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Kant's Aesthetics and Teleology

First published Sat Jul 2, 2005

While Kant is perhaps best known for his writings in metaphysics and epistemology (in particular the Critique of Pure Reason of 1781, with a second edition in 1787) and in ethics (the Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals of 1785 and the Critique of Practical Reason of 1788), he also developed an influential and much-discussed theory of aesthetics. This theory is presented in his Critique of Judgment (Kritik der Urteilskraft, also translated as Critique of the Power of Judgment) of 1790, a two-part work which deals successively with aesthetics and with the role of teleology (that is, appeal to ends or goals) in natural science and in our understanding of nature more generally. Although Kant's theory of teleology has traditionally been both less influential, and less widely discussed, than his aesthetic theory, its historical and philosophical importance is increasingly coming to be recognized.

There is some dispute about whether there is any real philosophical connection between Kant's views on aesthetics and his views on teleology, or whether he treated them in a single volume as a mere matter of convenience. Ostensibly, the connection between the two topics for Kant lies in the relation of both aesthetic and teleological judgments to the faculty or power of judgment [Urteilskraft] with which the Critique of Judgment is officially concerned. The notion of the faculty of judgment, and the question of how aesthetics and teleology are connected for Kant, are briefly outlined in the first main section of this article. Subsequent sections (Sections 2 and 3) are devoted respectively to aesthetics and to teleology. While the main focus of this entry is Kant's Critique of Judgment (along with the so-called “First Introduction,” an earlier version of the Introduction which was not published during Kant's lifetime but which is included with the most recent English translations of the Critique of Judgment) it should be noted that he wrote on aesthetics and teleology throughout his career, and that some of his earlier writings are of importance for understanding his views; references to some of these will be given where relevant. It should also be noted that this article emphasizes those aspects of Kant's discussion which have attracted most attention in the Anglo-American tradition of philosophy.

1. The Faculty of Judgment

Kant's account of aesthetics and teleology is ostensibly part of a broader discussion of the faculty or power of judgment [Urteilskraft], which is the faculty “for thinking the particular under the universal” (Introduction IV, 179). Although judgment is discussed briefly in the Critique of Pure Reason, it is not treated as a faculty in its own right until the Critique of Judgment. In this work it is described as having two roles or aspects, “determining” [bestimmend] and “reflecting” or “reflective” [reflektierend] (see Introduction IV and FI V). Judgment in its determining role subsumes particulars under concepts or universals which are already given. This role seems to coincide with roles that are variously assigned, in the Critique of Pure Reason, to the understanding, to judgment, and to imagination in its “schematism” of concepts. Judgment in this role does not operate as an independent faculty, but is instead governed by principles of the understanding. The more distinctive role assigned to judgment in the Critique of Judgment is the reflecting role, that of “finding the universal for the given particular” (Introduction IV, 179).

Judgment as reflecting is, in turn, assigned various roles within Kant's system. It is described as responsible for various cognitive tasks associated with empirical scientific enquiry, in particular, the classification of natural things into a hierarchical taxonomy of genera and species, and the construction of systematic explanatory scientific theories. Kant also suggests that it has a more fundamental role to play in making cognition possible, in particular that it enables us to regard nature as empirically lawlike (see especially Introduction V, 184), and that it is responsible for the formation of all empirical concepts (see especially FI V, 211-213). But reflecting judgment is also described as responsible for two specific kinds of judgments: aesthetic judgments (judgments about the beautiful and the sublime) and teleological judgments (judgments which ascribe ends or purposes to natural things, or which characterize them in purposive or functional terms). These, along with associated topics, are discussed respectively in Section I, the “Critique of Aesthetic Judgment,” and Section II, the “Critique of Teleological Judgment.” The discussion of the role of judgment in empirical scientific enquiry is confined to a few sections of the Introduction and First Introduction.

Although reflecting judgment is exercised in both aesthetic and teleological judgment, Kant assigns a special role to its exercise in the aesthetic case, and specifically in judgments of beauty (Introduction VIII, 193; FI XI, 243-244). More specifically, it is in judgments of beauty (as opposed to the sublime), and even more specifically, judgments about the beauty of nature (as opposed to art), that “judgment reveals itself as a faculty that has its own special principle” (FI XI, 244). The especially close connection between judgments of beauty and the faculty of judgment is reflected in Kant's view that the feeling of pleasure in a beautiful object is felt in virtue of an exercise of judgment, specifically reflecting judgment (Introduction VII, FI VIII).

As noted in the introductory section of this article, there is a question about whether the connection Kant draws between aesthetics and teleology is of any philosophical significance. A number of commentators have seen the supposed connection as forced and artificial; see for example Schopenhauer (1961, vol. I, p. 531), Marc-Wogau (1938, p. 34n.), and Beck (1969, 497). Relatedly, commentators have called into question the connection Kant draws between aesthetic judgment and the exercise of reflecting judgment in empirical enquiry; see for example Guyer (1979, 33-34). Recently, however, there has been more interest in attempting to motivate these connections philosophically. Connections between Kant's aesthetics and his broader theory of reflecting judgment have been developed, for example, by Ginsborg (1990a), Pippin (1996) and Allison (2001, ch. 2). Proposals for linking Kant's views on aesthetics with his views on teleology can be found in Zumbach (1984, pp. 51-53), Makkreel (1990, ch. 5), Aquila (1991) and Ginsborg (1997a). Guyer (2003a) offers an overview which links both aesthetic and teleological judgments with the exercise of reflecting judgment in general.

The apparent variety of topics with which the Critique of Judgment deals also raises historical questions about the composition of the work. Tonelli (1954) addresses the question of the order in which the various parts of the work were written. A more general historical account which places the work in a broader intellectual context is offered in Zammito (1992).

2. Aesthetics

An aesthetic judgment, in Kant's usage, is a judgment which is based on feeling, and in particular on the feeling of pleasure or displeasure. According to Kant's official view there are three kinds of aesthetic judgment: judgments of the agreeable, judgments of beauty (or, equivalently, judgments of taste), and judgments of the sublime. However, Kant often uses the expression “aesthetic judgment” in a narrower sense which excludes judgments of the agreeable, and it is with aesthetic judgments in this narrower sense that the “Critique of Aesthetic Judgment” is primarily concerned. Such judgments can either be, or fail to be, “pure”; while Kant mostly focusses on the ones which are pure, there are reasons to think that most judgments about art (as opposed to nature) do not count as pure, so that it is important to understand Kant's views on such judgments as well.

The “Critique of Aesthetic Judgment” is concerned not only with judgments of the beautiful and the sublime, but also with the production of objects about which such judgments are appropriately made; this topic is discussed under the headings of “fine art” or “beautiful art” [schöne Kunst] and “genius.”

The most distinctive part of Kant's aesthetic theory, and the part which has aroused most interest among commentators, is his account of judgments of beauty, and, more specifically, pure judgments of beauty. (Following Kant's usage, the expression “judgment of beauty” without qualification will refer, in what follows, to pure judgments of beauty.) The most important elements of this account are sketched here in Sections 2.1 and 2.2, and which correspond roughly to the “Analytic of the Beautiful” and the “Deduction of Pure Aesthetic Judgments” respectively. Sections 2.3 and 2.4 are concerned, respectively, with interpretative issues that have arisen in connection with the account, and with criticisms which have been made of it.

Other elements of Kant's theory are sketched in the remainder of the section. Section 2.5 is concerned with judgments of beauty that are not pure, in particular judgments of “adherent” as opposed to “free” beauty; Section 2.6 with beautiful art and genius; Section 2.7 with judgments of the sublime; Section 2.8 with the relation between aesthetics and morality; and Section 2.9 with other implications of Kant's aesthetic theory.

2.1 What is a Judgment of Beauty?

In the “Analytic of the Beautiful” with which the “Critique of Aesthetic Judgment” begins, Kant tries to capture what is distinctive about judgments of beauty by describing them under four heads or “moments.” These are as follows:

First Moment (§§1-5)

Judgments of beauty are based on feeling, in particular feelings of pleasure (Kant also mentions displeasure, but this does not figure prominently in his account; for more on this point, see Section 2.3.6 below). The pleasure, however, is of a distinctive kind: it is disinterested, which means that it does not depend on the subject's having a desire for the object, nor does it generate such a desire. The fact that judgments of beauty are based on feeling rather than “objective sensation” (e.g., the sensation of a thing's colour) distinguishes them from cognitive judgments based on perception (e.g., the judgment that a thing is green). But the disinterested character of the feeling distinguishes them from other judgments based on feeling. In particular, it distinguishes them from (i) judgments of the agreeable, which are the kind of judgment expressed by saying simply that one likes something or finds it pleasing (for example, food or drink), and (ii) judgments of the good, including judgments both about the moral goodness of something and about its goodness for particular non-moral ends.

Second Moment (§§2-9)

Judgments of beauty have, or make a claim to, “universality” or “universal validity.” That is, in making a judgment of beauty about an object, one takes it that everyone else who perceives the object ought also to judge it to be beautiful, and, relatedly, to share one's pleasure in it. But the universality is not “based on concepts.” That is, one's claim to agreement does not rest on the subsumption of the object under a concept (as for example, the claim to agreement made by the judgment that something is green rests on the ascription to the object of the property of being green, and hence its subsumption under the concept green). Relatedly, judgments of beauty cannot, despite their universal validity, be proved: there are no rules by which someone can be compelled to judge that something is beautiful. The fact that judgments of beauty are universally valid constitutes a further feature (in addition to the disinterestedness of the pleasure on which they are based) distinguishing them from judgments of agreeable. For in claiming simply that one likes something, one does not claim that everyone else ought to like it too. But the fact that their universal validity is not based on concepts distinguishes judgments of beauty from non-evaluative cognitive judgments and judgments of the good, both of which make a claim to universal validity that is based on concepts.

It should be noted that later, in the “Antinomy of Taste,” Kant does describe the universality of judgments of beauty as resting on a concept, but it is an “indeterminate concept,” and not the kind of concept which figures in cognition (§57).

Third Moment (§§10-17)

Unlike judgments of the good, judgments of the beautiful do not presuppose an end or purpose [Zweck] which the object is taken to satisfy. (This is closely related to the point that their universality is not based on concepts). However, they nonetheless involve the representation of what Kant calls “purposiveness” [Zweckmässigkeit]. Because this representation of purposiveness does not involve the ascription of an end, Kant calls the purposiveness which is represented “merely formal purposiveness” or “the form of purposiveness.” He describes it as perceived both in the object itself and in the activity of imagination and understanding in their engagement with the object. (For more on this activity, see the discussion of the “free play of the faculties” in Section 2.2; for more on the notion of purposiveness, see Section 3.1).

Fourth Moment (§18-22)

Judgments of beauty involve reference to the idea of necessity, in the following sense: in taking my judgment of beauty to be universally valid, I take it, not that everyone who perceives the object will share my pleasure in it and (relatedly) agree with my judgment, but that everyone ought to do so. I take it, then, that my pleasure stands in a “necessary” relation to the object which elicits it, where the necessity here can be described (though Kant himself does not use the term) as normative. But, as in the case of universal validity, the necessity is not based on concepts or rules (at least, not concepts or rules that are determinate, that is, of a kind which figure in cognition; as noted earlier in this section, Kant describes it, in the Antinomy of Taste, as resting on an indeterminate concept). Kant characterizes the necessity more positively by saying that it is “exemplary,” in the sense that one's judgment itself serves as an example of how everyone ought to judge.

2.2 How are Judgments of Beauty Possible?

Running through Kant's various characterizations of judgments of beauty is a basic dichotomy between two apparently opposed sets of features. On the one hand, judgments of beauty are based on feeling, they do not depend on subsuming the object under a concept (in particular, the concept of an end which such an object is supposed to satisfy), and they cannot be proved. This combination of features seems to suggest that judgments of beauty should be assimilated to judgments of the agreeable. On the other hand, however, judgments of beauty are unlike judgments of the agreeable in not involving desire for the object; more importantly and centrally, they make a normative claim to everyone's agreement. These features seem to suggest that they should be assimilated, instead, to objective cognitive judgments.

In claiming that judgments of beauty have both sets of features, Kant can be seen as reacting equally against the two main opposing traditions in eighteenth-century aesthetics: the “empiricist” tradition of aesthetics represented by Hume, Hutcheson and Burke, on which a judgment of beauty is an expression of feeling without cognitive content, and the “rationalist” tradition of aesthetics represented by Baumgarten and Meier, on which a judgment of beauty consists in the cognition of an object as having an objective property. Kant's insistence that there is an alternative to these two views, one on which judgments of beauty are both based on feeling and make a claim to universal validity, is probably the most distinctive aspect of his aesthetic theory. But this insistence confronts him with the obvious problem of how the two features, or sets of features, are to be reconciled. As Kant puts it: “how is a judgment possible which, merely from one's own feeling of pleasure in an object, independent of its concept, judges this pleasure as attached to the representation of the same object in every other subject, and does so a priori, i.e., without having to wait for the assent of others?” (§36, 288)

The argument constituting Kant's official answer to this question is presented in the section entitled “Deduction of Pure Aesthetic Judgments,” in particular in §38, but versions of the argument are presented in the “Analytic of the Beautiful,” in particular in §9 and §22. The argument in all of its forms relies on the claim, introduced in §9, that pleasure in the beautiful depends on the “free play” or “free harmony” of the faculties of imagination and understanding. In the Critique of Pure Reason, imagination is described as “synthesizing the manifold of intuition” under the governance of rules that are prescribed by the understanding: the outcome of this is cognitive perceptual experience of objects as having specific empirical features. The rules prescribed by the understanding, are, or correspond to, particular concepts which are applied to the object. For example, when a manifold is synthesized in accordance with the concepts green and square, the outcome is a perceptual experience in which the object is perceived as green and square. But now in the Critique of Judgment, Kant suggests that imagination and understanding can stand in a different kind of relationship, one in which imagination's activity harmonizes with the understanding but without imagination's being constrained or governed by understanding. In this relationship, imagination and understanding in effect do what is ordinarily involved in the bringing of objects under concepts, and hence in the perception of objects as having empirical features: but they do this without bringing the object under any concept in particular. So rather than perceiving the object as green or square, the subject whose faculties are in free play responds to it perceptually with a state of mind which is non-conceptual, and specifically a feeling of disinterested pleasure. It is this kind of pleasure which is the basis for a judgment of beauty.

Kant appeals to this account of pleasure in the beautiful in order to argue for its universal communicability: to argue, that is, that a subject who feels such a pleasure, and thus judges the object to be beautiful, is entitled to demand that everyone else feel a corresponding pleasure and thus agree with her judgment of beauty. For, he claims, the free play of the faculties manifests the subjective condition of cognition in general (see for example §9, 218; §21, 238; §38, 290). We are entitled to claim that everyone ought to agree with our cognitions: if I perceive an object to be green and square, I am entitled to claim that everyone else ought to perceive it as green and square. But for this demand for agreement to be possible, he suggests, it must also be possible for me to demand universal agreement for the subjective condition of such cognitions. If I can take it that everyone ought to share my perception of an object as green or square, then I must also be entitled to take it that everyone ought to share a perception of the object in which my faculties are in free play, since the free play is no more than a manifestation of what is in general required for an object's being perceived as green or square in the first place.

The most serious objection to Kant's argument can be put in the form of a dilemma; see for example Guyer (1979, p. 297), Meerbote (1982, pp. 81ff.) , Allison (2001, pp. 184-192), Rind (2002). Either the free play of the faculties is involved in all cognitive perceptual experience, or it is not. If it is not, then the central inference does not seem to go through. From the fact that I can demand agreement for my experience of an object as, say, green or square, it does not follow that I can demand agreement for a state in which my faculties are in free play, since the free play is not required for experiencing an object as green or square. But if it is involved in all cognitive perceptual experience, then it would seem that every object should be perceived as beautiful, and this is plainly not the case. A number of commentators have taken this objection, or considerations related to it, to be fatal to Kant's claim that judgments of beauty are universally valid: see for example Meerbote (cited earlier in this paragraph) and Guyer 1979, pp. 319-324. Indeed, at least one commentator has taken the apparent weakness of Kant's argument as an indication that Kant does not intend it to provide a complete answer to the question of how judgments of beauty are possible, but that he means instead to ground the possibility of such judgments on morality rather than on the conditions of cognition (Elliott [1968]; see also Section 2.3.4 below). But the argument has been defended by Ameriks (1982) (see also Section 2.3.5 below) and Allison (cited earlier in this paragraph); moreover Guyer (2003a, p. 60n.15) has recently expressed some doubt about his earlier (1979) rejection of the argument.

The assessment of the objection just noted, and of Kant's “deduction of taste” more generally, is complicated by a number of fundamental interpretive issues, which are discussed in the next section.

2.3 Judgments of Beauty: Interpretive Issues

This section describes six issues which have arisen in connection with Kant's account of pure judgments of beauty, and which are relevant to the assessment of his argument for the possibility of such judgments. There is an extensive secondary literature on these and related issues. Some references to this literature are given below; a useful source of further references is Allison (2001), which in addition to offering a distinctive interpretation of Kant's aesthetics, also provides an extensive guide to recent discussions.

2.3.1 Pleasure and Judgment

What is the relation between the feeling of pleasure and the judgment that the object is beautiful? Kant describes the judgment of beauty as “based on” a feeling of pleasure, and as claiming that everyone ought to share the subject's feeling of pleasure, or, as he puts it, as claiming the “universal communicability” of the pleasure. This seems to imply that the pleasure is felt antecedently to the judgment of beauty. But in the crucial §9, which Kant describes as providing “the key to the critique of taste,” Kant suggests that the opposite is the case: the “merely subjective (aesthetic) judging of the object” both “precedes” and “is the ground of” the pleasure (218). Crawford addresses this apparent paradox by distinguishing the “judging” of the object which, according to §9, precedes the pleasure in it, from the judgment of beauty proper, which is based on the pleasure (1974, pp. 69-74). A distinction of this kind is developed in detail by Guyer, who draws on passages elsewhere in the text to defend the view that a judgment of beauty results from two distinct acts of reflecting judgment, the first identifiable with the free play of the faculties and resulting in a feeling of pleasure, the second an act of reflection on the pleasure which results in the claim that the pleasure is universally communicable. (See his 1979, especially pp. 110-119 and pp. 151-160; for a related discussion of the “key to the critique of taste,” see his 1982). While most commentators read the relevant paragraphs of §9 as requiring some kind of distinction along these lines, an alternative reading is offered by Ginsborg (see especially 1990, ch. 1, and 1991), who takes the judgment of beauty to involve a single, self-referential act of judging which claims its own universal validity with respect to the object and which is phenomenologically manifested in a feeling of pleasure. This view, like that of Aquila (1982), implies that the pleasure is not felt antecedently to the judgment of beauty but is, rather, identical with it. The issue raised by §9 is further discussed in Allison (2001, pp. 110-118) and in a recent symposium on Allison's book (Longuenesse 2003, Ginsborg 2003 and Allison 2003); see also Longuenesse (forthcoming).

2.3.2 The Free Play of Imagination and Understanding

What is it for the faculties to be in “free play”? Kant describes the imagination in the free play as conforming to the general conditions for the application of concepts to objects that are presented to our senses, yet without any particular concept being applied. Because of Kant's view that concepts are, or at least correspond to, rules by which imagination “synthesizes” or organizes the data of sense-perception, this amounts to saying that imagination functions in a rule-governed way but without being governed by any rule in particular. The free play thus manifests, in Kant's terms, “free lawfulness” or “lawfulness without a law.” But there is an apparent paradox in these characterizations which is left unaddressed by Kant's own, largely metaphorical, explanations. It is left to commentators to try to explain how such an activity is intelligible and why, if it is indeed intelligible, it should give rise to, or be experienced as, a feeling of pleasure.

Some commentators try to make sense of the free play by appealing to the phenomenology of aesthetic experience, for example to the kind of experience involved in appreciating an abstract painting, where the subject might imaginatively relate the various elements of the painting to one another and perceive them as having an order and unity which is non-conceptual; see for example Bell (1987, p. 237) and Crowther (1989, p. 56). Others try to find a place for it in the context of Kant's theory of the imagination as presented in the Critique of Pure Reason. Two contrasting accounts along these lines are those of Guyer, who identifies the free play with the first two stages of the “three-fold synthesis” described by Kant in the first edition Transcendental Deduction (Guyer 1979, pp. 85-86), and of Makkreel (1990, pp. 49-58), for whom the free play is an activity of schematizing pure concepts without the involvement of empirical concepts. While there have been a great variety of accounts suggested in recent years (for a partial survey, see Guyer forthcoming), they almost all share the assumption that the free play is distinct from the judgment of beauty. This assumption, however, is rejected by Ginsborg, who identifies the free play as a nonconceptual mental state which involves a claim to its own universal communicability with respect to the object (1997); this means, on her reading, that it is to be identified with the judgment of beauty.

2.3.3 The Intentionality of the Pleasure

Does the feeling of pleasure in a judgment of beauty have intentional content? According to Guyer, the answer is no (see especially 1979, pp. 99-119). Although Kant sometimes describes pleasure as awareness of the free play of the faculties, Guyer takes the relation between the free play and the feeling of pleasure to be merely causal. The pleasure is “opaque”: while one can come to recognize that one's feeling of pleasure is due to the free play, this is not because the pleasure makes one immediately aware of it, but rather because reflection on the causal history of one's pleasure can lead one to conclude that it was not sensory or due to the satisfaction of a desire and hence (by elimination) must have been due to the free play. While many commentors follow Guyer on this point, opposing views have been taken by e.g., Aquila (1982), Ginsborg (1990, ch. 1, and 1991), Allison (2001, in particular pp. 53-54, p. 69 and pp. 122-123) and Zuckert (2002).

2.3.4 The Character of the Claim to Agreement

What kind of claim to agreement is made by a judgment of beauty? Kant says that a judgment of beauty demands agreement in the same way that an objective cognitive judgment demands agreement (see e.g., Introduction VII, 191 and §6, 211). But one might still raise a question about the character of the demand, either because there is a quesion about what it is for a cognitive judgment to claim agreement, or because it is not clear that the claim can in fact be the same, given that in the aesthetic case one is claiming that others share one's feeling. Guyer 1979 argues that the claim should be understood as a rational expectation or ideal prediction: someone who judges an object to be beautiful is claiming that under ideal circumstances everyone will share her pleasure (1979, pp. 139-147 and pp. 162-164). Rogerson (1982) criticizes the rational expectation interpretation, arguing instead that a judgment of beauty makes a moral demand on others to appreciate the object's beauty. A third option is that the demand is genuinely normative (as opposed to predictive), yet without being a moral demand. This option is developed and defended in Rind (2000); it is also assumed, with varying degrees of explicitness, by a number of other commentators, including Allison (2001; see especially p. 159 and pp. 178-179). The question of whether the demand is a moral one has immediate implications for how Kant's argument for the universal validity of judgments of beauty is to be understood. Most commentators understand it along the lines sketched in 2.1 above, as relying only on assumptions about the conditions of cognition. But some commentators, for example Elliott (1968), Crawford (1974), Rogerson (1986) and Kemal (1986) have taken an appeal to morality to play a central role in the argument.

2.3.5 Is Beauty Objective?

Should judgments of beauty be regarded as objective? Ameriks has argued (1982, 1983) that in spite of Kant's claim that judgments of beauty are “subjectively grounded,” they are nonetheless objective in the same sense that judgments of colour and other secondary qualities are objective. Similar views are proposed by Savile (1981) and Kulenkampff (1990); see also the references offered by Ameriks at (2003, 307n.1). The claim is challenged by Ginsborg (1998); for discussion see Ameriks (1998, 2000) and Allison (2001, 128-129).

2.3.6 Negative Judgments of Beauty

Kant's discussion of judgments of beauty focusses almost exclusively on the positive judgment that an object is beautiful, and relatedly, of the feeling of pleasure in a beautiful object. He has very little to say about the judgment that an object is not beautiful, or about the displeasure associated with judging an object to be ugly. (As noted in Section 2.7 below, he does take the appreciation of the sublime to involve a kind of displeasure, but this seems to be a different kind from the displeasure that might be involved in judging something to be ugly.) Does his treatment allow for negative judgments of beauty, either that an object is not beautiful or that is ugly? The importance of the question has been emphasized by Allison (2001), who takes it to be a criterion for a satisfactory interpretation of Kant's theory of taste that it allow for negative judgments of beauty (2001, p. 72; see also pp. 184-186); others who have emphasized the need to consider the role of the ugly in Kant's account of aesthetics include Hudson (1991) and Wenzel (1999). Some commentators have denied that Kant acknowledges the possibility of such judgments (for references, see the endnotes to Allison 2001, pp. 184-186; Guyer 2005a, ch. 7). another view is that while Kant allows for them, they should not be treated symmetrically with positive judgments of beauty (Ginsborg 2004).

2.4 Judgments of Beauty: Some Criticisms

As noted at the end of Section 2.2, Kant's account of judgments of beauty has been criticized on the grounds that the argument for their universal validity, that is the Deduction of Pure Aesthetic Judgments, is unsuccessful. Criticisms have also been raised against various aspects of Kant's characterization of judgments of beauty in the Analytic of the Beautiful. Objections have been raised in particular to Kant's view that judgments of beauty are disinterested, and to his supposed commitment to aesthetic formalism (the view that all that matters for aesthetic appreciation is the abstract formal pattern manifested by the object, that is, the way in which its elements are interrelated in space and/or time). For discussion of the questions of disinterestedness and formalism, see Guyer (1979, chs. 5 and 6), and on the question of formalism, ch. 6) and Allison (2001, chs. 4 and 5). Typically objections to Kant's view of pleasure as disinterested appeal to the apparently obvious fact that we do in fact take an interest in the preservation of beautiful objects (see for example Crawford 1974, p. 53). For a different kind of objection based on an appeal to the cognitive role of aesthetic judging, see Pillow (forthcoming).

Kant has also been criticized for a view that is taken to be a consequence of the thesis that judgments of beauty are disinterested, namely the view that aesthetic experience requires a special attitude of “psychical distance” or “detachment” from the object appreciated: this criticism is generally taken to be implicit in Dickie's well-known (1964) discussion of the “myth of the aesthetic attitude.” Zangwill (1992) argues that this criticism is misplaced.

Kant's view that the pleasure in a beautiful object is non-conceptual has been taken to commit him to the objectionable view that the capacity to make conceptual distinctions can play no role in the appreciation of beauty. This criticism is addressed by Janaway (1997).

2.5 Free and Adherent Beauty

This article so far has been concerned only with “pure” judgments of beauty. But Kant also allows for judgments of beauty which fall short of being pure. Judgments of beauty can fail to be pure in two ways. (a) They can be influenced by the object's sensory or emotional appeal, that is, they can involve “charm” [Reiz] or emotion [Rührung] (§13). (b) They can be contingent on a certain concept's applying to the object, so that the object is judged, not as beautiful tout court, but as beautiful qua belonging to this or that kind. The second kind of impurity is discussed in §16 in connection with a distinction between “free” [frei] beauty and “adherent” or “dependent” [anhängend] beauty.

The distinction is important because Kant suggests that all judgments of beauty about representational art are judgments of adherent rather than of free beauty, and hence that they are all impure. While some art works can be “free beauties,” the examples Kant gives are all of non-representational art: “designs a la grecque, foliage for borders or on wallpaper…fantasias in music,” and indeed, Kant adds, all music without a text (§16, 229). It might be supposed from this that Kant's core account of judgments of beauty is only peripherally applicable to art, which would make it largely irrelevant to the concerns of contemporary aesthetics. However, this consequence is debatable. For example, Allison argues that judgments of dependent beauty contain, as a component, a pure judgment of beauty. The purity of this core judgment is not undermined by its figuring in a more complex evaluation which takes into account the object's falling under a concept (2001, pp. 140-141).

Kant's suggestion that representational art has “adherent” rather than “free” beauty, and that judgments about such art fail to be pure, might also invite the objection that Kant takes nonrepresentational art to be superior to representational art, so that, say, wallpaper designs are aesthetically more valuable than the ceiling of the Sistine Chapel. This objection is challenged by Schaper (1978, ch. 4, reprinted in Guyer 2003) and by Guyer (2005a, chs. 4 and 5).

2.6 Art, Genius and Aesthetic Ideas

While Kant attaches special importance to the beauty of nature (see e.g., FI XI, 244), he also makes clear that judgments of beauty may be made also about “fine” or “beautiful” art [schöne Kunst]. In the course of his treatment of beautiful art in §§43-54 he discusses fine art in relation to the production of human artifacts more generally (§43), compares fine art to the “arts” of entertaining (telling jokes, decorating a table, providing background music) (§44), and makes some remarks about the relation between the beauty of art and that of nature, claiming in particular that fine art must “look to us like nature” in that it must seem free and unstudied (§45). Kant also offers a typology of the various fine arts (§51) and a comparison of their respective aesthetic value (§53).

Of particular interest, within Kant's account of fine art, is his discussion of how beautiful art objects can be produced (§§46-50). The artist cannot produce a beautiful work by learning, and then applying, rules which determine when something is beautiful; for no such rules can be specified (see the sketch of the Second Moment in Section 2.1 above). But, Kant makes clear, the artist's activity must still be rule-governed, since “every art presupposes rules” (§46, 307) and the objects of art must serve as models or examples, that is, they must serve as a “standard or rule by which to judge” (§46, 308). Kant's solution to this apparent paradox is to postulate a capacity, which he calls “genius,” by which “nature gives the rule to art” (§46, 307). An artist endowed with genius has a natural capacity to produce objects which are appropriately judged as beautiful, and this capacity does not require the artist him- or herself to consciously follow rules for the production of such objects; in fact the artist himself does not know, and so cannot explain, how he or she was able to bring them into being. “Genius” here means something different from brilliance of intellect. For example, Newton, for all his intellectual power, does not qualify as having genius, because he was capable of making clear, both to himself and others, the procedures through which he arrived at his scientific discoveries (§47, 308-309).

A further point of interest in Kant's discussion of art is his claim that beauty is the “exhibition” [Darstellung, also translated “presentation”] (§49, 314) or “expression” (§51, 319) of aesthetic ideas. Kant describes an aesthetic idea as a representation of the imagination that occasions much thinking, though without it being possible for any determinate thought, i.e., concept, to be adequate to it” (§49, 314). Such ideas, he says, are a “counterpart” to rational ideas, that is, representations which cannot be exemplified in experience or by means of imagination (ibid.). While part of Kant's point here is to contrast aesthetic and rational ideas, it is clear that he sees the role of aesthetic ideas as mediating between rational ideas on the one hand, and sensibility and imagination on the other. A work of art expresses or exhibits an aesthetic idea in so far as it succeeds in giving sensible form to a rational idea. Thus aesthetic ideas “seek to approximate to an exhibition” of rational ideas. For example, the poet “ventures to make sensible rational ideas of invisible beings, the realm of the blessed, the realm of hell, eternity, creation etc., as well as to make that of which there are examples in experience, e.g., death, envy, and all sorts of vices, as well as love, fame, etc., sensible beyond the limits of experience, with a completeness which goes beyond anything of which there is an example in nature” (ibid.).

While aesthetic ideas are discussed only in the sections of the Critique of Judgment which deal with artistic beauty, and not in the “Analytic of the Beautiful,” which deals with beauty more generally, Kant remarks parenthetically that natural as well as artistic beauty is the expression of aesthetic ideas (§51, 321). This claim has been thought by some commentators to be problematic. Some commentators have also seen a tension between the “expressionistic” doctrine of aesthetic ideas and the supposedly “formalistic” view presented in the “Analytic of the Beautiful”; for a response to this worry, see Allison (2001, pp. 288-290).

A related question concerns the relative importance for Kant of natural as opposed to artistic beauty. Guyer (1993, ch. 7) offers a defence of the importance of natural beauty, and criticizes Kemal's (1986) view that artistic beauty is the paradigm object of aesthetic experience for Kant.

2.7 The Sublime

Kant distinguishes two notions of the sublime: the mathematically sublime and the dynamically sublime. In the case of both notions, the experience of the sublime consists in a feeling of the superiority of our own power of reason, as a supersensible faculty, over nature (§28, 261).

In the case of the mathematically sublime, the feeling of reason's superiority over nature takes the form, more specifically, of a feeling of reason's superiority to imagination, conceived of as the natural capacity required for sensory apprehension, including the apprehension of the magnitudes of empirically given things. We have this feeling when we are confronted with something that is so large that it overwhelms imagination's capacity to comprehend it. In such a situation imagination strives to comprehend the object in accordance with a demand of reason, but fails to do so. “Just because there is in our imagination a striving to advance to the infinite, while in our reason there lies a claim to absolute totality, as to a real idea, the very inadequacy of our faculty for estimating the magnitude of the things in the sensible world [viz., imagination] awakens the feeling of a supersensible faculty in us” (§25, 250). The fact that we are capable, through reason, of thinking infinity as a whole, “indicates a faculty of the mind which surpasses every standard of sense” (§26, 254). While Kant's discussion of the mathematically sublime mentions, apparently as examples, the Pyramids in Egypt and St. Peter's Basilica in Rome (§26, 252), he claims that the most appropriate examples are of things in nature. More specifically, they must be natural things the concept of which does not involve the idea of an end (§26, 252-253): this rules out animals, the concept of which is connected with the idea of biological function, but it apparently includes mountains and the sea (§26, 256).

In the case of the dynamically sublime, the feeling of reason's superiority to nature is more direct than in the mathematical case. Kant says that we consider nature as “dynamically sublime” when we consider it as “a power that has no dominion over us” (§28, 260). We have the feeling of the dynamically sublime when we experience nature as fearful while knowing ourselves to be in a position of safety and hence without in fact being afraid. In this situation “the irresistibility of [nature's] power certainly makes us, considered as natural beings, recognize our physical powerlessness, but at the same time it reveals a capacity for judging ourselves as independent of nature and a superiority over nature…whereby the humanity in our person remains undemeaned even though the human being must submit to that dominion” (§28, 261-262). Kant's examples include overhanging cliffs, thunder clouds, volcanoes and hurricanes (§28, 261).

The feeling associated with the sublime is a feeling of pleasure in the superiority of our reason over nature, but it also involves displeasure. In the case of the mathematically sublime, the displeasure comes from the awareness of the inadequacy of our imagination; in the dynamical case it comes from the awareness of our physical powerlessness in the face of nature's might. Kant is not consistent in his descriptions of how the pleasure and the displeasure are related, but one characterization describes them as alternating: the “movement of the mind” in the representation of the sublime “may be compared to a vibration, i.e., to a rapidly alternating repulsion from and attraction to one and the same object” (§27, 258). Kant also describes the feeling of the sublime as a “pleasure which is possible only by means of a displeasure” (§27, 260) and as a “negative liking” (General Remark following §29, 269). He also appears to identify it with the feeling of respect, which in his practical philosophy is associated with recognition of the moral law (§27, 257).

Judgments of the sublime are like judgments of beauty in being based on feeling, more specifically on pleasure or liking. They are also like judgments of beauty in claiming the universal validity of the pleasure, where that claim is understood as involving necessity (everyone who perceives the object ought to share the feeling) (§29, 266). But as we have seen, the pleasure is different in that it involves a negative element. The following differences should also be noted:

  1. (particularly emphasized by Kant) In making a judgment of the sublime, we regard the object as “contrapurposive,” rather than purposive, for the faculties of imagination and judgment (§23, 245). While judgments of the sublime do involve the representation of purposiveness, the purposiveness differs from that involved in a judgment of beauty in two ways. (a) It is not the object, but the aesthetic judgment itself which is represented as purposive. (b) The aesthetic judgment is represented as purposive not for imagination or judgment, but for reason (§27, 260) or for the “whole vocation of the mind” (§27, 259).
  2. The claim to universal validity made by a judgment of the sublime rests, not on the universal validity of the conditions of cognition, but rather on the universal validity of moral feeling (§29, 255-256).
  3. While we can correctly call objects beautiful, we cannot properly call them sublime (§23, 245); sublimity strictly speaking “is not contained in anything in nature, but only in our mind” (§28, 264).
  4. While judgments of beauty involve a relation between the faculties of imagination and understanding, the faculties brought into relation in a judgment of the sublime are imagination and reason (§29, 266).

The importance of the sublime within Kant's aesthetic theory is a matter of dispute. In the Introductions to the Critique of Judgment, Kant has a great deal to say about the beautiful, but mentions the sublime only fleetingly (FI XII, 249-250) and in the Analytic of the Sublime itself he notes that “the concept of the sublime in nature is far from being as important and rich in consequences as that of its beauty” and that the “theory of the sublime is a mere appendix to the aesthetic judging of the purposiveness of nature” (§23, 246). Kant's views about the sublime also appear to be less historically distinctive than his views about the beautiful, showing in particular the influence of Burke. On the other hand, Kant's account of the sublime has been influential in literary theory (see Section 2.9 below), and the sublime also plays a significant role in Kant's account of the connection between aesthetic judgment and morality (see Section 2.5 below).

A good overview of Kant's theory of the sublime and its connection with Kant's aesthetic theory more generally is provided by Crowther (1989); for more recent discussions see Guyer (1993, ch. 7) and Allison (2001, ch. 13).

2.8 Aesthetics and Morality

The connection between aesthetic judgment and moral feeling is a persistent theme in the Critique of Judgment. As noted in Section 2.3.4 above, some commentators take the demand for universal validity made by a judgment of beauty to amount to a moral demand, so that Kant's argument for the universal validity of such judgments depends on an appeal to morality. A more common view, however, is to see judgments of beauty not as grounded in morality, but rather, along with judgments of the sublime, as contributing to an account of moral feeling, and hence of how morality is possible for human beings (for a clear statement of the contrast between these views, see the introduction to Guyer 1993).

The idea that aesthetic judgment plays a role in grounding the possibility of morality for human beings is suggested at a very general level in the Introduction to the Critique of Judgment, where Kant describes the faculty of judgment as bridging “the great gulf” betweeen the concept of nature and that of freedom (IX, 195). While Kant says that the concept or principle of judgment which mediates the transition between nature and freedom is that of the “purposiveness of nature,” which could simply be understood as referring to nature's scientific comprehensibility (see Section 3.2 below), he also associates judgment in this context with the feeling of pleasure and displeasure, making clear that it is not only judgment in the context of empirical scientific enquiry, but also aesthetic judgment, which plays this bridging role.

The “Critique of Aesthetic Judgment” mentions a number of more specific connections between aesthetics and morality, including the following:

  1. Aesthetic experience serves as a propadeutic for morality, in that “the beautiful prepares us to love something, even nature, without interest; the sublime, to esteem it, even contrary to our (sensible) interest” (General Remark following §29, 267).
  2. The demand for universal agreement in judgments of the sublime rests on an appeal to moral feeling (§29, 265-266)
  3. Taking a direct interest in the beauty of nature indicates “a good soul” and a “mental attunement favorable to moral feeling” (§42, 298-299).
  4. Beauty serves as the “symbol” of morality (§59, passim), in that a judgment of beauty “legislates for itself” rather than being “subjected to a heteronomy of laws of experience” (§59, 353); relatedly, feelings of pleasure in the beautiful are analogous to moral consciousness (§59, 354; see also General Comment following §91, 482n.).
  5. Beauty gives sensible form to moral ideas (§60, 356); this is related both to the view that there is an analogy between the experience of beauty and moral feeling (see (ii) above), and to the view that beauty is the expression of aesthetic ideas (see 2.6). Because of this, the development of moral ideas is the “true propadeutic” for taste (§60, 356).

There is an influential discussion of beauty as the symbol of morality in Cohen (1982). More recently, the connection between aesthetics and morality has been emphasized by Guyer (see in particular his 1990). See also the references in Section 2.3.4 above.

2.9 The Broader Significance of Kant's Aesthetics

Kant himself clearly takes his aesthetic theory to be of central importance for the understanding of the so-called “faculty of judgment” generally (see Section 1 above): this implies that he takes it to be of importance for understanding empirical scientific enquiry, and in particular for our understanding of biological phenomena. As noted in Section 2.8 above, there are also significant connections between Kant's views on aesthetics and his views on ethics. A number of commentators have, in addition, laid special weight on the connection between Kant's aesthetics and his views on empirical cognition. In particular, Bell (1987) and Ginsborg (1990, 1997 and forthcoming) have argued that Kant's account of empirical cognition depends on his account of the experience of beauty.

Kant's view that judgments of beauty manifest the exercise of a more general faculty of judgment have inspired a number of philosophers to view aesthetic judgment as a model for judgment generally in both the cognitive and the practical domain. Cavell (1976, ch. 3) draws connections between judgments of beauty, as described by Kant, and our intuitive judgments (typically associated with “ordinary language philosophy,” but prevalent in philosophy more generally) about correct use of language. Arendt (1982) applies Kant's theory of aesthetic judgment within the sphere of political philosophy; relatedly, Fleischacker (1999) sees connections between aesthetic judgment for Kant and moral and political judgment generally.

Kant's aesthetic theory has also been extensively discussed within literary theory, where there has been particular emphasis on Kant's theory of the sublime. See for example Weiskel (1976) and Hertz (1978), both of whom interpret Kant's account of the sublime in psychoanalytic terms, as well as the discussions of the Kantian sublime in de Man (1990) and Lyotard (1994). Kant's aesthetic theory more generally is discussed in Derrida (1981, 1987); while the work of Derrida and other “deconstructionists” has been largely ignored or dismissed by commentators within the analytic tradition of philosophy, it has been influential among literary theorists.

3. Teleology

While Kant's ethical theory makes frequent reference to the ends or purposes adopted by human beings, the “Critique of Teleological Judgment” is concerned with the idea of ends or purposes in nature. (The terms “end” and “purpose” in translations of the Critique of Judgment both correspond to the German term Zweck; the cognate German term Zweckmässigkeit is generally translated as “purposiveness,” although the term “finality” has sometimes also been used.) Among the most striking elements of Kant's account of natural teleology are (i) his claim, in the “Analytic of Teleological Judgment,” that organisms must be regarded by human beings in teleological terms, i.e., as “natural ends,” and (ii) his attempt, in the “Dialectic of Teleological Judgment,” to reconcile this teleological conception of organisms with a mechanistic account of nature. These are described here in Section 3.3 and 3.4, respectively. Prior to this, Section 3.1 outlines Kant's notions of end and purposiveness in general and Section 3.2 sketches nature's “purposiveness for our cognitive faculties,” i.e., its amenability to empirical scientific enquiry. The discussion of biological teleology and its relation to mechanism in Sections 3 and 4 is followed by two sections dealing with further aspects of Kant's teleology. Section 3.5 deals with Kant's view that nature as a whole may be regarded as a system of ends, and Section 3.6 with the implications of this teleological view of nature for morality and religion.

3.1 The Notion of Purposiveness

The notions of purpose or end [Zweck] and of purposiveness [Zweckmässigkeit] are defined by Kant in the “Critique of Aesthetic Judgment,” in a section entitled “On Purposiveness in General” (§10). An end is “the object of a concept, in so far as the concept as seen as the cause of the object,” and purposiveness is “the causality of a concept with respect to its object” (§10, 220). But Kant often uses the terms “end” and “purposive” in ways that are related to, but do not quite fit, these definitions. In particular “end” is sometimes used to apply to the concept rather than the corresponding object (e.g., Introduction IV, 180), and “purposiveness” is usually used to denote, not the causality of the concept, but the property in virtue of which an object counts as an end (e.g., FI IX, 234). Kant also characterizes “purposiveness” as the “lawfulness of the contingent as such” (FI VI, 217; see also FI VIII, 228, Introduction V, 184, and §76, 404).

Kant's initial definition at §10 suggests that the paradigm of an end is a human artifact, since this typically comes into being as a result of the artisan's having a concept of the object he or she plans to produce, a concept which is thus causally efficacious in producing its object. Such an object is the result of design. But Kant goes on to claim that something can qualify as an end, or as purposive, not only if it is in fact brought about as a result of design, but if we can conceive its possibility only on the assumption that it was produced according to design: “an object or a state of mind or even an action... is called purposive merely because its possibility can only be explained and conceived by us in so far as we assume at its ground a causality in accordance with ends” (§10, 220). Kant thinks that this is the case in particular for organisms, which are “natural ends” (see Section 3.3 below). But the notion of purposiveness also applies more broadly, and Kant distinguishes various different kinds of purposiveness applying not only to organisms and artifacts, but also to beautiful objects, to nature as a whole (both in so far as it is comprehensible to human beings, and in so far as it is a system of ends standing in purposive relations to one another), to the functioning of our cognitive faculties in aesthetic appreciation and empirical scientific enquiry, to geometrical figures, and even to objects that are useful or agreeable to human beings.

Because Kant's terminology is not always consistent, it is difficult to provide a definitive characterization of the various types of purposiveness. However, the following simplified scheme may serve as a guide. The notion of purposiveness is divided in the first instance into subjective and objective purposiveness. Both kinds of purposiveness are in turn divided into formal and material (or real). The most important kinds of purposiveness for the concerns of the Critique of Judgment are (i) subjective formal purposiveness and (ii) objective material purposiveness. Subjective formal purposiveness corresponds both to the “aesthetic” purposiveness displayed by beautiful objects (or by the activity of our cognitive faculties in the perception of them) and to the “logical” purposiveness displayed by nature as a whole in so far as it is comprehensible to human beings (see Section 3.2). Objective material purposiveness corresponds to the purposiveness displayed both by organisms qua “natural ends” (see Section 3.3) and by arrangements of natural things or processes which stand to one another in means-ends relations (see Section 3.5). But Kant also allows for subjective material purposiveness, which is the kind of purposiveness exhibited by an agreeable object, i.e., one which pleases our senses (FI VIII, 224); and for objective formal purposiveness, which is exhibited by geometrical figures in virtue of their fruitfulness for solving mathematical problems (§62).

A further important distinction is that between objective material purposiveness which is inner, and objective material purposiveness which is merely outer or relative; this distinguishes the kind of purposiveness possessed by organisms from that in virtue of which one natural thing or process stands in a means-end relation to another. Kant also claims in one passage (FI XII, 249-250) that the distinction between inner and relative purposiveness applies to subjective as well as objective purposiveness, serving to separate the beautiful from the sublime.

The distinctions among these various kinds of purposiveness have been treated in detail by Marc-Wogau (1938) and Tonelli (1957-1958).

There has been disagreement among commentators about whether there is any underlying philosophical unity to Kant's notion of purposiveness, and, in particular, whether the notion of purposiveness which figures in the aesthetic context is the same as that which figures in Kant's account of organisms. Guyer takes Kant to be operating with two different senses of “purposiveness,” one applying to artifacts (and, presumably, organisms), the other applying to objects of aesthetic appreciation. While purposiveness in the former sense corresponds to Kant's account of purposiveness at §10 in terms of the notion of design, the notion of purposiveness as it applies to beautiful objects does not involve the idea of real or apparent design, but simply that of the satisfaction of an aim or objective (1979, pp. 213-218; see also 1993, p. 417n.39). An opposing view is defended in Ginsborg 1997a, which draws on Kant's characterization of purposiveness as the “lawfulness of the contingent as such” (FI VI, 217; see also FI VIII, 228; Introduction V, 184; and §76, 404) to argue for a univocal conception on which purposiveness is understood as normative lawfulness.

3.2 Nature's Purposiveness for Our Cognitive Faculties

Kant claims in the Introductions to the Critique of Judgment that it is an a priori principle of reflecting judgment that nature is “purposive for our cognitive faculties” or “purposive for judgment.” This principle is, in the terminology of the Critique of Pure Reason, regulative rather than constitutive. We cannot assert that nature is, as a matter of objective fact, purposive for our cognitive faculties, but it is a condition of the exercise of reflecting judgment that we assume nature's purposiveness for our cognitive faculties. The assumption that nature is purposive for our cognitive faculties is not, strictly speaking, part of teleology, since the purposiveness at issue is subjective, and teleological judgments are concerned only with objective purposiveness (see e.g., FI VII, 221). But it is nonetheless relevant to Kant's teleology, since our entitlement to ascribe objective purposiveness to natural things, in particular to organisms, derives from our more fundamental entitlement to regard nature as (subjectively) purposive for our cognitive faculties (FI VI, 218; Introduction VIII, 193-194).

Kant characterizes the principle of nature's purposiveness in a variety of different ways which he seems to treat as interchangeable even though they do not, on the face of it, come to the same thing. The variety of characterizations stems in part from the variety of different tasks he seems to ascribe to reflecting judgment itself. In addition to being responsible for aesthetic judgments, and to supplying the concept of purposiveness which is required for teleological judgments, reflecting judgment seems to be ascribed the following cognitive tasks: the classification of natural things into a hierarchy of genera and species; the construction of explanatory scientific theories in which more specific natural laws are represented as falling under higher and more general laws; the representation of nature as empirically lawlike überhaupt; and the formation of empirical concepts überhaupt. Because the principle of nature's purposiveness is, in effect, the principle that nature is amenable to the activity of reflecting judgment itself, it seems to allow of being formulated in a corresponding variety of ways, that is, as a principle of nature's taxonomic systematicity, of its explanatory systematicity, of its empirical lawlikeness, and of its empirical conceptualizability.

Kant's discussion of the principle of nature's purposiveness for our cognitive faculties, and his related earlier discussion (in the Appendix to the Transcendental Dialectic of the Critique of Pure Reason) of the regulative principle of nature's systematicity, have, together, been seen as very important for the understanding of Kant's views on empirical science. Moreover, to the extent that the principle is seen as required not only for the construction of systematic scientific theories, but also for the recognition of nature's empirical lawlikeness or (even more fundamentally) for the possibility of any empirical concept-formation at all, it takes on great importance for an understanding of Kant's views on empirical cognition generally. However, Kant's discussion of the principle has been thought to pose a number of serious interpretative and philosophical difficulties, including the following:

(1) How are the various formulations of the principle related? Kant seems to regard them as amounting to the same, and thus to be committed to the view that if nature is empirically conceptualizable at all, we must also recognize the empirical regularities it manifests as lawlike, and the corresponding concepts and laws must fall under a systematic hierarchy. But it is not clear how such a view is to be justified. It seems quite conceivable that natural things could be conceptualizable (say, under familiar concepts like dog or granite) without those concepts in turn figuring in a systematic hierarchy. Relatedly, it also seems conceivable that we could apply such concepts to natural things without being able to detect any lawlike connections among the corresponding properties, let alone connections which in turn allow of being incorporated into an overarching system of empirical laws.

(2) Regardless of how one understands the task of reflecting judgment, and the content of the corresponding principle, why is it a condition of the successful exercise of reflecting judgment that we assume that nature is suitable for reflecting judgment? Why can't we pursue our attempts, say, to arrive at a systematic hierarchy of natural concepts and laws, without assuming in advance that nature will favour our efforts?

(3) If the principle is indeed required, as Kant suggests it is, for the empirical conceptualization of nature and for the recognition of nature as empirically lawlike, then it would seem to be a condition of the possibility of experience. But then why is it regulative rather than constitutive? Relatedly, how are we to reconcile the respective roles of the pure concepts of the understanding (in particular the concept of causality) on the one hand, with the principle of nature's purposiveness for our cognitive faculties on the other? If Kant has already shown, in the Analytic of the Critique of Pure Reason, that nature is subject to causal laws, then why is there any need for a further principle to account for the recognition of nature as empirically lawlike?

Much of the discussion of these and related questions was stimulated by Buchdahl, who argued (1969, 1969a) that the principle of causality in the Analytic of the Critique of Pure Reason was insufficient to account for nature's subordination to particular causal laws and that, instead, a principle of systematicity was required; a similar view is developed in Philip Kitcher (1986; for a somewhat revised view, see 1994). Other commentators who have treated the topic include McFarland (1970), Guyer (1979 ch. 2, 1990, 1990a and 2003b), Horstmann (1989), Brandt (1989), Butts (1990), Ginsborg (1990, 1990a), Friedman (1991 and 1992, ch. 5), Walker (1991), Brittan (1992), Patricia Kitcher (1990 ch. 8), Floyd (1998) and Allison (2001, ch. 1).

3.3 Organisms as Natural Ends

In §§64-65 of the “Analytic of Teleological Judgment” Kant introduces the notion of a “natural end” and argues both that “organized beings,” that is, plants and animals, instantiate the concept of a natural end and also that they are the only beings in nature that do so (§65, 376). (Kant sometimes says that they are natural ends, and sometimes only that they must be “regarded” or “considered” as natural ends.) Organized beings (or, to use the more modern term, “organisms”) are, or must be considered as, ends because we can conceive of their possibility only on the assumption that they were produced in accordance with design. They thus meet the definition of “end” given at §10. (In the terms introduced in Section 3.1, they display “inner objective material purposiveness.”) But they are, or must be considered, as products of nature rather than products of conscious design.

What makes an organism qualify as a natural end is that it is “both cause and effect of itself” (§64, 371). Kant gives a preliminary explanation of this idea at §64 by calling attention to three respects in which an organism, such as a tree, stands in a causal relation to its own existence. First, in producing offspring which resemble it, a tree “produces itself as far as its species is concerned,” so that the species of the tree maintains itself in existence. Second, a tree preserves itself as an individual by taking in nourishment from outside and converting it into the kind of organic substance of which it, itself, is made. Third, and most important, the various parts of a tree mutually maintain one another in existence and hence maintain the whole tree in existence. For example, while the leaves are produced by the tree as a whole and depend on it for their growth and maintenance, they are in turn necessary for the growth and maintenance of the other parts of the tree, for example the trunk and roots. Kant also mentions a number of further phenomena illustrating the way in which an organism is “cause and effect” of itself, in particular the capacity of certain organisms to regenerate missing parts, and more generally the capacity of organisms to repair damage to themselves.

Kant goes into more detail about the notion of a natural end in §65, where he specifies two conditions something must meet in order to be a natural end. The first, that the “parts are possible…only through their relation to the whole” (§65, 373), is a condition on something's being, not only a natural end, but an end tout court. It thus applies not only to living things but also to artifacts, such as watches, in which each part is there for the sake of its relation to the whole, and is thus in a sense there only on account of its relation to the whole. The second condition, which applies only to ends which are natural, is that “the parts of the thing…are reciprocally cause of effect of their form” (ibid.). (This corresponds to the third of the features to which Kant drew our attention in the example of the tree at §64.) This condition is not met by artifacts, a point which Kant illustrates by appeal to the example of a watch, whose parts, unlike the parts of a plant or animal, do not produce one another or maintain one another in existence.

Kant is concerned, then, to emphasize both an analogy and a disanalogy between organisms and artifacts. As in the case of artifacts, we can make sense of organisms (that is, understand their structure and workings) only by appeal to teleological notions. We make sense of an organism by coming to understand what the functions of its various parts are (e.g., by coming to understand that the function of the heart is to pump blood round the body, or that the heart is there “in order to” pump blood round the body) just as we make sense of an artifact such as a watch by coming to understand the functions of its parts (e.g., that a particular wheel is there in order to turn the hour hand). But organisms are unlike artifacts in that they are not produced or maintained by an external cause, but instead have the self-producing and self-maintaining character that is revealed in the kinds of vital properties (reproduction of young, capacity to nourish themselves, reciprocal dependence of parts, capacity for self-repair) which Kant illustrates with the example of the tree.

The question of how the natural character of organisms can be reconciled with their status as ends (and hence of the coherence of the notion of a “natural end”) is indirectly addressed by Kant in the “Dialectic of Teleological Judgment” in the form of a question about how we are to reconcile the apparently conflicting demands of mechanistic and teleological explanation with regard to living things (see Section 3.4 below). Most critical attention to Kant's account of organisms has been directed to the question in this latter form, so that there has been comparatively little attention to Kant's account of organisms in the “Analytic of Teleological Judgment.” However, the question is addressed directly in Ginsborg 2001, which aims to defend both the notion of a natural end, and Kant's claim that organisms must be regarded as ends.

There is a valuable discussion of the Analytic in McLaughlin (1990, ch. 1), which sets Kant's view of organisms in the context of eighteenth-century biology; Kant's account of organisms in the Analytic is also discussed in Zumbach (1984). Fricke (1990) and Guyer (2003a) both relate Kant's view of organisms as natural ends to his views about reflective judgment in aesthetic judgment and science. Ginsborg (1997a) aims to connect Kant's notion of organisms as ends with his notion of purposiveness in aesthetics. Guyer (2001) discusses the way in which Kant's notion of organisms as ends creates a problem for his conception of science as unified.

3.4 Mechanism and Teleology

The same considerations which lead Kant to claim, in the Analytic, that we must regard organisms as ends, lead him to claim, in the Dialectic, that their production cannot be mechanically explained and that they must instead be accounted for in terms which ultimately make reference to teleology. In a well-known passage he declares that it is “absurd for human beings…to hope that there may yet arise a Newton who could make conceivable even so much as the production of a blade of grass according to natural laws which no intention has ordered” (§75, 400). The mechanical inexplicability of organisms leads to an apparent conflict, which Kant refers to as an “antinomy of judgment,” between two principles governing empirical scientific enquiry. On the one hand, we must seek to explain everything in nature in mechanical terms; on the other, some objects in nature resist mechanical explanation and we need to appeal to teleology in order to understand them (§70, 387).

The question of how Kant resolves the Antinomy is controversial. At least part of Kant's solution consists in the claim that both principles are merely “regulative” rather than “constitutive,” that is, that they do not state how nature really is, but only present principles which we must follow in investigating nature. Kant develops this solution in detail by arguing that both the need for mechanistic explanation for nature as a whole, and the specific need to regard some products of nature (specifically, organisms) in teleological terms, are due to peculiarities of our human cognitive faculties. The core of this argument is given in §77, where Kant differentiates two kinds of understanding, the “discursive” understanding of human beings, and a contrasting “intuitive” understanding which (although Kant does not say so explicitly) might be ascribed to God. While a being with a discursive understanding cannot understand how an organisms could come about in ways that do not involve teleological causation, this does not mean this could not be understood by an intuitive understanding, and hence that the production of organisms is impossible without such causation.

This argument on its own is not sufficient to address the question of how the principles are to be reconciled in scientific enquiry, that is, how we are to seek a mechanical explanation of organisms (as required by the first principle) while still acknowledging that we cannot understand them except by appeal to ends. Kant's answer to this question is that we must “subordinate” mechanism to teleology (§78, 414). Even in the case of organisms, we must pursue the search for mechanical explanation as far as possible, yet while still recognizing the need for an ultimate appeal to ends. The subordination of mechanism to teleology is clarified in §§80-81, in the “Methodology of Teleological Judgment,” where Kant connects his views to some of the biological controversies of the day, regarding both the origin of the various species of plants and animals, and the origin of individual plants and animals belonging to already existing species. In the case of the origin of species, Kant tentatively endorses a view which allows the natural development of higher species out of lower ones, but which denies the possibility that the lower species in turn could develop out of unorganized matter as such. The view is “mechanical” to the extent that it understands the development of one species from another as a natural law-governed process which does not require special appeal to an end in the case of each new species; but the mechanism is “subordinated to teleology” in the sense that the starting-point of the process, namely matter which itself has organization and life, is intelligible only by appeal to ends (§80). In the case of the origin of particular organisms, Kant endorses a view (epigenesis) on which the emergence of an apparently new plant or animal is not just the expansion or unfolding of one which already existed in miniature (as on the preformationist view), but a natural process whereby a new living thing comes into being. At the same time, he denies that a living thing can come to be out of non-living matter: the matter from which the embryo develops must already be teleologically organized. The view is “mechanical” in the sense that it denies that each living thing was produced, like an artifact, in accordance with a specific intention, and allows instead that once matter is endowed with life and organization it has the power to produce other living things. But again, as in the case of the origin of species, this “mechanism” depends on living matter, whose possibility we can understand only in teleological terms.

It is difficult to understand the implications of Kant's discussion of mechanism and teleology without knowing what he means by “mechanism,” and unfortunately this is very hard to determine from the text. Many commentators have taken the notion of mechanism to be equivalent to the notion of causality in time which figures in the Critique of Pure Reason, so that the principle of mechanism is equivalent to the causal principle which Kant takes himself to have proved in the Second Analogy. If the notion of mechanism is understood in this way, then Kant's solution to the antinomy of teleological judgment is radically at odds with his views in the Critique of Pure Reason, since it involves the claim that the principle of mechanism is merely regulative as opposed to constitutive. McLaughlin (1989, 1990), and following him Allison (1991), reject this reading, instead taking the notion of mechanism in the relevant sense to correspond to a more specific type of causality, namely the causality by which the parts of a thing determine the whole rather than the whole's determining the parts; this view is also taken by Zanetti (1993). Ginsborg (2001) offers a third proposal, on which a thing can be explained “mechanically” if its existence can be accounted for in terms of the intrinsic powers of the matter out of which it comes to be.

A related interpretative issue concerns the grounds on which organisms resist mechanical explanation, and hence need to be understood teleologically. Many commentators, including McLaughlin (1990), Allison (1991) and Guyer (2001, 2003a), take organisms to be mechanically inexplicable in virtue of the self-maintaining and self-producing character which distinguishes them from artifacts (see Section 3.3). Against this, Ginsborg (2004) argues that their self-maintaining character is irrelevant to their mechanical inexplicability, at least in the sense of mechanical explanation which is contrasted with teleological explanation. On this view, organisms and complex artifacts are on a par as regards their mechanical inexplicability.

There is a helpful discussion of the Antinomy in Quarfood (2004, last chapter), which also contains many references to recent literature on the topic of mechanism and teleology in Kant.

3.5 Nature as a System of Ends

Kant is concerned with the role of teleology in our understanding not only of individual organisms, but also of other natural things and processes, and of nature as a whole. Experience presents us with many cases in which features of a living thing's environment, both organic and inorganic, are beneficial or indeed necessary to it: for example rivers are helpful to the growth of plants, and thus indirectly to human beings, because they deposit soil and thus create fertile land (§63, 367); grass is necessary for cattle and other herbivorous animals, which in turn provide food for carnivores (§63, 368). Kant makes the negative point (a version of which he had earlier argued at length in the Only Possible Argument for the Existence of God of 1763) that we can understand these arrangements without appeal to ends. We can account for the origin of rivers mechanically, and even though grass must be regarded as an end on account of its internal organization, we do not need to appeal to its usefulness to other living things in order to comprehend it. However, he does hold that the natural objects figuring in these useful arrangements have a type of purposiveness, namely outer or relative purposiveness. They can be counted as purposive in this relative sense as long as the thing to whose existence they contribute is a living thing, and hence has inner purposiveness (this condition is stated most clearly at §82, 425).

The idea of the outer or relative purposiveness of one natural thing for another, which is made possible by the idea of a natural end, in turn makes possible the idea of nature as a system of ends, where everything in nature is teleologically connected to everything else through relations of outer purposiveness. Kant puts this by saying that the concept of a natural end “necessarily leads to the idea of all of nature as a system in accordance with the rule of ends” (§67, 379), but he also puts the point more weakly by saying that the step from the the idea of a natural end to that of nature as a whole as a system of ends is one which we “may” [dürfen] make (§67, 380). This does not mean that we are entitled, still less required, to ascribe an intentional cause to purposive arrangements in nature, but it does allow us to think of them as standing not only in a mechanical, but also in a teleological order. The thought of such a teleological order in turn leads to two further ideas: the idea of the ultimate end [letzter Zweck] of nature, which is something within nature for whose sake all other things within nature exist (§82, 426ff), and the idea of the final end [Endzweck] of nature, which is something outside of nature for whose sake nature as a whole exists (§67, 378f.; §84, 434ff.). While experience does not allow us to identify either nature's ultimate end or its final end, Kant argues on a priori grounds that the final end of nature can only be man considered as a moral subject, that is, considered as having the supersensible ability to choose ends freely (§84, 435). To consider man in this way is to conceive him as noumenon, rather than as part of nature. But human beings are capable of realizing their noumenal freedom only in virtue of their capacity, as natural beings, to set themselves ends and to use nature to fulfil them. Kant calls the development of this capacity “culture,” and takes it to require the acquisition both of specific abilities (“culture of skill”) and of the ability to make choices without being influenced by the inclinations to enjoyment stemming from our animal nature (“culture of discipline”). Culture is the ultimate end of nature because it prepares man for what he must do in order to be the final end of nature (§83, 431).

3.6 Teleology, Morality and Religion

Part of Kant's aim in the “Critique of Teleological Judgment” is to clarify the relation of natural teleology to religion, and to argue in particular against “physicoteleology,” that is, the attempt to use natural teleology to prove the existence of God. (The topic of physicotheology was of concern to Kant throughout his career: Kant proposes a “revised physicotheology” in the Only Possible Argument for the Existence of God (1763), and offers a more far-reaching criticism of physicotheology in the Critique of Pure Reason, at A620/B648ff.) Appeal to natural teleology may justify the assumption of an intelligent cause of nature, but it cannot justify the assumption that this cause has wisdom, let alone that it is infinite in every respect, and in particular supremely wise (§85, 441). For this we need to appeal, not to natural, but to moral, teleology, and in particular to the idea (itself belonging not to natural, but to moral teleology) of man as final end of nature. The idea of nature as purposively directed towards the existence of rational beings under moral laws allows us to conceive of an author of nature who is not merely intelligent, but also has the other atttibutes associated with the traditional idea of God, for example omniscience, omnipotence and wisdom (which includes omnibenificence and justice) (§86, 444). We have to assume the existence of a being with these attributes if we ourselves are to adopt the end required by the moral law, an end which Kant calls the “highest good” and which is discussed in his moral writings.

Although natural teleology cannot prove the existence of God, it nonetheless has a positive role to play with respect to religion and morality, in that it leads us to ask what the final end of nature is, and relatedly, to inquire into the attributes of God as author of nature. Thus, as Kant puts it, it “drives us to seek a theology” (§85, 440), and thus serves as a preparation or “propadeutic” to theology (§85, 442). Kant also claims that “if the cognition of natural ends is connected with that of the moral end” then “it is of great significance for assisting the practical reality of the idea [of God]” (§88, 456). The positive role of natural teleology in establishing religion and morality has been emphasized by Guyer (see especially 2000 2001a, 2002), who takes the “Critique of Teleological Judgment” to provide an important argument from natural teleology to morality.


A. Primary Sources

Original Sources

The two most important sources for Kant's views on aesthetics and teleology, Critique of Judgment and ‘First Introduction‘, are both published in the standard German edition of Kant's works, the so-called Academy edition:

Page references given in this article follow the pagination of the Academy edition, which is indicated in the margins of the two most recent English-language editions (see below). Unless otherwise stated, all references are to the Critique of Judgment. References to the First Introduction are introduced by the abbreviation “FI.” Quotations follow the Cambridge translation (see below), with occasional divergences.

English Translations

The two most recent English-language editions of the Critique of Judgment are to be preferred over earlier translations. The recent translations are:

The earlier translations are those of J.H. Bernard (London: Macmillan, 1892; revised edition 1914) and J.C. Meredith (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1952; a combination of translations of the two main sections of the work that were published separately in 1911 and 1928 respectively).

Both the Hackett and the Cambridge editions include the First Introduction, and both provide further bibliographical references (the Hackett edition has a good bibliography of secondary literature up to 1987). The Cambridge edition contains excellent editorial notes, including copious references to other relevant writings by Kant.

There are substantial differences among the various available English-language editions, in particular in the translation of certain frequently occurring terms, and these differences are reflected in variations in the terminology used in the secondary literature. Some issues regarding the translation of the text are discussed in section IV of the Editor's Introduction to the Cambridge edition and in Ginsborg 2002.

Other Primary Sources

While Kant's most systematic and mature discussion of teleology is in the Critique of Judgment, there is also extensive discussion of the topic in the Only Possible Argument for the Existence of God (1763) (included in Kant, Theoretical Philosophy 1755-1770, translated and edited by David Walford and Ralf Meerbote [Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992]) and in two essays about race, “Determination of the Concept of a Human Race” (1785) and “On the Use of Teleological Principles in Philosophy” (1788) (English translation forthcoming as part of the Cambridge Edition of Kant's works).

Kant's early work, Observations on the Sublime and the Beautiful, has, in spite of its title, very little bearing on Kant's aesthetic theory, and is more a work of popular anthropology.

B. Secondary Sources

Other Internet Resources

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Related Entries

aesthetics: aesthetic judgment | Kant, Immanuel | Kant, Immanuel: critique of metaphysics | Kant, Immanuel: philosophical development | Kant, Immanuel: philosophy of science | Kant, Immanuel: theory of judgment | teleology: teleological notions in biology


Work on this article was supported by the American Council of Learned Societies and by the Max Planck Institute for the History of Science.