Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Wed Jan 10, 2001; substantive revision Tue Feb 20, 2007

Constitutionalism is the idea, often associated with the political theories of John Locke and the "founders" of the American republic, that government can and should be legally limited in its powers, and that its authority depends on its observing these limitations. This idea brings with it a host of vexing questions of interest not only to legal scholars, but to anyone keen to explore the legal and philosophical foundations of the state. How can a government be legally limited if law is the creation of government? Does this mean that a government can be "self-limiting," or is there some way of avoiding this implication? If meaningful limitation is to be possible, must constitutional constraints be somehow "entrenched"? Must they be enshrined in written rules? If so, how are they to be interpreted? In terms of literal meaning or the intentions of their authors, or in terms of the, possibly ever-changing, values they express? How one answers these questions depends crucially on how one conceives the nature, identity and authority of constitutions. Does a constitution establish a stable framework for the exercise of public power which is in some way fixed by factors like the original meaning or intentions? Or is it a "living tree" which grows and develops in tandem with changing political values and principles? These and other such questions are explored below.

1. Constitutionalism: a Minimal and a Rich Sense

In some minimal sense of the term, a "constitution" consists of a set of rules or norms creating, structuring and defining the limits of, government power or authority. Understood in this way, all states have constitutions and all states are constitutional states. Anything recognisable as a state must have some acknowledged means of constituting and specifying the limits (or lack thereof) placed upon the three basic forms of government power: legislative power (making new laws), executive power (implementing laws) and judicial power (adjudicating disputes under laws). Take the extreme case of an absolute monarch, Rex, who combines unlimited power in all three domains. If it is widely acknowledged that Rex has these powers, as well as the authority to exercise them at his pleasure, then the constitution of this state could be said to contain only one rule, which grants unlimited power to Rex. He is not legally answerable for the wisdom or morality of his decrees, nor is he bound by procedures, or any other kinds of limitations or requirements, in exercising his powers. Whatever he decrees is constitutionally valid.

When scholars talk of constitutionalism, however, they normally mean something that rules out Rex's case. They mean not only that there are rules creating legislative, executive and judicial powers, but that these rules impose limits on those powers.[1] Often these limitations are in the form of individual or group rights against government, rights to things like free expression, association, equality and due process of law. But constitutional limits come in a variety of forms. They can concern such things as the scope of authority (e.g., in a federal system, provincial or state governments may have authority over health care and education while the federal government's jurisdiction extends to national defence and transportation); the mechanisms used in exercising the relevant power (e.g., procedural requirements governing the form and manner of legislation); and of course civil rights (e.g., in a Charter or Bill of Rights). Constitutionalism in this richer sense of the term is the idea that government can/should be limited in its powers and that its authority depends on its observing these limitations. In this richer sense of the term, Rex's society has not embraced constitutionalism because the rules defining his authority impose no constitutional limits. Compare a second state in which Regina has all the powers possessed by Rex except that she lacks authority to legislate on matters concerning religion. Suppose further that Regina also lacks authority to implement, or to adjudicate on the basis of, any law which exceeds the scope of her legislative competence. We have here the seeds of constitutionalism as that notion has come to be understood in Western legal thought.

In discussing the history and nature of constitutionalism, a comparison is often drawn between Thomas Hobbes and John Locke who are thought to have defended, respectively, the notion of constitutionally unlimited sovereignty (e.g., Rex) versus that of sovereignty limited by the terms of a social contract containing substantive limitations (e.g., Regina).[2] But an equally good focal point is the English legal theorist John Austin who, like Hobbes, thought that the very notion of limited sovereignty is incoherent. For Austin, all law is the command of a sovereign person or body of persons, and so the notion that the sovereign could be limited by law requires a sovereign who is self-binding, who commands him/her/itself. But no one can "command" himself, except in some figurative sense, so the notion of limited sovereignty is, for Austin (and Hobbes), as incoherent as the idea of a square circle.[3] Though this feature of Austin's theory has some surface plausibility when applied to the British Parliamentary system, where Parliament is often said to be "supreme" and constitutionally unlimited,[4] it faces obvious difficulty when applied to most other constitutional democracies such as one finds in the United States and Germany, where it is clear that the powers of government are legally limited by a constitution. Austin's answer was to say that sovereignty may lie with the people, or some other person or body whose authority is unlimited. Government bodies — e.g., Parliament or the judiciary — can be limited by constitutional law, but the sovereign — i.e., "the people" — remains unlimited. Whether this provides Austin with an adequate means of dealing with constitutional democracies is highly questionable. For Austin's sovereign is a determinate individual or group of individuals whose commands to others constitute law. But if we identify the commanders with "the people", then we have the paradoxical result identified by H.L.A. Hart — the commanders are commanding the commanders. In short, we lapse into incoherence (Hart 1994, 73-78; Austin 1995, Lecture VI).

2. Sovereign versus Government

Though there are serious difficulties inherent in Austin's attempt to make sense of "the people's sovereignty," his account does bring out the need to distinguish between two different concepts: sovereignty and government. Roughly speaking, we might define "sovereignty" as the possession of supreme (and possibly unlimited) power and authority over some domain, and "government" as those persons or bodies through whom that sovereignty is exercised. Once some such distinction is drawn, we see immediately that sovereignty might lie somewhere other than with the government. And once this implication is accepted, we can coherently go on to speak of limited government coupled with unlimited sovereignty. Arguably this is what one should say about constitutional democracies where the people's sovereign authority is thought to be unlimited but the government bodies — e.g., the legislature(s) and the courts — through whom that sovereignty is exercised on the people's behalf is constitutionally limited. As Locke held, unlimited sovereignty remains with the people who have the normative power to void the authority of their government (or some part thereof) if it exceeds its constitutional limitations.

Though sovereignty and government are different notions, it does seem possible for them to apply to the same individual or body. It is arguable that Hobbes insisted on the identification of sovereign and government insofar as he seemed to require a (virtually) complete transfer of all rights and powers from sovereign individuals to a political sovereign whose authority was to be absolute, thus rendering it possible to emerge from the wretched state of nature in which life is "solitary, poor, nasty, brutish and short."[5] In Hobbes' theory, supreme sovereignty must reside in the supreme governmental person or body who enjoys unlimited power and authority to rule the commonwealth. Anything less than an unlimited sovereign would, given human nature and the world we inhabit, destroy the very possibility of stable government. So even if "sovereignty" and "government" are different notions, this neither means nor implies that the two could not apply to one and the same individual(s).

3. Entrenchment

According to most theorists, a further important feature of constitutionalism is that the rules imposing limits upon government power must be in some way be entrenched, either by law or by way of "constitutional convention."[6] In other words, those whose powers are constitutionally limited — i.e., the organs of government — must not be legally entitled to change or expunge those limits at their pleasure. Most written constitutions contain amending formulae which can be triggered by, and require the participation of, the government bodies whose powers they limit. But these formulae invariably require something more than a simple decision on the part of the present government to invoke a change. Sometimes constitutional assemblies are required, or super-majority votes, referendums, or the agreement of not only the central government in a federal system but also some number or percentage of the governments or regional units within the federal system. Entrenchment not only facilitates a degree of stability over time (a characteristic aspiration of constitutional regimes), it is arguably a requirement of the very possibility of constitutionally limited government. Were a government entitled, at its pleasure, to change the very terms of its constitutional limitations, it is questionable whether there would, in reality, be any such limitations.

Consider Regina once again. Were she entitled, at her discretion, to remove (and perhaps later reinstate) the constitutional restriction preventing her from legislating on religious matters, then we might ask whether she could sensibly be said to be "bound" by this requirement. On the other hand, were there a constitutional rule or convention specifying that Regina is entitled to remove this restriction only if she succeeds in convincing two thirds of her subjects to vote for the change, then we might meaningfully speak of constitutional limitation. Of course this constitutional meta-rule or convention is itself subject to change or elimination — a fact which raises a host of further puzzles. For example, does such an act require application of the very rule in question — i.e., two third's majority vote — or are "the people," as sovereign, at liberty to change or expunge it at their pleasure? If we accept the distinction between government and sovereignty urged above, as well as the proposition that sovereignty cannot be self-limiting, (X cannot limit X) then we might be led to conclude that the constitutional meta-rule — and hence the constitutional regime of which it is an integral part — both exist at the pleasure of the people. Entrenchment may be an essential element of constitutional regimes, but constitutions cannot be entrenched against the actions of "the sovereign people" at whose pleasure they exist.

4. "Writtenness"

Some scholars believe that constitutional rules do not exist unless they are in some way enshrined in a written document (e.g., Rubenfeld 1998). Others argue that constitutions can be unwritten, and cite, as an obvious example of this possibility, the constitution of the United Kingdom. One must be careful here, however. Though the UK has nothing resembling the American Constitution and its Bill of Rights, it nevertheless contains a number of written instruments which arguably form a central element of its constitution. Magna Carta (1215 A.D.) is perhaps the earliest document of the British constitution, while others include The Petition of Right (1628) and the Bill of Rights (1689). Furthermore, constitutional limits are also said to be found in certain principles of the common law, explicitly cited in landmark cases concerning the limits of government power. The fact remains, however, that Britain seems largely to have an unwritten constitution, suggesting strongly that writtenness is not a defining feature of constitutionalism.

Why would one think that constitutional norms must be written rules, as opposed to more informal conventions or social rules? One possible reason is that unwritten rules are sometimes less precise and therefore more open to "interpretation," gradual change, and ultimately avoidance, than written ones. If this were true, then it would be questionable whether an unwritten rule could, as a practical matter, serve adequately to limit government power. But there is no reason to accept this line of argument. Long standing social rules and conventions are often clear and precise, as well as more rigid and entrenched than written ones, if only because their elimination, alteration or re-interpretation typically requires widespread changes in traditional attitudes, beliefs and behaviour. And these can be very difficult to bring about.

5. Montesquieu and the Separation of Powers

Does the idea of constitutionalism require, as a matter of conceptual or practical necessity, the division of government powers urged by Montesquieu and celebrated by Americans as a bulwark against abuse of state power? In Regina's case, there is no such separation: legislative, executive and judicial power all reside in her person. But how, it might be asked, can she be the one (qua judge) who determines whether her legislation satisfies the prescribed constitutional limitation? Even if, in theory, Regina's constitution prohibits her from removing her constitutional restriction at will (because she must observe the 2/3rds meta-rule) can she not always choose to ignore her restrictions, or to "interpret" them so as to escape their binding force. Perhaps Bishop Hoadly was right when he said (1717) in a sermon before the English King: "Whoever hath an ultimate authority to interpret any written or spoken laws, it is he who is truly the Law-giver to all intents and purposes, and not the person who first wrote or spoke them." (quoted in Gray 1986, p.12). Although some constitutional limits, e.g., one which restricts the Mexican President to a single term of office, seldom raise questions of interpretation, many others are ripe for such questions. Regina might argue that a decree requiring all shops to close on Sundays (the common Sabbath) does not concern a religious matter because its aim is a common day of rest, not religious observance. Others might argue, with seemingly equal plausibility, that it does concern a religious matter and therefore lies outside Regina's legislative competence. That constitutions often raise such interpretive questions gives rise to an important question: Does the possibility of constitutional limitation on supreme legislative (and executive) power require, as a matter of practical politics, that the judicial power by which such limitations are interpreted and enforced reside in some individual or group of individuals distinct from that in which legislative and executive powers are vested? In modern terms, must constitutional limits on a legislative body like Parliament, the Duma or Congress, or an executive body like the President or her Cabinet, be subject to interpretation and enforcement by an independent judiciary?

Marbury v Madison settled this question in the affirmative as a matter of American law, and most nations follow Marbury (and Montesquieu) in accepting the practical necessity of some such arrangement. But it is not clear that the arrangement truly is practically necessary, let alone conceptually so. Bishop Hoadly notwithstanding, there is nothing nonsensical in the suggestion that X might be bound by an entrenched rule, R, whose interpretation and implementation is left to X. This is, arguably, the situation in New Zealand where the courts are forbidden from striking down legislation on the ground that it exceeds constitutional limits. Observance and enforcement of these limits are left to the legislative bodies whose powers are nonetheless recognized as constitutionally limited (and subject to whatever pressures might be imposed politically when state actions are generally believed to violate the constitution). It is important to realize that what rule, R, actually requires is not necessarily identical with what X thinks or says that it requires. This is so even when there is no superior institution with the authority to correct X's judgment when it is, or appears to be, wrong. That constitutional limits can sometimes be interpreted so as to avoid their effect, and no recourse be available to correct mistaken interpretations and abuses of power, does not, then, imply the absence of constitutional limitation. But does it imply the absence of effective limitation? Perhaps so, but even here there is reason to be cautious in drawing general conclusions. Once again, we should remember the long-standing traditions within British Parliamentary systems (including New Zealand's) according to which Parliament alone possesses final authority to create, interpret and implement its own constitutional limits. And whatever its faults, there is little doubt that Parliaments modelled on the British system typically act responsibly in observing their own constitutional limits.

6. Constitutional Law versus Constitutional Convention

The idea of constitutionalism is usually thought to require legal limitation on government power and authority. But according to most constitutional scholars, there is more to a constitution than constitutional law. Many people will find this suggestion puzzling, believing their constitution to be nothing more (and nothing less) than a formal document, possibly adopted at a special constitutional assembly, which contains the nation's supreme law. But there is a long-standing tradition of conceiving of constitutions as containing much more than constitutional law. Dicey is famous for proposing that, in addition to constitutional law, the British constitutional system contains a number of "constitutional conventions" which effectively limit government in the absence of legal limitation. These are, in effect, social rules arising within the practices of the political community and which impose important, but non-legal, limits on government powers. An example of a British constitutional convention is the rule that the Queen may not refuse Royal Assent to any bill passed by both Houses of the UK Parliament. Perhaps another example lies in a convention that individuals chosen to represent the State of Florida in the American Electoral College (the body which actually chooses the American President by majority vote) must vote for the Presidential candidate for whom a plurality of Floridians voted on election night. Owing to the fact that they are political conventions, unenforceable in courts of law, constitutional conventions are said to be distinguishable from constitutional laws, which can indeed be legally enforced. If we accept Dicey's distinction, we must not identify the constitution with constitutional law. It includes constitutional conventions as well. We must further recognize the possibility that a government, though legally within its power to embark upon a particular course of action, might nevertheless be constitutionally prohibited from doing so. It is possible that, as a matter of law, Regina might enjoy unlimited legislative, executive and judicial powers which are nonetheless limited by constitutional conventions specifying how those powers are to be exercised. Should she violate one of these conventions, she would be acting legally, but unconstitutionally, and her subjects might well feel warranted in condemning her actions, perhaps even removing her from office — a puzzling result only if one thinks that all there is to a constitution is constitutional law.

7. Constitutional Interpretation and Constitutional Theories

As we have just seen, there is (often) more to a constitution than constitutional law. As we have also seen, constitutional norms need not always be written rules. Despite these important observations, two facts must be acknowledged: (1) the vast majority of constitutional cases hinge on questions of constitutional law; and (2) modern constitutions are predominantly written documents.[7] Consequently, constitutional cases often raise theoretical issues concerning the proper approach to the interpretation of written instruments — coloured, of course, by the special role of constitutions in defining and limiting the authority and powers of government.

8. The Fixed View and the Living Tree

Although theories of constitutional interpretation are many and varied, they all seem, in one way or another, to ascribe importance to a select number of key factors: textual meaning, political and legal history, intention, and moral/political theory. The roles played by these factors in a theory of constitutional interpretation depend crucially on how the theorist conceives of a constitution and its role in limiting government power. For example, if a theorist views a constitution as foundational law whose existence, meaning and authority derive from the determinate, historical acts of its authors and/or those they represent(ed), and whose principal point is to fix a stable framework or set of ground rules within which legislative, executive and judicial power are to be exercised by the various branches of government, she may be inclined towards an interpretative theory which accords pride of place to factors like authors' intentions, and literal or plain meaning insofar as the latter is considered the best guide to the former. On what we will call the "fixed view" of a constitution, it is natural to think that such factors should govern whenever these are clear and consistent. And the reason is quite straight forward. On the fixed view, a constitution aspires to set a stable framework for the day to day decisions of law and politics which is above, or immune from, the deep disagreements and controversies often encountered in ordinary law and politics. It is the agreed framework within which controversial decisions (e.g., whether there should be laws affirming a woman's right to an abortion or the right of workers to a minimum wage) are to be made. But if the constitution is interpreted in light of controversial moral and political theory, then its whole point is lost: it can no longer serve as the agreed, stable framework within which controversial decisions are made. If, on the other hand, the content of the constitution is determined by the historical acts and intentions of its authors, or by the precise meaning of the words they chose to express the limits they chose to create, then the role of a constitution is secured. It can serve as the stable framework its nature demands. On the fixed view, then, the role of the constitution is much like the analogous role served by the ground rules of a debating society. Each sets the mutually agreed, stable framework within which controversial debate (and action) take place. Just as a debating society could not function if its ground rules were constantly being revised by the debators, a constitution cannot serve its role if its terms are constantly open to revision and reinterpretation by participants in a society's political and legal processes.

But not all theorists believe that the foundational role of a constitution demands that its meaning and interpretation be somehow fixed, or that its interpretation be absolutely immune from considerations of moral and political theory. Some constitutional scholars and judges view a constitution as a "living tree", which by its nature must be allowed to grow and adapt to contemporary circumstances and beliefs about justice. One inclined towards the living tree conception will tend to spurn appeals to strict textual meaning and authors' intentions as attempts to impose the dead hand of the (possibly distant) past upon contemporary society and practice. Government must be limited in power, but our understandings of these limitations should be allowed to evolve and adapt in light of changing circumstances and beliefs about justice. Despite its undoubted appeal to some, the living tree conception faces tough questions: is viewing a constitution as a "living tree", malleable in the hands of contemporary interpreters — particularly judges — consistent with its status as foundational law, and with the entrenchment, stability and protection from unwarranted state power which seem to be crucial, if not essential, aspects of the very idea of constitutionally limited government? Different theories of constitutional interpretation split on how they answer this important question.

9. Textualism: The Meaning of a Constitution's Text

No one denies that the literal meanings of the actual words chosen in drafting a constitution play a key role in determining its impact upon decisions, just as they do in the interpretation of statutes, wills, consent forms, and any other written (and sometimes unwritten) legal instruments. Despite factors such as vagueness, open texture, indeterminacy and the like, the semantic content of a constitutional provision, as a rule or norm intended to convey meaning through the use of words, sets limits to its proper interpretation. As Alice said, words can't just mean whatever one wants them to mean.

Textualism appeals to many, but especially those who accept the fixed view of the constitution, coupled with a belief that a constitution is, principally, one important device through which citizens are protected from unwarranted state power, including unwarranted judicial power. Requiring that judges interpret constitutional provisions in light of the meaning of the constitution's text respects the role of its creators (sometimes, but not always, the founders of the state) in fixing, on behalf of the community, the basic framework of government and the limits within which state power is to be exercised. Political decisions about that proper framework and its constituent limits have, on this theory, already been made in a proper forum by those in whose hands such decisions were rightly placed. Their decisions have been communicated and should not, lest stability and legitimacy be threatened, be subject to continuous revisiting and review, particularly by (typically unelected) judges who lack the authority enjoyed by the constitution's authors. The discovery of textual meaning is (it is thought) a largely factual matter, requiring none of the moral and political reasoning appropriately undertaken by the creators of the constitution. If constitutional change is required, the constitution itself sets procedures through which such changes can be affected. Should these prove ineffective, and yet change still be warranted, then the people, as the sovereign power underlying constitutional democracies, have the authority to abandon the constitution, through revolution, peaceful or not, and to substitute something else. But so long as the constitution remains in force, the semantic content of its rules must be taken as governing all matters of constitutional law.

Despite its obvious appeal, Textualism — or as it is sometimes called, "strict constuctionism" — faces a number of difficulties. First, semantic content is not always fully determinate or stable from one generation to the next. This is especially true of words and phrases like "equality," "due process of law," "fundamental justice," "free and democratic society," "freedom of religion" and so on. These seem to lack the determinate and relatively stable semantic content of phrases like "five year term" or "two-thirds majority." The evaluative concepts expressed by the former are highly contestable politically, perhaps even "essentially contestable," and their understanding tends to vary from one generation to the next. They cannot therefore serve the role suggested by the fixed view.

Textualism faces a further difficulty. Even when the meaning of a word or phrase used in a constitution is constant and plain for all to see, it is not always the case that it is considered dispositive. For example, taken in terms of both its original and (perhaps different) contemporary meaning, the First Amendment of the American Constitution is clearly violated by a whole host of American laws, e.g., those proscribing incitement, perjury and libel. Taken literally the First Amendment renders unconstitutional any law which in any way restricts freedom of speech. If so, then it is unconstitutional in the United States to punish untruthful witnesses, prevent primary school teachers from uttering vicious racial slurs against their minority students, or convict those who incite crowds to violence. But such state actions have never been understood to violate the First amendment, leading to the inevitable conclusion that more than semantic meaning governs its interpretation and application. And this is generally, if not universally, true of modern states and their constitutions. But if more than meaning governs, what else counts? The most obvious choice, especially for those attracted to the fixed view, are the "intentions" of the framers. In response to the suggestion that the American First Amendment prohibits laws against perjury, a defender of the fixed view is likely to reply: "But that can't possibly be what the framers had in mind — what they intended — in choosing the words they did." This leads us to a second type of interpretive theory, Originalism, which focusses, not on word meaning, but on the intentions of those by whose actions the constitution's various provisions came into existence.

10. Originalism

An Originalist might claim that Textualism is partially correct but doesn't go far enough. The original intentions of a constitution's authors are what really count; and the reason that textual meaning is so important is that it's often the most reliable guide to those intentions. The drafters of a constitution may be presumed to have known and had in mind the standard applications of the words they used, and to have intended the results suggested by those applications, together with the goals and values those applications were best suited to achieve. But when textual meaning fails, direct appeal to the relevant intentions is necessary. In both kinds of cases, however, the ultimate aim is to respect original intentions.

Whatever its precise contours, an Originalist theory is, like Textualism, likely to rest on the fixed view of a constitution. To be sure, the constitution's rules are fixed by the authors' intentions in deciding as they did, and not by the semantic content of the words chosen to communicate those intentions. But they are fixed nonetheless, and must, as a result, not be revisited and revised lest the authority and stability of the constitution be threatened. The intentions of those by whose authority a constitution is made must always govern its interpretation, not the new value judgments and decisions of contemporary judges (or any other interpreters) asking the very same questions the founders intentions were supposed to have settled.

Originalism faces a number of difficulties, some shared with Textualism. For example, original intentions are often unclear, if not completely indeterminate, leaving the interpreter with the need to appeal to other factors. The original intentions of the authors of a constitution can vary from one person to the next. Sometimes the only things upon which joint authors of a text can agree are the words chosen. The intentions behind that choice can, however, vary significantly. These can range, for example, from the very general to the highly specific. At one end of the spectrum are the various, and sometimes conflicting goals and values the authors of a provision intended their creation to achieve. At the other end are the very specific applications the authors might have had in mind when they chose the particular words upon which they settled. Did the intended applications of an equality provision encompass equal access to the legal system by all groups within society? Or only something more specific like equal access to fairness at trial? Did they perhaps include equal economic and social opportunities for all groups within society? Different authors might have "intended" all, none, or some of these applications when they agreed upon the equality provision. And as with the general goals and values underlying a provision, there is room for inconsistency and conflict. Constitutional authors, no less than legislators, union activists, or the members of a church synod, can have different goals and applications in mind and yet settle on the same set of words. In light of this fact, it is often unhelpful to rely on original intentions when interpreting a constitution.

11. Hypothetical Intent Theory

One of the most serious difficulties faced by Originalism is that contemporary life is often very different from the life contemplated by the authors of a constitution. As a result, many intended applications may now seem absurd or highly undesirable in light of new scientific and social developments and improved moral understanding. Modern life includes countless situations which the authors of a constitution could not possibly have contemplated, let alone intended to be dealt with in any particular way. The right to free speech which found its way into many constitutions in the early modern period, could not possibly have been intended by its defenders to encompass, e.g., pornography on the internet. In response to such difficulties, an Originalist might appeal to what we can call "hypothetical intent." The basic idea is that we should always consider, in such instances, the hypothetical question of what the original authors would have intended to be done in the case at hand had they known what we now know to be true. We are, on this view, to put ourselves imaginatively in the authors' shoes, and determine, in light of their intended goals and values, and possibly by way of analogy with their intended applications, what they would have wanted to be done in the new circumstances.

The Hypothetical Intent Theory faces difficulties too. First, the theory presupposes that we can single out one, consistent set of values, goals and applications attributable to the authors, in terms of which we are to ask the question: What would they have wanted to have done given these (intended) values, goals and applications? But as we have already seen, the authors of a constitution invariably have different things in mind when they agree on a constitutional text. Second, even if we could single out, at some appropriate level of generality, a set of goals, values and applications from which our hypothetical inquiry is to proceed, it is unlikely that there will always be a uniquely correct answer to the question of what the authors would have intended in these cases which they did not anticipate and could not possibly have imagined. What would an 18th century founder, firmly in favour of freedom of speech, have thought about child pornography on the internet? Thirdly, and perhaps most importantly, we are left with the question of why it much matters what a long dead group of individuals might have wanted done were they apprised of what we now know. The main appeal of the original intent theory is that it appears to tie constitutional interpretation to historical decisions actually made by individuals with authority to decide questions concerning the proper limits of government power. If we are now to consider, not what they did decide, but what they might have decided had they known what we now know, then the question naturally arises: Why not just forget this theoretically suspect, hypothetical exercise and make the decisions ourselves? There is some plausibility in the claim that the decision should be made in light of the very general goals and values probably intended by the authors — if, that is, one could discover what these were and if they could all be rendered consistent. But why should we wish to perpetuate their possibly misguided views about the appropriate ways in which to secure these goals and values? Unless we reject completely the idea that there might be moral progress, or the idea that any such progress must always be dismissed for the sake of a fixedness allegedly guaranteed by adherence to authors' intent, there seems little reason to believe that we should be so tied. To think otherwise might well be to allow the dead hand of the past to govern the affairs of today.

True enough, it might be replied. But the alternative is one which undermines the very point of constitutions. If we view a constitution as a living tree whose limitations are constantly open to revisiting and revision in light of changing times and (one hopes) improved moral/political understanding, then it can no longer function as a stable instrument whose very point and purpose is to limit the power of government — particularly, though not exclusively, arbitrary judicial power. Arguments of political morality may be necessary to frame a constitution, but if judges and other contemporary interpreters are allowed to construe it in light of how they choose to understand those limits, then the possibility of limitation vanishes. But does it? One theorist who thinks not is Ronald Dworkin, whose theory of constitutional interpretation attempts to do justice to both these points of view.

12. Dworkin: Moral Theory

For Dworkin, historical factors like semantic meaning and intention, though always important, are in no way dispositive. They in no way fix the limits of government power until such time as an amendment passes or a revolution occurs. On the contrary, constitutions frame the terms of an ongoing political debate about the moral principles of justice, fairness and due process underlying a nation's constitutional limits on government power. And as the political community's understanding of these principles develops and (it is hoped) improves, the very content of the constitution develops and improves along with it.

A crucial element in Dworkin's constitutional theory is his general claim that the law of a community includes more than any explicit rules and decisions authoritatively adopted in accordance with accepted procedures. It does, of course, include many such rules and decisions and these can be found, paradigmatically, in statute books, judicial decisions and, of course, written constitutions. These are often termed "positive law." But the positive law in no way exhausts the law according to Dworkin. Most importantly, for our purposes, it in no way exhausts that part of law we call "the constitution." In Dworkin's view, a constitution includes the principles of political morality which provide the best explanation and moral justification — i.e., the best interpretation — of whatever limits have been expressed in positive law. Hence, constitutional interpretation must always invoke a theory of political morality. One concerned to interpret the limits upon government power and authority imposed by a constitution must look to an interpretive theory which provides the positive constitutional law with its morally best explanation and justification.

The development of an interpretive theory of the constitution is, Dworkin acknowledges, an extremely difficult task, and people of good will and integrity will reasonably disagree about which theory is best. There is no mechanical, morally neutral test to apply, only the competing interpretations of those whose task it is to interpret. This does not mean, however, that attempting to evaluate theories is foolish, or that there really is no such thing as a best theory since there is no mechanical way of discovering it. The presence of disagreement, controversy, and uncertainty in constitutional cases, does not entail that there are no right answers to the questions posed, and no uniquely correct theory which determines what those answers are and hence what the constitution actually requires. The presence of such factors entails only that interpreters must, as they must do in all interpretive enterprises, including the arts, the sciences, and the law, exercise judgment in fashioning their interpretive theories. Dworkin goes so far as to argue that in a mature legal system there almost always is a best constitutional theory, and judges (and legislators) are duty-bound to try their best to discern and implement its requirements in making their decisions.

There are, for our purposes, three important implications of Dworkin's theory of constitutional interpretation. First, original intentions and semantic meaning at best set the stage for the ongoing debates of political morality which constitutional cases both require and licence. They seldom, if ever, settle matters. Second, constitutional cases require the kind of decision-making which is, on the Originalist and Textualist theories, properly undertaken only by those who have already fixed the constitutional limits contained within the constitution — i.e., its authors or framers. The kind of morally and politically uncontroversial decision-making, within a stable framework established by other responsible agents, to which the Originalist and Textualist theories aspire, is simply impossible on Dworkin's theory. Dworkin's theory requires wholesale rejection of the fixed view. The constitution is not a finished product handed down in a form fixed till such time as its amending formula is invoked successfully or a revolution occurs. Rather it is a work in progress requiring continual revisiting and reworking as our moral and political theories concerning its limits are refined and improved. It is, in short, a living tree.

A third, related implication of Dworkin's theory is that judges in constitutional cases are not merely agents of the authors of a constitution whose role is simply to carrying out the political decisions already made by the authors. On the contrary, they are partners with the authors in an ongoing political project, one which requires participants, both then and now, to engage in the kind of moral/political decision-making which, on the fixed view, settled matters when the constitution was first adopted (and/or amended). The limits to government power are, on Dworkin's theory, essentially contestable, ad infinitum. If there is a correct theory of a constitution, it requires, for its development and elaboration, an interpreter of super-human powers of moral, political and legal reasoning. In short, it requires Dworkin's ideal judge Hercules.[8] But Hercules is a product of Dworkin's imagination, and so the project of interpreting the contestable terms of a constitution is an ongoing one, requiring each and every interpreter to provide her own best, and undoubtedly imperfect, interpretation of the limits placed upon government by her constitution. The latter is never fixed.

13. Critical Theory

That it requires the skill, acumen and insight of a Hercules is seen by many theorists as a serious drawback of Dworkin's approach to constitutional interpretation. If ordinary judges, with their limited skill, integrity and objectivity are at liberty to interpret constitutional limits in light of their own, highly contestable moral theories of the constitution, then the inevitable result is a kind of unbridled judicial activism which threatens both the stability and the legitimacy of the constitution and the limits on government power which it is supposed to represent. Instead of limitations appropriately fixed and settled by, morally and politically uncontroversial factors like historical intentions and plain meaning, we would have "limitations" continually in flux and subject to different interpretations by different judges with their own theories of political morality. Those of an originalist or texualist bent will see in such consequences sufficient reason to reject Dworkin's theory in favour of their alternative. But for many constitutional scholars, originalism and textualism are no less problematic than Dworkin's interpretive theory. For some of these "critical theorists," semantic meaning, historical intentions, and herculean interpretive theory, all fail, in one way or the other, to fix meaningful limits upon government power.[9] As a result, reliance on such factors in constitutional adjudication only serve: (a) to rationalize the purely political decisions of judges pursuing, consciously or not, their own political ideologies. Further consequences include (b) a serious affront to democracy: a small cadre of unelected, elitist judges end up substituting their own, highly contentious views about the proper limits of government power for the considered judgments of the people's respresentatives, i.e., those members of Congress or Parliament duly elected to exercise, on behalf of the people, the latter's sovereign right to participate in political decisions affecting their rights (Waldron); and possibly (c) suppression of those — women, minority racial groups, the poor, and so on — whose interests are not adequately recognized and protected by the dominant, mainstream ideologies to which judges have an affinity. Instead of the curbing of arbitrary government power for which the idea of constitutionalism is supposed to stand, we have political suppression disguised in a cloak of false constitutional legitimacy.

So critical theorists are highly skeptical of constitutional practice and theories which applaud constitutionalism as a bulwark against oppression.[10] As we saw at the outset, a key element in the idea of constitutionalism is that government can/should be limited in its powers and that its authority depends on observance of those limits. We further noted that the authority of constitutions in liberal democracies is generally thought to lie in "the people." One further implication of some critical theories is: (d) that the concept of "the people" is as much a fabrication as is Dworkin's Hercules. Instead of "we the people", western societies are comprised of various groups competing either for domination (e.g., white males and the wealthy) or for recognition and the elimination of oppression (e.g., the poor, women, and racial minorities). The law, including constitutional law, is a powerful tool which has, historically, been utilized by dominant groups to secure and maintain their superior status. As such, a constitution is anything but the protection from unwarranted power that its champions have heralded over the centuries. What is taken to be the plain meaning of the word "equality" is what the dominant group understands it to be. What is taken to be the obvious historical intentions of the framers is whatever intentions fit the ideologies of the dominant groups. What is taken to be the best moral theory underlying the constitution is nothing more than a rationalization of current social structures, all of which systematically oppress the interests of women, minorities and the poor.

Critical theories represent a serious challenge not only to conventional theories and established practices of constitutional interpretation, but to the very idea of constitutionalism itself — the idea that government can and should be limited in ways which serve to protect us from unwarranted state power. According to originalists and textualists, the constitution protects us from judges and other officials by restricting them to politically uncontroversial, neutral decisions about historical intentions and semantic meanings. According to Dworkin, it is Hercules' best moral theory of the constitution which serves as the bulwark against oppression. One crucial feature of Hercules' theory is that it is often at odds with received opinion, in particular with the self-serving convictions and prejudices of the various dominant groups within society. Following Hercules' moral theory of the constitution will, Dworkin believes, lead a judge to protect the rights of oppressed groups from the power of dominant groups, especially when that power has the sanction of legislation. But the ordinary judge is not, critical theorists will insist, identical with Hercules. On the contrary, he is an ordinary, flawed human being with all the intellectual and moral shortcomings, weaknesses and biases of his fellow humans. He is also, more often than not, a member of a dominant group (e.g., wealthy, white males) who shares the social background, education, perspective, and values of that group. As a result, his conceptions of the relevant contested concepts (e.g., equality or freedom of expression) will be their conceptions — i.e., conceptions which serve the interests of the dominant groups against whom the constitution is (at least largely) meant to serve as protection. But if semantic meaning, intentions and Hercules' best theory are all at the mercy of dominant ideologies and the whims and convictions of judges, then the kind of protections heralded by the idea of constitutionalism may be a myth, and a harmful one at that. So what is the solution according to critical theorists? The proffered solutions vary considerably from one critical theorist to the next, depending on how radical or skeptical the theorist tends to be. A revolutionary communist might advocate the complete overthrow of constitutional, democratic government, while many liberal feminists are content to work within existing constitutional systems to eradicate the vestiges of patriarchy which have survived recent feminist movements (Strossen 1995). Waldron agues that we should abandon the practice of judicial review of legislation under constitutional bills of rights and leave political decisions where they belong: the people and their representatives, i.e., legislative bodies like Parliament and Congress. But whatever the preferred solution, all critics of constitutionalism seem to agree that progress can be made only if the myths surrounding constitutional protection — the constraining force of meaning, intention, and objectively true moral theory — are all exposed, and that the true political forces at work in constitutional practice are acknowledged and dealt with openly. Whether the idea of constitutionalism can survive the lessons of critical theory is a very good question.


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