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Étienne Bonnot de Condillac

First published Thu Oct 17, 2002; substantive revision Mon Feb 12, 2007

Étienne Bonnot, Abbé de Condillac, was the chief exponent of a radically empiricist account of the workings of the mind that has since come to be referred to as "sensationism." Whereas John Locke's empiricism followed upon a rejection of innate principles and innate ideas, Condillac went further and rejected innate abilities as well. On his version of empiricism, experience not only provides us with "ideas" or the raw materials for knowledge, it also teaches us how to focus attention, remember, imagine, abstract, judge, and reason. It forms our desires and teaches us what to will. Moreover, it provides us with the best lessons in the performance of these operations, so that a study of how we originally learn to perform them also tells us how those operations ought to be performed. The pursuit of this tenet led Condillac to articulate an early developmental psychology, with explicit pedagogical and methodological implications. His concerns also led him to focus on the theory of perception, and to advance important and original views on our perception of spatial form. He offered a more searching, careful, and precise account of what exactly is given to us by each of the sense organs than any that had been offered up to his day, and presented a highly nuanced account of how this raw data is worked up into our beliefs about the world around us.

1. Life and Works

Condillac was born on September 30, 1714 in Grenoble as the third son of Gabriel Bonnot, Vicomte de Mably, and Catherine de La Coste. ("Condillac" was the name of an estate purchased by his father in 1720.) He is said to have had very poor eyesight and a weak physical constitution, factors that so retarded his intellectual development that as late as his twelfth year he was still unable to read. His education began only in his teens, first under the direction of a local priest, then at Lyons, where he went to live with his older brother, Jean, after the death of their father. Perhaps because of his reticence and his late learning his family regarded him as possessing limited intellectual abilities. He nonetheless managed to continue his education as a seminarian in Paris, at Saint-Suplice and at the Sorbonne. He took holy orders in 1740 and wore a cassock for the rest of his life, but did no pastoral work. After some years spent living the life of a man of letters in Paris, during which he came to be closely acquainted with Rousseau and Diderot, and published work that won him election to the Prussian Academy of the Sciences (1749), he accepted a position as tutor to the Prince of Parma, a post that he held from 1758-68. He returned to Paris in 1768 and was elected to the French Academy in that year, but he left the city shortly after, in 1773, and took up residence on a country estate he had purchased near Beaugency. He died there on August 3, 1780.

Condillac published two main philosophical works: the Essay on the Origin of Human Knowledge of 1746, and the Treatise on Sensations of 1754, both of which were devoted to expositing his views on the role of experience in the development of our cognitive capacities.

The earlier Essay was a less radical work. Though it sought to explain how the cognitive faculties are developed as a consequence of sensation, it took sensation itself largely for granted. Condillac explicitly rejected the views that the mind can make judgments that it is not aware of, and that we can confuse the products of inferential operations with immediately given sensations. As a consequence, he maintained, in opposition to Molyneux, Locke, and Berkeley, that we do not need to learn to perceive visual depth. However, the Essay was also more wide-ranging than the Treatise. It devoted attention to the development of language and its role both in the acquisition of our more sophisticated cognitive powers and in the generation of false philosophies. These are topics that Condillac later relegated to his works on logic.

In the Treatise Condillac focused just on our pre-linguistic cognitive abilities, which he came to think he might have underestimated when he wrote the Essay. He retracted his earlier claim that perception is a transparent process and accepted both that it involves unconscious inference from what is given in sensation and that sensation itself may contain more than it is at first perceived to contain. He also retracted his earlier claim that depth is immediately perceived by vision. To support these revised opinions, he proposed a famous thought experiment. He asked his readers to consider an originally inanimate and insentient human being (Condillac spoke of a being that is just a "statue" of a human being) and to consider what this being could come to know were it to acquire each of the senses in isolation from the others, or each in combination with just one or two others. In proposing this question Condillac was asking a more radical version of the question Molyneux had posed to Locke: would a person born blind and made to see perceive spatial features well enough upon first sight to be able to identify cubes and spheres without touching them? Condillac was asking what a person endowed with just a sense of smell would think upon acquiring the power of hearing, or what a person endowed with vision would know if unaffected by hunger, incapable of motion, and unaware of any tactile sensation. His answer to these questions sought not just to explain how this person would acquire ideas of space and of external objects, but to prove that nothing more would be needed for it to acquire all the knowledge and all of the abilities that we have other than just to experience a sufficiently rich array of sensations.

Condillac's other philosophical works support and embellish the doctrines of the Essay and the Treatise. They are the Treatise on Systems of 1749, which is devoted to critiquing the metaphysics and the methodology of earlier philosophers, the Treatise on Animals of 1755, which attempts to explain how human souls differ from those of animals with respect to intelligence and free will, the "Dissertation on Liberty", an important short work appended to the Treatise on Sensations that further addresses the issue of human free will, the "Summary [extrait raisonné] of the Treatise on Sensations," originally included in the Treatise on Animals, and a textbook on Logic (1780). He also published a work on commerce and government, assembled a dictionary of synonyms, and put together a multi-volume course of studies that he had developed while tutoring the Prince of Parma. The latter dealt principally with history but also included some philosophical material, including a different presentation of logic. At the time of his death he left an incomplete a work entitled The Language of Calculation.

2. The Metaphysics of Condillac's Sensationism

Condillac's account of the development of our cognitive capacities was informed by a particular conception of the nature of the mind and the sensations it is originally given. He argued that the mind must be an unextended or immaterial substance (Essay I.i.1 §6).[1] When it senses, nothing actually passes into it from the outside world or the body. Instead the action of external objects on the sense organs brings about changes in the body and these changes serve as the merely occasional cause of the production of sensations in the mind.

Sensations are modifications of our being. To understand them as images of something distinct from us is to treat them as "ideas" rather than simply as "sensations," and that is an operation that is so far from being automatic that it exceeds the capacities of animals. However, unlike Reid, who was later to argue for a rigorous distinction between sensations, considered as states of feeling experienced by the mind, and perceptions, considered as acts of thinking something about an object, Condillac maintained that sensations do lend themselves to being treated as ideas. He denied that sensations are "something that only occurs aside from thoughts and modifies them" and insisted that they are "as representative" as any other thought experienced by the mind (Essay I.ii.2 §9).

3. Sensation in the Essay

Most early modern philosophers were impressed by the facts of geometrical optics, which teach that light imprints an inverted, left-right reversed image of the external world on the concave surface of the back of the eye. If we accept that the eye is the means of visual perception, then this teaching appears to imply that the eyes filter out information about the distance at which objects are set outwards from us and transmit just information about position along the horizon and the azimuth to the mind. After all, while points at different angles of inclination upwards or downwards from the horizon, or at different compass directions will project light to different parts of the retina, points that differ only with reference to their distance outwards from the eye will project light onto the same part of the eye. But if differences in distance outwards make no difference to the impression on the eye, and the mind is only affected as a consequence of how the eye is affected, then information about outward distances is not conveyed to the mind. It would seem, therefore, that visual perception must originally lack information about distance outwards. It must consist of an awareness of images that are only two-dimensional projections of solid objects in a three dimensional space.

But the Condillac of the Essay was not impressed by these considerations. Though he admitted that the image imprinted by light on the eye is merely two-dimensional, he denied that the mind must therefore only be aware of a two-dimensional image (Essay §2). However he had little to say about how the mind might acquire information about outward distances, and instead confined himself to attacking the standard account.[2] On the standard account, when I perceive a three dimensional object, such as a uniformly coloured globe, I must really see a two dimensional projection of that object, variously shaded in its different parts, and then judge that this two-dimensional, variously coloured image is a representation of a uniformly coloured three-dimensional object (the classic presentation of this view is to be found in Locke's Essay, book II, chapter ix, paragraph 8). But I am not conscious of seeing a flat, variously coloured circle, nor am I conscious of making a judgment about what this image represents. Instead, I seem to immediately see a uniformly coloured, three-dimensional object. Moreover, try as I might, I cannot make myself aware of drawing an inference. And I have so little awareness of the flat, variously coloured circle that I supposedly see that, without the aid of instruction in drawing or painting, I would have no idea that it bears any relation to a uniformly coloured globe. Condillac found this insupportable. The mind, he maintained, cannot be so deeply ignorant of what it senses or of what it does (Essay §§3-5).

Consistently with the view that we do not need to learn to perceive depth, Condillac maintained that we do not need to learn to perceive separation in any other spatial dimension. Consequently, a previously blind person, made to see for the first time, should see colours to be extended over all three dimensions. The alternative, in Condillac's view is that the newly sighted person would experience just a "mathematical point" of colour, and he rejected this as patently absurd (Essay §§12-14).

Condillac was aware that these claims had been challenged by such empirical studies of recovered vision as were available at the time. In 1728, the English surgeon, William Chesselden, had reported to the British Royal Society that subjects recovering from operations to remove cataracts that had blinded them since birth appeared to need to learn to associate what they saw with tactile experience before they could recognize shapes or objects. Condillac replied to this contrary evidence by claiming that it would take some time for newly sighted subjects to learn how to focus the eyes in order to perceive colours distinctly, and so to see their outlines. It would then take time for the subjects to attend to the shapes that distinctly seen colours exhibit, since we can expect that at first they would be overwhelmed and confused by the variety of information presented by the eyes, much like a person gaining a first glimpse of a Bosch painting. Finally, even after they came to see colours as, say, outlining square or round shapes, they might still hesitate to assume that simply because an object looks to have a certain shape, that therefore it must be felt to have that shape as well. For all of these reasons, time might pass and the subject might appear to be learning to associate visual experiences with tangible objects, even though the colours that are originally seen are already extended and shaped in three dimensions (Essay §16).

4. Sensation in the Treatise

Condillac's reply to the Chesselden data contained the germs of an insight that was to be central for the later Treatise: the claim that visual sensations, and indeed all sensations, might contain information that goes unnoticed by a subject simply because it is not attended to. This insight, already present in the Essay, was subversive. It challenged that work's rejection of perception by means of unconscious sensations and unconscious inferences. It led to the Treatise's claim that having a sensation does not imply being conscious of everything that sensation involves (Treatise I.xi.8, III.iii.6).

In his Logic, Condillac illustrated this point by asking his readers to imagine a group of people who travel by night to a chateau situated on a high point before a vast panorama of fields, mountains, cities, towns, and forests. At dawn, the windows are thrown open for just an instant. In that instant, each member of the company experiences a compound visual sensation consisting of multiple, simultaneously present colour patches disposed in space so as to depict all the parts of the panorama that lies out in a particular direction. But from the view obtained in just an instant, no one can say what it was that they saw. If the shutters are left open for more than an instant nothing new is presented to the company. That is, they do not have any sensation they did not have in the first instant. They come to perceive what it is they at first already sensed by selectively attending to each of its parts in turn and then noting how these parts are related to one another (Logic, Part I, Chapter ii).

Condillac had always appreciated that this act of attention is not an innate operation, any more than such higher cognitive operations as abstraction, judgment, or reasoning are innate operations. We need to learn how to attend to what we sense. Experience itself serves as our teacher. The operation of attention is invoked by our needs and interests. We attend first to what promises to satisfy our needs and interests, which are always with us and which always direct our thought. Our knowledge of what promises to satisfy our needs and interests is a product of past experience, which has made us aware of what objects are connected with the frustration or satisfaction of those needs and interests. The needs and interests themselves are developed as a consequence of a past experience of pleasure and pain, which in turn are intrinsic features not just of tactile experience, but of all of our sensations. However, in the Essay Condillac had not appreciated the full implications of this view. Recognizing those implications required being more careful about specifying what is originally given in sensation, what is originally attended to, and what leads us to attend to anything else. The device of the slowly animated "statue" was invoked to assist in making these determinations.

Condillac supposed that the most primitive form of experience would be the sense of smell. A being (Condillac's "statue") endowed with just this one sense but no motive power would, Condillac supposed, be capable of receiving pleasure or pain from the experience of different odoriferous objects. However, all that the being could do to avoid painful or acquire pleasurable sensations would be to try to distract itself with remembered or imagined smells when occurrent ones proved uninteresting or unappealing.

We would consider such a being to be a being who smells, say, a rose, and who is thereby affected in a certain way. Some might consider this effect to be a rose smell sensation that somehow stands before the mind as an object of contemplation. Others might consider the effect to be an act that has the scent of a rose as its intentional object, or an act of feeling a certain way ("rose-scentedly"). But Condillac maintained that the being itself would not at first have any conception of objects distinct from itself or even any conception of itself, let alone any views on the metaphysical status of its sensory states. When it smells a rose, it experiences itself as simply being the smell of a rose (Treatise I.i.2). If it smells more than one object at once, the smells likely amalgamate into a single, complex scent that it experiences as simple and unique. If it experiences different smells in succession, the memory of the earlier one may linger while the other comes to be present and then it may become aware of itself as having been something different from what it is now so will discover that is a thing that endures through time (Treatise I.ii.10).

If the being were allowed to have senses of sound in addition to smell, different, simultaneously experienced sounds would likewise be experienced by it as one noise, but Condillac supposed that any sound would be too different from any simultaneously occurring taste for the two to be amalgamated, as long as either one had once been experienced on its own. Thus, a being endowed with senses of both smell and hearing would experience itself as being both a smell and a sound, and so would experience itself as having a double existence (Treatise I.ix.3-4). It would not, however, necessarily experience itself as being two things at once, at least not if we take the term "thing" to refer to substances. Condillac claimed that, were each particular smell only ever experienced in conjunction with just one particular sound, and vice versa, the two would not be thought of as distinct things or substances, even though they would be distinguished from one another. Instead, the smell would be experienced as having a sound and the sound as having a scent. Otherwise put, each would play the role of property to the other. This is all that there ever is to our concept of substance, insofar as that concept has any meaning at all and is not simply a meaningless word invented by philosophers. Substance is not some substratum in which properties inhere, but a collection of sensations or qualities or properties commonly observed to occur together (Treatise I.xii.3, III.iv.2).

As has been noted, in the Treatise Condillac abandoned his earlier view that we immediately see depth. However, he continued to maintain that light and colours are extended over the remaining two dimensions. A being endowed with a sense of sight and presented with a variously coloured panorama would not experience all the different colours to be amalgamated into a point. Neither, Condillac supposed, would it blend the different colours with one another so as to see a uniformly coloured expanse. It would still continue to experience itself as simply being each of the colours it sees. Insofar as these colours are not merely multiple but outside of one another in space, the being would experience itself as not merely having a multiple existence, but also as being "outside" of itself. As Condillac put it, insofar as it is red it experiences itself as being outside of itself insofar as it is as green (Treatise I.xi.8).

It was at this point that Condillac's thesis that sensing does not entail being conscious of all that one senses came to the fore. We would think that if colours are extended and different colours are simultaneously seen without being blended, then there must be edges between them, and shapes outlined by those edges. Condillac accepted that this would in fact be the case. But he denied that his "statue" would necessarily have to be aware of this fact. The "statue" would need some reason to turn its attention to the boundaries between colours, to identify the various parts of those boundaries, and to notice what shape they constitute. But if it only considered colour sensations to be its own states of being, and took pleasure or pain only in their chromatic qualities and not in their shapes (a rather large presumption that Condillac seems not to have realized making), it would have no reason to notice that colours have shapes or even that they have particular locations relative to one another. Consequently, even though it would experience colours as being extended and outside of one another, it would not notice that the array of simultaneously present colour sensations forms an unbroken continuum. It would experience its coloured self merely as an aggregate of distinct extensions, vaguely perceived as not having any definite boundaries or shapes, and not recognized as having any locations relative to one another. Consequently, it would have no developed concept of space (Treatise I.xi.8-9).

Condillac maintained that it is only through the sense of touch that a being first acquires an awareness of space as an external continuum extending outwards beyond the bounds of its body, and an awareness of other objects in this space. Touch then teaches us to attribute smells, sounds, tastes, and colours to external objects.

Like Thomas Reid, who some ten years later also set about investigating what each of the senses can lead us to learn, Condillac took the tactile sensation of solidity to be crucial for the development of an awareness of space and of external objects. Only whereas Reid maintained that we are innately so constituted as to understand the purely qualitative sensation of solidity as sign signifying a quality of external objects, Condillac attempted to explain how experiences of the sensation of solidity could put us in a position to infer that we have spatially extended bodies and that something else exists outside of our bodies (Treatise II.v).

These inferences arise as a consequence of the comparison of two cases, one where a being touches itself, the other where it touches something else. A being that touches itself experiences a sensation of solidity in its hand and an "answering" sensation of solidity in the part of its body that it touches, thereby experiencing itself as being solid, as being two instances of solidity, and as being two instances of solidity outside of one another. Were the being to lift its hand from its body and touch another part of its body, the pair of these sensations would cease and then after a time one member of the pair would recur in the company of a different partner. The being would experience a new sensation of solidity outside of the one it receives from its hand, but its awareness of the different body parts that it touches would be like its awareness of colours. Though experienced as being outside of one another, the touched body parts would not be experienced as forming a continuum or as spatially related to one another. However, were the being to move its hand over its body without lifting it, it would experience a continuous sequence of sensations of solidity arising from different body parts. Moving the hand repeatedly in the same way would always produce the same series of sensations. Condillac did not go into any more detail, but he seems to have presumed that this would be enough to warrant the inference that the touched body parts coexist and form a continuum. Thus, through moving its hands over itself, the "statue" is supposed to acquire an awareness that it has a spatially extended body.

When the "statue" touches another object, it experiences only one sensation of solidity without the answering sensation. The absence of the second sensation is supposed to induce the judgment that there is something else that is solid. An awareness of the shape of objects and their locations in an ambient space is then developed on this basis. The "statue" subsequently learns to attribute smells and sounds to objects by discovering that moving objects can make these sensations appear or disappear (Treatise III.i-ii). Moving its hands before its eyes and discovering how this causes colour sensations to appear or disappear leads it to think of colour sensations at first as being on the surface of its eyes, then as being outside of it beyond arm's length, and then as being on the surfaces of particular tangible objects within arms length (Treatise III.iii.1-19). Having reached this stage of development, it is ready to learn to perceive objects to be at even more remote distances through discovering associations between such visual distance cues as the clarity and apparent size of visual images and the distance that must be crossed to touch an object. The interpretation of the cues then becomes so natural that we seem to be directly seeing depth. Condillac quietly ignored his earlier objections to this position (Treatise III.iii.20-33).

5. The Development of the Higher Cognitive Faculties

Condillac's account of how sensation gives rise to the exercise of our higher cognitive faculties is broadly the same in the Essay and the Treatise. Such differences as there are between the two works arise from Condillac's decision to focus the Treatise on pre-linguistic abilities. In the Essay Condillac defined perception as the impression first occasioned in the mind by the action of objects on the senses. He maintained that we are always conscious of perceptions, but that this consciousness comes in varying degrees, which are a function of the strength with which objects act on the senses, the degree of intrinsic painfulness or pleasantness of the perception, and, most importantly, the extent to which the perception has been associated with our needs, which are ultimately a function of the pleasure and pain we receive from our perceptions. A high degree of consciousness is what we call attention. Our attention is naturally drawn to those perceptions that are most pleasurable or painful, and consequently to those perceptions that we have connected with those that are most pleasurable or painful. Thus, experience of pleasure and pain is what first instructs us where to focus our attention. Learning where to focus attention is important, because many perceptions can be present at once, and a consciousness that is evenly distributed over a great number of perceptions knows none of them very clearly or distinctly (Essay I.ii.1. §§1-14).

Those perceptions that we attend to can seem to drown out the others and produce the illusion that they alone exist, whereas those perceptions that we are less conscious of can be so faint that it is impossible to recall that we have had them the instant after the stimulus that produced them fades. Those perceptions that we attend to can also continue for some time after the stimulus that produced them has ceased. This produces an experience that Condillac referred to as "reminiscence" (réminiscence). An object continuously acting on our sense organs causes us to now experience a particular perception while we are simultaneously conscious of an echo, as it were, of an identical past perception, produced just a moment ago. Condillac's reasoning is less than explicit at this point, but he seems to have taken this experience to provide us with an awareness of what we might call the "pastness" of the echo, and at the same time of the continued existence of an identical self which experienced both the past perception and the current ones. The idea of self is thus not the product of a Cartesian intellectual intuition. Like the idea of one's own extended body and of other extended things, it is discovered through having a particular kind of sensory experience, in this case, the experience of reminiscence (Essay I.ii.1. §15).

In the Essay, Condillac distinguished between reminiscence, understood as the perception that one is perceiving something that one has perceived before, and memory. Memory is not the process of forming an image of something one has experienced before. Condillac instead described it as the process of forming an idea just of signs or circumstances that have been associated with a previously experienced object. The operation of forming an image of a previously experienced object is not memory but "imagination," or reminiscence, if the imagined object is thought of as one that has been experienced before. (Since signs are not discussed in the Treatise, the distinction between memory and imagination/reminiscence does not appear in that work, and both reminiscence and what the Essay calls vivid imagination are named "memory." However, it is not clear that this is a doctrinal shift as opposed to a mere change of emphasis mandated by the different project of the Treatise.) Imagination becomes possible once a perception has become familiar from a number of previous experiences, which give the mind a facility to repeat that perception at will. The operation of imagination is enhanced if the perception is simple, composed of simple parts that are organized in accord with some guiding principle that can be invoked in reconstructing it, or customarily connected with other, presently occurring perceptions. Since connections with other, customarily connected perceptions need to be noticed, and attention is a function of need, which is in turn established by past experience of pleasure and pain, imagination is ultimately a function of past experience. The same can be said of memory, with the qualification that, insofar as memory involves the recollection of signs, its operation also presupposes the ability to make use of signs (Essay I.ii.2-3, Treatise I.ii).

6. Signs and the "Language of Action"

Like Reid after him, Condillac drew a distinction between three kinds of signs: accidental, natural, and instituted (Essay I.ii.4).

Accidental signs are objects or circumstances that have been frequently encountered in conjunction with an object, so that the occurrence of the former induces the mind to imagine the latter. Though he made a great deal of the significance of his employment of the principle of association when giving summary presentations of his work, one of Condillac's great shortcomings is his treatment of association. He did little more than employ the term. Unlike Hume, he did not distinguish between resemblance, contiguity, and cause and effect, and he offered no detailed analysis of causal association. When compared with Hume's accounts of how association is responsible for our beliefs about matters of chance and probability, our trust in testimony, our reliance on general rules, and our tendencies to allow our reasoning to be influenced by credulity, education, and passion, Condillac's account of association is very impoverished.

Natural signs are the cries and gestures that we instinctively produce upon having particular experiences. Unlike Reid, Condillac insisted that we are not born with a knowledge of the meaning of natural signs; we are only born with the disposition to produce them on certain occasions. We produce them, moreover, without intending to do so and without intending to communicate anything by them. We only discover that they have a certain signification through hearing or seeing ourselves or others produce the sign on characteristic occasions, and so coming to associate the latter with the former. To go in the other direction, and produce the sign in order to induce the thought of some circumstance in others, would be to use the sign as an instituted rather than a natural sign.

The same might be said of accidental signs. To imagine dawn upon hearing the crow of a cock is to be affected by an accidental sign; to imitate the crow of a cock in order to signify dawn is to institute a sign, and is an operation of a higher order.

Reid was later to maintain that the creation of instituted signs presupposes an agreement among a community of speakers, which in turn presupposes language, and this led him to declare that there must be some language that is innately understood rather than established by convention. But Condillac had already explained how an artificial language can be instituted without innately understood signs (Essay II.i.1. §§1-4). Familiarity with the signification of natural signs, which are instinctively produced but not innately understood, will lead one to think of the sign upon witnessing the object that it signifies. For example, having learned to associate the cries that are made by those attacked by a wild animal with those circumstances, I will think of those cries upon seeing a wild animal approach and think of the effect that hearing them has previously had on myself and others. It is then a small, but momentous step to utter those cries in order, first, to signify the approach of a wild animal to others and induce them to flee, and then to signify this particular danger to oneself or others without bothering to imagine an approaching wild animal, as a way of abbreviating the process of thought. With this step, a move is made from being affected by accidental and natural signs we happen to chance upon in the course of experience to employing instituted signs to stand for experiences. The first stage in taking this step is the development of what Condillac called the "language of action," a language composed of cries and gestures culled from natural language. A spoken language of arbitrary sounds and a written language are then gradually invented by users of the language of action (Essay II.i.1. §§5-8).

Since memory just is the imagination of signs, the development of instituted signs makes memory possible (natural and accidental signs are only ever sensed, not remembered). The institution of signs further allows us to set up names for groups of ideas that are too complicated to be distinctively yet collectively imagined, such as ideas of any number larger than six, of substances, of complex modes (notably moral and aesthetic qualities) and of genera and species of things (Essay I.iv). It is also supposed to give us control over our imagination and an ability to govern our attention (Essay I.ii.4. §46). This allows us to reflect on other aspects of our experience than those most immediately related to our needs. Reflection brings connections between objects to our attention that we would not otherwise notice and puts us in a position to refine our language by instituting names for what we have discovered. A more refined language facilitates yet more exact reflection, and language and our reflective capacities proceed to work in tandem to develop our cognitive abilities to their highest level (Essay I.ii.5).

7. Problems with Condillac's Sensationism

7.1 Idealism

In the Essay Condillac not only claimed that sensations are occasioned by the action of external objects on our sense organs, but also that they are images or representations of those objects. More precisely, he claimed that the objects that affect our sense organs must be extended and hence material things, though they may not have the precise shapes or sizes that our senses represent them as having, and though they do not have colours on their surfaces or bear qualities of smell and taste (Essay I.i.2. §§11-12). But if "we never leave ourselves and never perceive anything other than our own thoughts," as Condillac claimed at the outset of the Essay (I.i.1. §1), then what could entitle us to maintain that our sensations bear this degree of resemblance to external objects or that there even is an external world containing objects that occasion our sensations?

In the Essay, Condillac contented himself with replying to this question by claiming that while we have a clear idea what it means to attribute extension to an object, we have no clear idea what it means to say that objects are coloured or scented, and that while there is evidence that proves that we do not always perceive the sizes or shapes of objects correctly, there is no evidence that proves that we are wrong to think that external objects have some form of extension (Essay I.i.2. §§11-13). Neither claim is compelling. Indeed, it is astounding how someone familiar with Descartes's dreaming argument could have made the latter one. But both were asserted without any further elaboration or defence. As Diderot later pointed out in his Letter on the Blind, for Condillac to rest his case against scepticism about the existence of an external world on such facile grounds was to ignore the powerful reasons for denying the existence of material things that had been articulated by Berkeley.

This is not a problem that Condillac rectified in the Treatise. Instead, he attempted to side-step it by focusing just on the question of how experience leads us to form the idea that there are extended, external objects that bear the qualities of colour, taste, and smell exhibited in our sensations, while eschewing any over-confident metaphysical claims about the extent to which this idea may be correct. Indeed, towards close of the Treatise he admitted that the question of whether material things exist is not one that we are in any position to answer. We cannot be sure that objects are extended, shaped, and mobile, yet colourless, odourless, and tasteless. For all we know the objects that cause our sensations may not only be extended and solid, but endowed with qualities that resemble our sensations of smell, taste, and colour. Or they may be not only colourless, odourless, and tasteless but unextended (Treatise IV.v).

However, Condillac had no right to simply-side step the metaphysical question of the nature of body. His account of how touch instructs the eyes to see figures and locations describes the hands as extended objects that move through space and touch various parts of the extended surfaces of the eyes (Treatise III.iii.1-9). One cannot remain agnostic about whether spatially extended objects really exist if one's theory of perception presupposes that one's sense organs are themselves extended and mobile.

7.2 Materialism

Condillac's account of sensation also fit uneasily with his claim that the mind is immaterial. He took sensations to be modifications of the mind's being. He also stipulated that such things as colours and scents are sensations. In the Essay, he specified that there is nothing in bodies that resembles colours or scents and that these qualities are something that belongs to sentient creatures alone (Essay I.i.2. §12). In the Treatise, employing a striking turn of phrase, he claimed that while we might think of a being who possessed only the sense of smell as a being who scents a rose, for itself this being will simply be the smell of a rose. "From its perspective," he wrote, "the odours are nothing other than its own modifications or manners of being" (Treatise I.i.2). The same holds of colours. A being whom we would describe as seeing red would at first experience itself as simply being red. Touch would instruct it to attribute this redness to other objects. But this instruction cannot be known to be correct, whereas there can be no question that the sensation of red is a modification of the being of a sentient creature. Red is not, therefore, what might be called the intentional object of an act of sensing, or if it is, it is so only derivatively; it is primarily a quality of the sentient being, who experiences itself as literally turning red when it has this sensation (Treatise I.xi.8).

The problem with this position becomes clear when it is considered that Condillac also maintained that colours are extended. In the Essay he claimed that were we to have no other sensations than those of light and colour they would "trace (traceront) extension, lines, and figures before our eyes" so that we would find these ideas to be contained in our sensations (Essay I.i.2. §9). Moreover, this discovery is not an effect of learning or association. Extension and shape are original features possessed by visual sensations, discernible simply by attentive reflection. Someone blind since birth and newly made to see would not originally perceive everything before him as if it were a "point" (i.e., an unextended spot of colour), but would experience "light distributed (répandue) in every direction [outwards as well as above, below, to the left and to the right]" (Essay §§12, 14). Condillac continued to retain this view in the Treatise, though with some refinements: Whereas in the Essay he had maintained that colours are extended over all three dimensions, in the Treatise he endorsed the Berkeleyan position that we learn to perceive depth. He also maintained that we do not immediately appreciate that colours are bounded and figured even in two dimensions, but need to learn that they have these features. But he continued to maintain that the colours we originally experience are extended over two dimensions. "Colour presents [offre] extension to the soul that it modifies," he wrote in the Treatise, "because it is itself extended. This is a fact that cannot be brought into doubt. It is demonstrated by observation" (Treatise I.xi.8). Insofar as colours are extended they must have shapes, even if those shapes are not immediately perceived. The process of learning to perceive shape does not transform our colour sensations and lead them to acquire properties they did not previously have; it merely leads us to discover ones that were there all along. This is the point of claiming that not everything that is necessarily involved with a sensation need be perceived by it.

Condillac thus appears to have been committed to four mutually antagonistic propositions:

  1. Colours are extended.
  2. Colours are sensations.
  3. Sensations are modifications of the mind's being.
  4. The mind is unextended.

Hume had confronted the conflict between these propositions by denying (3) and (4). For Hume, our visual impressions are compounds that consist of a number of minimally visible, coloured points that are disposed alongside another in space, but the notion that impressions and ideas inhere in some mental substance is unintelligible, whether this substance is taken to be material or immaterial. Reid, in contrast, had insisted on (3) and (4) but had declared that the term "colour" is used equivocally in (1) and (2). We experience sensations of colour, which are unextended states of feeling experienced by the mind in just the same way as it experiences feelings of pleasure or pain. But colour terminology is most often used to refer to some unknown thing in external objects that causes us to experience these sensations. These external, so-called "coloured" objects are conceived as being extended and figured, but the mind does not become aware of them by contemplating some internal, iconic representation or image. It has a thought that refers to them. Affection of our sense organs does not produce an impression or image; it occasions a thought. The thought itself is unextended, like the mind whose state it is, but it is a thought of or about an object. The object is thought to possess a quality of extension, as well as to be a cause of a certain concomitant sensation of colour. But the thought that this object is extended and a cause of a sensation of colour is itself neither extended nor coloured. So for Reid, either "colours" are powers in extended, external objects to bring about sensations in us, in which case they are not sensations had by the mind, or they are sensations had by the mind, in which case they are not extended.

However, unlike Hume and Reid, Condillac was unwilling to deny or qualify any of (1)-(4). Unlike Hume, he insisted on the existence of an immaterial mind who is the subject of sensations of colour (Essay I.i.1. §6). And unlike Reid, he insisted that colours are unequivocally both modifications of the mind's being and literally extended. These commitments exposed him to charges of tacit materialism. Most notably, the Abbé de Lignac, in the supplements to his Lettres à un Américan (1756), observed that just as Condillac had accused Buffon of supposing that machines have a quality that is essential to spirits, sensibility, so Condillac was liable to the charge of supposing that spirits have a quality that belongs uniquely to machines, three dimensionality.

Condillac's response to this charge, in his "Lettre de M. l'abbé de Condillac à l'auteur des Lettres à un Américan" (1756, and appended to subsequent editions of the Treatise on Animals) was to claim that, "If I say that our sensations give us an idea of extension, it is only because we take them for qualities of objects when we refer them to something external. But I have proven many times that they certainly do not give us this idea when we consider them as a manner of being of our soul." This echoes claims made in the Essay and the Treatise. In the Essay, Condillac claimed that we attribute the extension or shape we find in colours to something outside of us rather than to ourselves considered as thinking subjects (I.i.2. §11), presumably because extension is incompatible with the simplicity that must be ascribed to a thinking being. In almost the same breath, he claimed that we are wrong to imagine that the chromatic quality of colours (as opposed to the extension and shape they map out) actually lies on the surface of external objects, purportedly because we have no clear idea of what it would mean for a body to be coloured (I.i.2. §12). But such claims are hardly adequate to avoid the problem and perhaps not even coherent. Either the chromatic qualities that we experience as modifications of our being are extended or they are not. If they are extended, then the claim that we do not recognize this fact when we think of them as modifications of our own being is merely an evasion. If they are not extended, then if we never experience anything other than our own sensations, as Condillac claimed at the outset of the Essay, it is mysterious how we come to attribute extension to external objects.

In the Treatise, Condillac was no longer willing to declare that objects can be known to be either extended or colourless. He simply claimed that its experiences would lead his "statue" to first conceive of colours as modifications of its own being, then to conceive them as modifications of its extended sense organs, and finally to conceive them as modifications of external objects (Treatise III.3). But this was not to answer the metaphysical problem but rather to ignore it. If colours are in fact extended, as the Treatise continued to insist, yet the mind ultimately only knows its own sensations, however variously they might be transformed by cognitive processing, then we can only come to be in a position to attribute colours to external objects if we first experience those colours, which suggests that they must modify our being.

Though Condillac's official reply to the charge of materialism, as expressed in the letter to Lignac, is something of a disappointment, scholars have occasionally read the Treatise as taking some steps towards a more radical way of dealing with the problem. Recall that in that work Condillac advanced the view that even though colours are in fact extended and bounded, it is not intuitively evident that they are. We need to learn to see their shapes. Interestingly, what teaches us to see these shapes are tactile sensations of solidity and observations of the appearance and disappearance of colours consequent upon moving our hands before our eyes. Since neither sensations of solidity nor the tactile sensations that accompany hand motions not patently extensive in character, and colours themselves might as well not be so far as the early learner is concerned, some scholars have suggested that the Condillac of the Treatise meant to claim that our perceptions of space are constructed from raw data that, as they are at first experienced by the mind, are in no way spatial. Insofar as the Treatise does move towards this more radical view, it can be seen as a precursor of such 19th century Berkeleyan theories of vision as those of Steinbuch, Mill, Helmholtz, and Wundt. However, those later theories invoked notions of local signs (sensations specific to which nerve is being stimulated) and made explicit appeals to kinaesthetic sensations that are simply absent from Condillac's work. Lacking those notions, Condillac claimed that an awareness of space cannot be generated from aspatial sensations, and he represented his statue, not as constructing space, but as discovering the spatial features that were already present in its sensations from the first. Viewing him as a precursor of 19th century Berkeleyanism risks overlooking this fact and, as a consequence, misrepresenting his thought.

7.3 Memory and Liberty

In both the Essay and the Treatise Condillac set out to show that all of our cognitive and conative faculties are generated from sensation and can be derived from that operation alone. To this end he identified perception, consciousness, and attention as all being different aspects of the one operation of sensation. Perception is the impression sensation makes upon the mind, consciousness is this impression considered as something experienced by the mind, and attention is simply a more vivid perception. But when Condillac came to account for memory and reminiscence, this project stalled. It is not implausible to maintain that a sensation might continue to be experienced after the object that occasioned it has ceased to act on the sense organ. But such an "echo" of a past sensation is itself a present phenomenon. It might be fainter than other sensations that are now occurring, but being experienced to be faint is not the same thing as being thought to have originated in the past. Rather than explain how sensation can give rise to an awareness of pastness Condillac simply helped himself to the notion. In the Essay, he defined "reminiscence" as the awareness that a perception has been had "before" without anywhere explaining how the idea that one thing can be "before" another could arise simply from sensation (Essay I.ii.1. §15). In the Treatise he distinguished the memory of a sensation from a current sensation by calling the former "weakly sensing what one was (sentir foiblement ce qu'elle a été)" and the latter "vividly sensing what one is (sentir vivement ce qu'elle est)." But then he immediately went on to say that recalled sensations can sometimes be more vivid than current ones (Treatise I.ii.8-9). So what necessarily distinguishes remembered sensation from current sensation, on this account, is just that remembered sensations are of what "was." But this is not to explain how we could get the idea that a sensation is of what was as opposed to what is.

Similar difficulties arise in connection with the will. In the Essay, Condillac supposed that the imagination is initially outside of our control. Unless driven by need to conceive the means of achieving an end, we imagine what we do only because in the course of experience we sense accidental or natural signs that suggest particular ideas to us. The use of instituted signs is supposed to change this circumstance and give us a new ability to control our thoughts (Essay I.ii.4.§§45-46). But it is not clear why this should be the case (note, in this regard, the apparent contradiction between Essay I.ii.4. §39 and §46). Just because a being has acquired the ability to produce signs in order to induce thought, it does not follow that this ability must be under the subject's voluntary control, and if the production of instituted signs is outside of our control, it is not clear how their use can give us a power to control our thoughts.

The "sensationist" label notwithstanding, there is some suggestion that Condillac may have taken both memory and volition to be primitive functions of the soul that are not in fact reducible to sensation. In the Essay he described our awareness of the temporal sequence of our perceptions as a "fundamental experience (première expérience)" (Essay I.ii.1. §15) and in the Dissertation on Liberty (§§9-10) he seems to have taken freedom of choice and the ability to spontaneously direct attention to be original abilities that the soul has whenever it is not impelled by some pressing need.

These views of memory and will are not necessarily inconsistent with Condillac's sensationism, his repeated claims to derive all the mind's capacities from the operation of sensation notwithstanding. There are stronger and weaker ways of understanding Condillac's sensationism. On the stronger understanding, Condillac meant to say that sensation produces all of the other capacities of the soul. On the weaker understanding, he only meant to say that sensation instructs us in the proper employment of our capacities. The weaker reading is compatible with allowing original, irreducible powers of memory and free choice, provided that we take those powers to be ones that we do not at first know how to effectively direct or employ. The stronger reading attributes an absolutely rigorous empiricism to Condillac -- one that does not admit that the mind is endowed with any innate abilities. It is not clear what Condillac would have had to gain by insisting on such a rigorous empiricism. Locke's rejection of innate ideas and innate principles was bound up with a reaction to unquestioned authority and a demand that all knowledge claims be demonstrable by appeal to common experience. But allowing that we possess innate cognitive capacities and innate conative abilities does not interfere with this demand, particularly if we stress, as the weak reading does, that we need to learn how to employ these capacities and abilities, and that experience serves as our best and only true teacher. The pedagogical and methodological conclusions that Condillac most wanted to draw still follow from that qualification, without having to invoke the strong reading.


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Berkeley, George | color | Helmholtz, Hermann von | Hume, David | Locke, John | perception: the problem of | Reid, Thomas