Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy

Notes to Nonconceptual Mental Content

1. Although this has been disputed. See section 3 below.

2. This may not follow if nonconceptual content is understood along the lines of the “state” view of the nonconcepual debate. For more on the “state” view, see section 3.

3. See, e.g., Stalnaker (1984). It has been argued that possible worlds semantics is too coarse-grained an account of content to be sensitive to the way that the thinker apprehends the world. (More on this in section 5. See also the entries on belief, propositional attitude reports, and structured propositions.)

4. This assumption is explicitly rejected by some psychologists and philosophers who take concepts to be mental particulars that have content (see, e.g., Fodor 1975, 1987, 1998. For more on various accounts of concepts, see the entry on concepts). In the following we will leave this alternative account of concepts to the side while noting those occasions in which it is particularly relevant to the discussion.

5. For further discussion of this distinction see Heck 2007, Byrne 2003, 2005. Other authors use different terminology. Speaks (2005) distinguishes between absolute nonconceptualism, whereby the mental state has a different type of content from that involved in belief, and relative nonconceptualism, whereby the content of the state involves contents not grasped by the subject undergoing the state. Crowther (2006) makes a distinction between compositional nonconceptualism, whereby the content of the state is not composed of concepts, and possessional nonconceptualism, whereby undergoing the state in question does not require possession of concepts characterizing the content of the state. See also Laurier (2004) for yet another set of similar distinctions.

6. This claim is true of those holding to a “content” view of the nonconceptual debate. However, if one is persuaded by the “state” view of the nonconceptual debate, then it is possible to hold that the content of perception is exhausted by the propositional contents of the perceptual beliefs perception would give rise to, though having the perception does not depend on the organism's conceptual capacities (i.e., perception is a concept-independent state). See section 3 for discussion of the state/content distinction.

7. Chuard (2007) warns against the inference from analog representation to nonconceptual content, suggesting that the analog/digital distinction might mark a distinction between two types of conceptual content or a distinction between vehicles, rather than between different types of content.

8. Following several objections (Peacocke 1998) regarding the general concepts involved in demonstrative concepts expressible by such phrases as 'that shade', McDowell revised his account of the demonstrative concepts involved in the contents of perception to be of the form …is shaped thus, or …is colored thus (McDowell 1998). Similar, and further, misgivings about the possibility of demonstrative concepts with such general terms are found in, for example, Kelly 2001a, Peacocke 2001a, Tye 2006, and Wright 2003.