conceptual) between the realm of thought and that of art?

Second, conceptual art poses philosophical problems from a wider perspective, in so far as one might expect philosophy to provide us with unitary accounts of the nature of art, the role of the artist, and artistic experience. In many important respects, conceptual art sits very uncomfortably with other, often more traditional artforms and artworks, and this tension highlights a pressing issue for anyone interested in the possibility of a universal theory of art. For if there is to be one rule for conceptual art and another rule for all other kinds of art, are there still good grounds for thinking of conceptual art as a kind of art (i.e. separate from other artforms but still an artform in its own right)? Could not, moreover, every particular kind of artform or artwork demand a separate theory of art, artist and artistic experience? If so, where should these requirements based in specificity end, and might not the philosophy of art eventually loose all its explanatory power apart from when targeted at individual cases?

If we are to sidestep such an intrinsic philosophical division between conceptual art on the one hand, and other kinds of art on the other hand, then theories concerned mainly with art that is not conceptual will have to make many significant concessions in order to incorporate the problematic case that conceptual artworks presents. At the very least, a compromise will have to be reached about what we are to understand by the term ‘artwork’.

One of the over-riding concerns that beset the philosophy of conceptual art is thus whether and, if so, why one should actively pursue unified accounts in the philosophy of art. Whether one comes out of that investigation embracing a broader – albeit perhaps vaguer – set of concepts and tools than one started off with, or whether one considers oneself forced to abandon any hope of anything but very specific theories of art, artist, and artistic experience, conceptual art obliges us to think about where we stand on these issues.

Philosophizing about conceptual art is, then, not merely philosophizing about one specific artform. It is philosophizing about the most revisionary kind of art, one that sees its own task as being profoundly philosophical in nature. Let us now turn to five more specific philosophical themes that conceptual art urges us to consider.

3. Five Philosophical Themes

3.1 The Definition of Art

The problem of defining art is by no means a worry for conceptual art alone. The concern it raises is rooted in two main problems: first, the category of art is a very heterogeneous one; and, second, views about what a definition of art should consist of vary widely. On the standard conception, a definition is something that provides us with necessary and sufficient conditions for some thing x to be F, so that, for example, it is a necessary and sufficient condition for a number to be an even number that it is (i) an integer and (ii) divisible by two. On this conception, then, a definition of art must be capable of outlining a clear set of conditions that have to be satisfied by any thing that is (rightly) to be considered a work of art.

There have been no shortages of attempts to define art in something like this manner. Most prominently perhaps, it has been suggested that art ought to be defined in terms of its aesthetic character, so that, roughly, x is an artwork if and only if x gives rise to an aesthetic experience (e.g., Beardsley 1958). Notwithstanding the difficulties that this particular suggestion entails (we shall return to this view in §3.3), the advent of a kind of art that is as profoundly revisionary and difficult to classify as conceptual art renders the attempt to provide a general definition applicable to all art particularly complex. It is no coincidence, then, that a neo-Wittgensteinian approach came to dominate the philosophy of art in the late 1950s and 1960s which, heavily influenced by anti-essentialist theories of language, explored the thought that some concepts are, by their very nature, ‘essentially contested’ (Gallie 1948; see also Weitz 1956). That is to say, it was suggested that there might be some concepts – including sport, game and art – that simply do not allow for definitions in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions. In the words of Morris Weitz, art may be

an open concept. New conditions have constantly arisen and will undoubtedly constantly arise; new art forms, new movements will emerge, which will demand decisions on the part of those interested… as to whether the concept should be extended or not. (Weitz 1956, 32)

Definition thus turns into a less stringent exercise of conceptual analysis, and the alternative method proposed by Neo-Wittgensteinians such as Weitz in attempting to identify art and explain how we are to distinguish it from non-art is the notion of family resemblance (see Wittgenstein 1953, §66-71). Faced with the question ‘Is X an artwork?’, what we should do is try to detect strands of resemblance with paradigmatic instances of an artwork. If some significant resemblance to such a paradigmatic case is observed, we can rightly call the object of our scrutiny a work of art.

The proposal, though interesting, is not without its own difficulties. One problem that arises in relation to this method, is that resemblance rapidly expands in such a way as to render it close to useless, for every one thing resembles every other thing in some respect or other. And this kind of openness, it is important to note, is not something that fits in with the programme of conceptual art. Whilst conceptual art does hold that any kind of object could be a work of art, it is not saying that every object is a work of art. Much conceptual art, in exploring the boundaries between the realms of the artistic and that of function and utility, is perceptually indistinguishable from non-art, such as Andy Warhol's Brillo Boxes, and in that sense, conceptual art presents a particularly difficult, if not devastating, case for the neo-Wittgensteinian method of identification.

Picking up on this concern, Arthur Danto has famously suggested that it is in fact a non-manifest relation that makes something an artwork rather than an observable property (Danto 1981). That is to say, artworks acquire that status in virtue of their relations to the historical and social setting constituted by the practices and conventions of art, our artistic heritage, the intentions of artists, and so on — the ‘artworld’ (Dickie 1974).The general idea here is that artworks are generated within a social and artistic context, and so being an artwork is a function of certain social relations. As conceptual art shows us, art and non-art can be perceptually indistinguishable and so cannot be marked off from each other by ‘exhibited’ properties alone.[5]

Regardless of exactly how this idea is developed, what conceptual art has enabled philosophers of art to understand is that any successful general definition or indeed principled theory of the identification of art will have to be able to locate the determining feature(s) of art amongst its non-manifest properties. It is the meaning that the artist infuses into his piece and the meaning that we as audience stand to gain from it that contains the key to its status as art (more on this in §3.4). As we shall soon see in greater detail, conceptual art considers the artwork a means by which to transmit meaning and ideas, rather than an object which can provide pleasant and satisfactory (often sensory) experiences during unlimited periods of time. Sometimes these conceptual pieces will be manipulated by humans, yet at other times not, because if art is exclusively about conveying meaning then artists stand under no obligation whatsoever to make the art object itself appear in any particular way. To use the example of Andy Warhol's Brillo Boxes again, all a conceptual artist needs to do to turn a non-art object into an art object is just to somehow infuse it with meaning and present it as art.

It is fair to say that from within the project of conceptual art, the attempt to define art in a narrow sense is thoroughly misguided. For an artform that actively seeks to unsettle our assumptions about what may count as art, it seems that no such definition can be formulated (and even if it could, it would have little or no genuine explanatory power). Still, might there be some hope for a unified account of art that takes on board the philosophical lessons to be learnt from conceptual art?

A view to this effect, recently developed by David Davies and inspired by conceptual art, has it that such a definition of art can only be found if we think of art as the creative process or series of actions resulting in a material thing (‘focus of appreciation’) or object, rather than the end-product of that process (Davies 2004). It may be, then, that the most enduring lesson to be learnt from conceptual art with regards to the definition of art is not so much that a conceptual analysis of art is completely unattainable, as that we simply have been looking in the wrong place. Perhaps what we should look at is the creative and reflective process rather than the material thing.

3.2 The Ontology and Media of Art

Conceptual art's claim that art is not so much the perceivable thing that we are confronted with in galleries or museums, say, as the idea that it aims to convey, gives rise to a host of complex ontological questions. The rejection of traditional artistic media, together with the de-materialisation of the art object, forces us to reconsider what previously seemed relatively uncomplicated-seeming aspects of artistic experience, such as ‘What is it we should focus our attention on in artistic appreciation?’, ‘Is there in fact any one thing (or set of things) that we must perceive in artistic appreciation?’, and ‘Is it a necessary condition for the existence of an artwork that it have a medium?’.

In the first instance, conceptual art drives us to review the common assumption that appropriate appreciation and engagement with an artwork must involve a direct first-hand experience of that piece itself. The idea here is, to use Frank Sibley's words, that

[p]eople have to see the grace or unity of a work, hear the plaintiveness or frenzy in the music, notice the gaudiness of colour scheme, feel the power of a novel, its mood, or its uncertainty of tone. They may be struck by these qualities at once, or they may come to perceive them only after repeated viewings, hearings, or readings, and with the help of critics. But unless they do perceive them for themselves, aesthetic enjoyment, appreciation, and judgement are beyond them… the crucial thing is to see, hear, or feel. (Sibley 1965, 137).

The assumption in question thus has it, roughly, that although we can certainly gain something from looking at, for example, a postcard or poster of Leonardo da Vinci's La Gioconda, a genuine judgement about its artistic character necessitates one's own un-mediated perceptual experience of it. But if there is nothing for us to get a first-hand perceptual experience of, the traditional assumption obviously seems threatened. If there is, strictly speaking, no thing to engage with perceptually in that manner, as is the case with Walter De Maria's Vertical Earth Kilometre (1977)[6], what are we to make of the aforementioned experiential requirement? More pertinently still, how could we engage perceptually with an artwork that claims to be merely an idea?

The question that is perhaps most pressing, however, has to do with the extent to which we are to take conceptual art's claim of de-materialisation seriously. Does the de-materialisation of such art not suggest that there is not only a rejection of traditional artistic media in conceptual art, but an outright refutation of artistic media in general? One way of accommodating for the idea of media in conceptual art is with the help of a distinction outlined by Davies between physical medium and vehicular medium (Davies 2004). Interestingly, the latter is said to incorporate not only physical objects (such as paintings and sculptures, say) but also actions, events, and generally more complex entities than straightforwardly physical objects. In Davies' words, ‘[t]he product of an artist's manipulation of a vehicular medium will then be the vehicle whereby a particular artistic statement is articulated… The vehicle may, as in the case of Picasso's Guernica, be a physical object, or, as in the case of Coleridge's Kubla Kahn, a linguistic structure-type, or, as arguably in the case of Duchamp's Fountain, an action of a particular kind.’ (Davies 2004, 59). Adhering to this vehicular medium in art, may then at least equip philosophers with a notion that can deflate the concern of whether conceptual art, by rejecting physical media, denies the need for all artistic media.

Clearly, conceptual art is not the first kind of art to raise pressing ontological concerns of this kind. After all, music and literary art, be it traditional or avant-garde, does not present straightforward cases either. In philosophical circles, issues to do with what constitutes, say, a novel or a musical work such as a sonata have been widely discussed for some time, since most hold it cannot be that the mere words or notes on the page that we have in mind when we think of the artwork (e.g., Davies 2001; Ingarden 1973; Wollheim 1980) Building on the suggestion that artworks such as musical pieces and literary works are best understood in terms of universals or ‘types’, one view that has been widely discussed in the last two decades or so is based on the idea that not only musical and literary artworks, but all artworks, are types. More specifically, they are to be conceived of as ‘event- or action-types’ (Currie 1988). According to this theory, the artwork is thus not the material thing itself but, rather, the way in which the artist arrived at the underlying structure shared by all instances or performances of that work.

Whilst the general approach is obviously congenial to conceptual art in virtue of taking as its starting-point something close to the very heart of the conceptual project, namely the claim that artworks are not strictly to be identified with any particular ‘focus of appreciation’ (Cf. §3.1), it might nevertheless be the case that further refinement of the approach needs to be undertaken if the view that artworks are a kind of event are to accommodate the great ontological diversity of conceptual art. In this spirit, Davies has recast this approach in terms of token events, rather than event-types. This to emphasise further the ontological significance of the particular creative process or series of actions through which an artist eventually arrives at the ‘focus of appreciation’.

Having said that, and even if there can be a kind of artistic medium broad enough for conceptual art, other difficulties beset the claims concerning the putative dematerialisation of the art object. Most obviously, one may ask, what role, if indeed any, is played by the (set of) material thing(s) that many conceptual artists undeniably do present us with? What, in other words, are we to make of the object (be it a human body or a video-recording) that is at least occasionally supposed to transmit the idea which, in turn, is said to be the genuine artwork? It seems, then, that a good philosophical explanation needs to be given as to how the material thing that is regularly presented to the audience is, in fact, relevant to the artwork itself. Is the vehicular medium constitutive of the artwork, and if so, how exactly does that square with the claim of de-materialisation?

3.3 The Aesthetic Value of Art

Underlying the claim that we need to have a direct experiential encounter with an artwork in order to appreciate it appropriately is the fact that there are certain properties that bear on the value of a work that can only be grasped in precisely such an experience. The properties in question here are generally aesthetic properties, and the assumption motivating the experiential requirement is that the appreciation of artworks necessarily involves an aesthetic element (i.e. not necessarily beauty per se, but something aesthetically pleasing or rewarding nonetheless).

However, one of the most distinguishing features of conceptual art, setting out as it does to replace illustrative representation with semantic representation, is that it does not actually endeavour to produce beautiful pieces or even pieces with aesthetic value. Conceptual art is an art of the mind: it appeals to matters of the intellect and emphasises art's cognitive rather than aesthetic value. In the words of Timothy Binkley, traditional aesthetics is preoccupied ‘with perceptual entities’ and this ‘leads aesthetics to extol and examine the “work of art”, while averting its attention almost entirely from the myriad other aspects of that complex cultural activity we call “art” ’ (Binkley 1977, 271).

We can see now that the experiential requirement fails to have any bite with regards to conceptual artworks because the artist's aim does not involve conferring to the work of art properties that must be experienced directly in order to be grasped and fully appreciated. If there is to be any kind of requirement cast in terms of some form of direct experience for the appropriate appreciation of conceptual artworks, it will thus have to be one that allows for this general lack of aesthetic ambition. Perhaps it will be a kind of experiential requirement that focuses on a certain kind of imaginative engagement with the idea central to the artwork rather than a perceptual experience of its aesthetic properties (see Schellekens 2007)

The principal philosophical question highlighted by conceptual art in this context, then, is this: ‘Does art need to be aesthetic?’. In Binkley's opinion, and in support of conceptual art, one does not necessarily have to think of art in terms of aesthetic value –whilst a lot of ‘art has chosen to articulate in the medium of an aesthetic space’, there is ‘no a priori reason why art must confine itself to the creation of aesthetic objects. It might opt for articulation in a semantic space instead of an aesthetic one so that artistic meaning is not embodied in a physical object or event’ (Binkley 1977, 273).

However, not everyone has endorsed such a liberal view about the separation between the aesthetic and the artistic (Cf. §3.1)[7]. If art does not aim at having aesthetic value, what, one might argue, will set it apart from non-art? That is to say, if having aesthetic value is not one of the main goals of art, then to what extent can we still call it art?

Which view one decides to favour on this point may well end up being an issue about definition. If one wishes to define art in terms of aesthetic experience, the question finds a clear-cut answer, namely that conceptual art simply cannot be considered a kind of art. The down-side of that position is, however, a whole set of difficult concerns to do with things, such as nature or persons, that hardly qualify as art even though they are capable of giving rise to aesthetic experiences. If one is impressed by these worries and cannot see any decisive philosophical reason to uphold such a view, there is little, if anything, to block a conception of art whereby art is not necessarily aesthetic. One may, then, think of aesthetic value as one kind of artistic value that, alongside with moral, religious, political, historical and financial value some artworks have and others do not.[8]

Now, even if it is granted that art need not be aesthetic, it is still possible to hold that conceptual art does not qualify as good art because it does not (aim to) yield aesthetic experiences. This, it should be clear, whilst still a viable position to hold in relation to the project of conceptual art in general, cannot be used to attack such art on its own grounds. Saying of, for example, Michael Craig-Martin's An Oak Tree that one cannot consider it a great work of art because it fails to give rise to a distinctively aesthetic kind of pleasure does not actually undermine the project at all. Conceptual art, as we now know, is about conveying meaning through a vehicular medium, and not to provide its audience with experiences of, say, beauty. Any attack on this fundamental feature of conceptual art targets not so much an individual piece but the artform as such.

3.4 The Interpretation of Art

At the most basic level of inquiry, two main queries arise about interpretation in art: (i) by what means do we interpret artworks?, and (ii) what is it to interpret artworks? In the case of conceptual art, a satisfactory answer to (i) will quite uncontroversially appeal to elements such as the narrative aids provided by artists or curators (e.g. catalogues, titles, exhibited explanations, labels, etc.); the appropriate mode of perception (i.e. looking or listening); and what we know about the artwork's and artist's background. Depending on the ontological status of the particular piece (if it is, say, a ready-made or a performance), these elements can be combined in different ways to explain our interpretative habits and practices.

In addressing (ii), however, mention will have to be made of the various mental abilities we put to use in such interpretative exercises (e.g. imagination, empathy); and precisely what the target of our interpretation is. This task is not as unproblematic as it may seem, for one may ask whether it is the object itself that should be under scrutiny, the object's properties (and, if so, which), or merely the artist's intentions? It seems unlikely that the question will find an adequate answer until the concern raised above (Cf. §3.2) has found an acceptable solution, namely ‘Is the vehicular medium a constitutive part of the conceptual artwork or not, and if so how?’.

Two further general philosophical questions about the notion of artistic interpretation take on a particularly complex dimension in relation to conceptual art. First, what information should be considered relevant in artistic interpretation? Most importantly perhaps, to what extent should the artist's intention be allowed to determine the appropriate interpretation? Views differ widely on this topic. In their article, ‘The Intentional Fallacy’, Wimsatt and Beardsley famously argue in relation to the literary arts that the only kind of evidence that is relevant to interpretation is that which is internal to the work in question. (Wimsatt & Beardsley 1946). An artist's intention or design is thus of no interpretative significance, and for that very reason, this position seems difficult to defend in the case of conceptual art. For when we are dealing with pieces such as Warhol's Brillo Boxes, where the naked eye could not even discern that it is an artwork in the first place, it seems that we need to know that Warhol intended the boxes to be viewed qua art.

Now, even if we do agree with this last point and hold that the artist's intention needs to be taken into account somehow in the interpretation of conceptual art, further questions still require our attention here. Most centrally, should the artist's intention always be considered the decisive factor in interpretation and must it always be involved? Generally speaking, there are two main strands of intentionalist positions available. On the one hand, there is one approach which holds that the artist's intention determines an artwork's meaning, and thus cannot be overlooked – or indeed superseded – in artistic interpretation (e.g., Carroll 1992). On the other hand, there is the view that the artist's intention should be used in the construction of the best possible artistic interpretation (e.g., Levinson 1992).

At least at a first glance, it may seem that conceptual art presents a stronger case for the first approach to interpretation, since the artist's intention is all we have to go by, quite literally, in works such as Robert Barry's simple statement entitled All the Things I know But of which I am Not at the Moment Thinking (1969). Nevertheless, the question cannot be settled quite so easily, for many conceptual artists make a point of putting all the interpretative onus on the spectator. How often are we not, after all, told that a specific artwork's meaning rests entirely in our hands; that ‘it means whatever it means to you’?

This leads us to the second question that is especially pertinent for a kind of art that sets out to convey an idea or meaning, namely whether there can be more than one correct or appropriate interpretation of an artwork. Again, several theories present themselves as eligible candidates in relation to this problem. One suggestion has centred around the idea that there can be a multiplicity of appropriate or correct divergent interpretations of one and the same artwork which cannot be reduced to one underlying interpretation or ranked in relation to each other (e.g., Margolis 1991; Goldman 1990). In opposition to this view, however, another approach has it that there is in fact always a single best interpretation which is better than any other (e.g., Beardsley 1970). The aim of artistic interpretation is, then, in Matthew Kieran's words, ‘restricted to discovering the one true meaning of an artwork.’ (Kieran 1996, 239). Whilst conceptual art certainly seems to rest on something like the interpretative openness of the first view, it is not obvious how a kind of art that claims to be an idea, can in reality accommodate for such indeterminacy. After all, one might wonder, how many interpretations can one idea really allow for?

There are good reasons to believe that of all the philosophical questions conceptual art gives rise to, interpretation is the most problematic from an internal point of view. The conundrum can be put in the following terms. If the conceptual work is the idea, it seems highly likely that artistic interpretation will be an act of grasping that idea (which is conceded by the artist to the artwork considered as such). In other words, if we take conceptual art's de-materialisation claim seriously, we are left with a notion of interpretation which is relatively constrained to the artist's intention and to the claim that that intention determines the appropriate or correct interpretation for that particular work.

Having said that, we are often encouraged by conceptual artists to take the interpretative exercise into our own hands, so to speak, and not be shy to use features about ourselves and our own lives as interpretive tools. We are, in other words, asked to combine the idea of art as idea with the claim that we can, as spectators, convey an entirely new and fresh interpretation onto an artwork that is nothing but an idea which, by definition, needs to be about or concerned with something. So, if the idea is the art, then how can my idiosyncratic interpretation of that idea be anywhere near valid? It seems, then that in order to be coherent, conceptual art must give up either the claim that the actual artwork is nothing other than the idea, or the claim that the interpretative onus lies on the viewer.

3.5 The Cognitive Value of Art

In seeking to convey a semantic representation through a vehicular medium, conceptual art primarily aims to have cognitive – rather than aesthetic – value. By cognitive value, what is meant is simply the value an artwork may have in virtue of enhancing or increasing our knowledge and understanding of some topic, notion or event. Interestingly, conceptual art seems to assume that the aesthetic detracts from or divests art of its possible cognitive value in such a way as to render the two kinds of value close to mutually exclusive (Schellekens 2007).

The attempt to separate the aesthetic from the cognitive is far from a recent investigative endeavour in philosophical circles. In the very first section of Kant's Critique of the Power of Judgement a clear-cut distinction is outlined between aesthetic and cognitive (or ‘logical’) judgements. However, few artistic movements have pressed these questions about the division between aesthetic value on the one hand, and cognitive value on the other, as scrupulously and explicitly as conceptual art. In fact, conceptual art makes things very difficult for itself by holding that the only kind of artistic value that is entirely legitimate is cognitive value.

Clearly, conceptual art is not the only kind of art that may have cognitive value – many other artforms aim to have cognitive value in addition to aesthetic value – and most of us would agree that part of why we find art rewarding is precisely because it often yields understanding and knowledge. That is to say, we read novels, look at paintings and listen to music not only because of the pleasure it may afford, but also because it tends to make us richer human beings. Art is not merely about decoration – more often than not it actually adds something to our life which cannot simply be captured in terms of enjoying looking at something pretty or liking listening to something melodious. In general, art can shed light on our experiences in a particularly insightful and interesting way.

Uncontroversial as this claim may seem, some philosophers have denied that art should either have or seek to have cognitive value. Most famously perhaps, expressivists such as Clive Bell and Roger Fry held that art should only seek to express and arouse emotions (Bell 1914; Fry 1920). More recently, James Young has defended a view whereby avant-garde art like conceptual art cannot yield any significant knowledge or understanding (Young 2001, 77).

Young's argument focuses on the notion of exemplification which he locates at the heart of the only kind of semantic representation and cognitive value that can be ascribed to artworks such as conceptual ones. Exemplification is a form of reference to properties by means of a sample (or exemplar). An exemplar ‘stands for some property by [non-metaphorically, literally] possessing the property’ (Young 2001, 72). In the case of conceptual art, a work then exemplifies an idea or concept. So, for example, Tom Marioni's The Act of Drinking Beer with One's Friends is the Highest Form of Art (1970)[9] – a piece involving the artist and his friends drinking beer together – is an exemplar of the idea at the heart of the work, namely that drinking beer with one's friends is the highest art-form of all. This is the work's statement. However, as Young points out, it doesn't follow from the fact that something expresses a statement or has meaning that it has significant cognitive value. In an nutshell, Young's claim is thus that all things considered, the kind of statements that works like conceptual artworks can make are simply truisms – the kind of cognitive value that art such as conceptual art can yield is so trivial that it barely, if at all, deserves the name.

The argument puts a finger on an experience shared by many spectators of conceptual art who feel conned or deceived by it. Not only are conceptual artworks not beautiful, one might say, they don't even tell us anything over and beyond banal clichés. What, then, is conceptual art really good for?

If there is to be a way out of this difficulty, we will have to take the bull by the horns and discuss exactly what (kind of) knowledge one may gain from it. This answer will have to be cashed out in terms of two concerns: one about the content of the knowledge, and another about the kind of knowledge in question. First, knowledge yielded by art can be about the artwork – not only the techniques employed, the work's history and tradition, and so on, but also the meaning and thoughts that the work conveys. Second, art can yield either propositional knowledge or knowledge by acquaintance. Whereas the first consists of knowledge given to us in terms of propositions and can either be concerned with the artwork itself (e.g. knowledge ‘that it represents the Emperor Maximilan's execution’) or a reality beyond that work (e.g. knowledge ‘that horrible things are often done in the name of political revolutions’), the second kind of knowledge enables one to imagine what it would be like to be in a certain position or situation, to empathize, to come very close to experiencing what it would be like to have that kind of experience first-hand (e.g. what it is like to witness the execution of a dishonoured Emperor).

The notions of knowledge and cognitive value, whilst at the very heart of the conceptual project, raise a manifold of important questions that require solid and cogent philosophical answers. Perhaps exemplification can still serve an epistemological purpose by inviting us to engage with the issues raised by a work of art in a richer and more imaginative way; in a way that makes us think about questions of philosophical interest in particular way – a way that propositions alone cannot do? Perhaps the key to conceptual art's value lies in a more challenging intellectual relationship with the work, a genuine engagement with the idea in question. Exploring this avenue may yet help us see what kind of non-trivial cognitive value conceptual art is capable of yielding.

4. Further Questions

Many more questions centred around these five philosophical themes remain to be examined in relation to conceptual art. With regards to concerns about defining art, we need to address the increasing number of worries to do with exactly how we are to distinguish art from non-art, and indeed whether there really is a distinction (if only conceptual) to be drawn here. That is to say, if conceptual art is at times not only perceptually indistinguishable from non-art but it is also the case that everything is alleged to be (part of) a potential artwork, perhaps the inevitable outcome is that there simply cannot be a principled distinction between art and non-art. So, does the conceptual project lead to the end of the category of art as such?

From the ontological perspective, this set of concerns acquires an even more aggressive flavour: if art should be all about putting forward ideas and making statements, why, one might wonder, do we need the conceptual artwork at all? Can the mere statements themselves as we know and come across them in our daily lives not do that job perfectly well already?

In addition to these questions, the host of issues that have been raised about interpretation, intention, appreciation and the way they are (or should be) related have not yet been silenced. For art that is as discourse-dependent as most conceptual art is, it is not always clear whether there is anything more to interpreting conceptual art than just being told what the idea in question is. And if so, can we still call this interpretation?

Finally, what are we to make of the relation between aesthetic and cognitive value in conceptual art – should they be considered as in opposition or even as mutually exclusive? If the only kind of value that is of genuine artistic importance is cognitive, it will be difficult to avoid the definitional and ontological concerns mentioned above. Also, it will call for a deeply revisionary conception of art, one fundamentally hostile to the very notions we are probably most used to associate with art, namely beauty and aesthetic pleasure.

Central to the philosophy of conceptual art is thus the provocative spirit of the project under investigation – conceptual art throws down the gauntlet by challenging us to reconsider every aspect of artistic experience, and it may well be up to philosophy to pick it up and address some of the questions conceptual art makes its business to raise. Conceptual art actively aims to be thought-provoking, stimulating and inspiring, and if only for that reason, philosophers interested in art should not pass it by unaffected.


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