Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Propositional Attitude Reports

First published Wed Feb 16, 2000; substantive revision Mon Dec 19, 2005

Propositional attitude reports concern the cognitive relations people bear to propositions. We typically make such reports by uttering propositional attitude reporting sentences like ‘Jill believes that Jack broke his crown’. Such sentences typically contain a propositional attitude verb like ‘believes, ‘hopes’, and ‘knows’, followed by a clause that includes a full sentence expressing a proposition (a that-clause). Attributions of cognitive relations to propositions can also take other forms. For example, ‘Jack believes what Jill said’ and ‘Jack believes everything Jill believes’ are both propositional attitude ascriptions. Some also claim that ‘Jill wanted Jack to fall’, ‘Jack and Jill are seeking water’, and ‘Jack fears Jill’, for example, are to be analyzed as propositional attitude ascribing sentences, the first saying, perhaps, something to the effect that Jills wants that Jack falls, the second that Jack and Jill strive that they find water, and the third that Jack fears that Jill will hurt him. But such analyses are controversial. (See the entry on intensional transitive verbs.)

In this discussion, we will examine attempts to deal with a puzzle about propositional attitude reporting sentences that was first posed by Gottlob Frege in his 1892. Subsequent literature has been concerned with developing a semantic theory that deals satisfactorily with this puzzle. We will explore some of these theories and note some of the problems they face.

Having a successful theory of propositional attitude reports is important, as they serve as a converging point for a number of different fields, from philosophy of language and philosophy of mind to metaphysics and epistemology.

1. Frege's Puzzle

Powerful considerations developed by Gottlob Frege in his 1892 suggest that words within the scope of a propositional attitude verb cannot function as they ordinarily do. Frege presents his puzzle as one about the relationship between the cognitive value of expressions and their ordinary reference, arguing that the two must be distinct.

Frege's puzzle can be posed as a question about propositional attitude attributions. (We will use the verb ‘believe’ in the discussion of these puzzles. Similar puzzles arise with other propositional attitude verbs.) Consider, for example, Lois Lane before her discovery of Superman's “true identity.” (Treat the Superman stories as actual fact.) Lois is familiar with Clark Kent, her fellow employee, and Superman, the hero she most admires, but she does not, we might be tempted to say, recognize that the person she calls ‘Clark Kent’ is identical with the person she calls ‘Superman’. (This doesn't really do justice to what Lois fails to realize and there are problems specifying what Lois is ignorant of. See the supplementary document:

Ignorance of Identities

In the text we'll simply skip over this complication.) We would ordinarily accept the following.

(1) Lois believes that Superman is strong.

(2) Lois believes that Clark Kent is not strong.

(3) Lois does not believe that Clark Kent is strong.

When we compare (1) with (2) and (3), it seems apparent that the names ‘Superman’ and ‘Clark Kent’ make different semantic contributions to the sentences in which they occur. In particular, it appears that replacing ‘Superman’ in (1) with the co-referring ‘Clark Kent’ changes the true (1) to the false (4).

(4) Lois believes that Clark Kent is strong.

Since ‘Clark Kent’ and ‘Superman’ have the same reference, it seems that something other than the reference of the name must be relevant to the semantic evaluation of the belief attribution.

Without propositional attitude attributions, one might hope for a simpler semantics, in which only the referent of a name is relevant to the evaluation of sentences that contain it. For consider the following pair of sentences.

(5) Superman is strong.

(6) Clark Kent is strong.

(5) is true iff (6) is true. Indeed, it is plausible to insist further that the two sentences have the same modal profile. Even if Lois and others do not realize it, these sentences, given their meanings, must have the same truth-value. So their objective semantics can be the same: each involves a reference to the same individual and each predicates the same property to that individual.

However, if we expect semantics to account for the difference in cognitive value of (5) and (6) (Lois accepts one but not the other, and they play different roles in her reasoning), we must recognize a semantic difference in the contribution of the two names.

We can get to the same conclusion by a different route. The trip, although somewhat lengthy, is worth taking. Lois is disposed to sincerely, reflectively, and competently accept (5) while denying (6). Lois is, presumably, also disposed to accept the following sentence.

(7) Clark Kent is not strong.

It is plausible to link an agent's sincere, reflective, and competent acceptances of sentences with what she believes. The disquotation principle, so-called by Kripke in his 1979, does just that. (Our formulation of the principle differs from Kripke's.)

If an agent A sincerely, reflectively, and competently accepts a sentence s (under circumstances properly related to a context c), then A believes, at the time of c, what s expresses in c.

(Why relativize to context and time? Suppose an agent accepts ‘I am hungry’ at t. It should not follow from this that she believes what is expressed by ‘I am hungry’ as uttered by you — unless you happen to be the agent in question. It also shouldn't follow that she persists through all time to believe what she believes; she is free to change her mind on the matter.)

Given disquotation, Lois's assent to (5) and (7) entails that (1) and (2) are true. Now, as deplorable as Lois's cognitive state is, it seems wrong to convict her of irrationality; she does not, it would appear, believe a contradiction “in the sense in which thoughtful people do not do it.” (The phrase comes from Perry 1977.) But then it would seem that ‘Clark Kent’ must not be substitutible for ‘Superman’ in (1), or she will be so convicted. If the substitution of ‘Clark Kent’ for ‘Superman’ in (1) did preserve truth, as it does in (5), then the truth of (1) (and the fact that ‘Clark Kent’ and ‘Superman’ are co-designating) would entail (4). But if both (2) and (4) are true, then, it would appear, Lois believes a proposition and its negation and would thus be guilty of irrationality. Intuitively, however, she is not irrational. So, ‘Superman’ in (1) is not substitutable for ‘Clark Kent’.

If it seems reasonable to infer agents's beliefs from their acceptance patterns, thus leading us to disquotation, it may seem equally plausible to infer what agents do not believe from what they do not accept, leading us to converse disquotation below.

Converse disquotation.
If an agent A sincerely, reflectively, and competently denies (or even withholds acceptance from) a sentence s (in a context c), then A does not believe, at the time of c, what s expresses in c.

Converse disquotation, together with the fact that Lois denies (6), entail that (3) is true. But if both (1) and (3) are true, then, it would seem, we should not allow substitution of co-designating singular terms within the scope of propositional attitude verb, or the threat of contradiction we saw above will be brought home to us, the ascriber. For substitution of ‘Clark Kent’ for ‘Superman’ in (1) would commit us to (4), which seems to contradict (3).

Using disquotation and converse disquotation (together with intuitively plausible acceptance patterns on the part of Lois, considerations of Lois's rationality, and intuitive considerations of what rationality consists in) commit us to the truth of (1)-(3) and the falsity of (4), and thus, it would seem, to a denial of a substitution principle for co-designating singular terms within the scope of propositional attitude verbs. If both (1) and (3) are true, then, one would think, (1) and (4) better say different things. This in turn seems to commit us to the claim that ‘Clark Kent’ and ‘Superman’ have different semantically relevant values as they occur in (1) and (2). (In distinguishing these two arguments we follow Kripke 1979.)

In summary, Frege calls our attention to two problems, (i) the problem of the apparent difference in truth-value of corresponding belief attributions (such as (1) and (4)), and (ii) the problem of the difference in the cognitive significance of sentences composed in the same way of elements with the same reference (such as (5) and (6)). If distinct belief attributions indicate differences in cognitive value of the sentences in their that -clauses, then these two problems are really a single problem, presumably with a single solution.

[For further discussion of these problems, see the subsection on Frege's Puzzles in the entry on Gottlob Frege.]

2. Frege's theory

Frege held that correct propositional attitude attributions must indicate the way that individuals are represented by the agent (the agent's mode of presentation of the referent) and that an occurrence of a referential expression within the scope of a propositional attitude verb refers to a way of representing an object rather than to the expression's ordinary referent. ‘Superman’ and ‘Clark’ as they occur in (1) and (4) refer to two different ways that Lois has of representing the man Superman. According to Frege, this difference in reference explains the difference in truth-value of (1) and (4). The ordinary sense of an expression — the way that the expression indicates its referent — becomes a part of the truth-conditions for a sentence in which the expression occurs, if that expression is used within a belief context.

On the face of it, these are two different theories about terms in the scope of propositional attitude verbs — that they refer to the agent's way of representing the object and that they refer to the ordinary sense. Frege unifies these theses by maintaining that the ordinary sense is a way of representing an object. Thus he can explain why the truth-value of the sentence as a whole can vary in (1) and (4), even though the constituents of the sentences ordinarily make the same contribution to the truth-values of sentences. Propositional attitude verbs induce a shift in reference; occurrences expressions within their scope refer to what Frege called their customary sense. Within the scope of an attitude verb expressions refer to what they express when outside the scope of an attitude verb. So, although ‘Superman’ and ‘Clark’ co-refer outside the scope of a propositional attitude verb (so, as they appear in (5) and (6), for example), they do not co-refer when inside the scope of a propositional attitude verb.

It is worth noting that Frege's claim that propositional attitude verbs induce a reference shift allows him to preserve a substitution principle. The fact that, for example, (1) is true while (4) is false does not show that substituting co-referring singular terms within the scope of attitude verbs is illegitimate; instead, for Frege, it shows that ‘Superman’ and ‘Clark’, as they occur in (1) and (4), are not co-referring.

This difference in sense also explains the difference in cognitive value of sentences (5) and (6). Although both sentences must have the same truth-value, because the constituents are co-referential, they have different senses, because the names ‘Clark Kent’ and ‘Superman’ have different senses, according to Frege. Although the truth-value depends on the referents of terms, the cognitive value depends on the sense attached to the terms involved in a sentence.

[For further discussion of Frege's theory, see the subsection on Frege's Theory of Sense and Denotation in the entry on Gottlob Frege.]

So, Frege's accounts of the two problems he calls our attention to coincide. (1) and (4) differ in truth-value precisely because (5) and (6) express different propositions. The view is attractive — some would say wonderful. If only it were true.

3. Problems for the simple Fregean solution

Frege's solution to Frege's puzzle has been criticized on several fronts. Some accuse it for violating semantic innocence. Davidson 1968 is the locus classicus of this complaint; Barwise and Perry 1983 develop the charge. Proponents of semantic innocence see an expression as having the same reference in a wide body of linguistic environments. In particular, ‘Superman’ is seen as having the same reference in (1) as it does in (5).

Sometimes semantic innocence is just taken as a piece of raw datum, directly intuited perhaps. But one might also substantiate the claim by considering anaphora across attitude verbs. (For more, see the entry on anaphora.) Consider the following.

(8) Jack and Jill went up the hill and Jack believes that she went up first.

There is a reading of (8) where, ‘she’, as it occurs in (8), is anaphoric on ‘Jill’; that is, ‘she’ gets its reference from the reference of ‘Jill’. But ‘Jill’, as it occurs in (8), is outside the scope of a propositional attitude verb and hence has its customary reference. But then, it would seem, ‘she’ must also have the customary reference of ‘Jill’ and hence must refer to an individual and not a sense. This runs contrary to Frege's reference-shift claim. More generally, Frege's theory seems to have trouble accounting for the truth of sentences like (8), as ‘she’ (for example) seems to simply pick out Jill herself independently of any mode of presentation. Soames 1989 presents a similar argument against the Fregean solution, although he does not use it to argue for semantic innocence directly. The point is related to the more general worry whether or not Fregean accounts can make se of de re belief. (See the supplementary document on

The De Re/De Dicto Distinction

for further discussion.)

The Fregean should not be terribly perturbed by these considerations. First, even if we find innocence a virtue, the key insights behind Frege's solution survive excising the sin of reference-shifting. And it is reference-shifting, not the sense/reference distinction itself, that innocence forbids. Frege's key insights are that singular terms have both a sense and a reference, that co-referring singular terms can have different senses, and that propositional attitude verbs are sensitive to the (customary) senses of the expressions embedded in their scope and not merely their (customary) referents. Frege pulled off the last insight by claiming that propositional attitude verbs induce a reference-shift. But there are other ways to get the same result. One might, for example, claim that ‘believes’ functions somewhat like ‘so-called’ in (9) below.

(9) Giorgione was so-called because of his size.

(The example is from Quine 1953.) ‘Giorgione’, as it occurs in (9), simply refers to the man Giorgione. But substitution is illegitimate because ‘so-called’ refers to the expression preceding it and not merely the referent of that expression. So, substitution fails but not because the substitution affects the reference of the terms substituted — ‘Giorgione’ with ‘Barbarelli’ in our case — but rather the reference of some other piece of the sentence — namely, the reference of ‘so’ in ‘so-called’. (This differs from Quine's own explanation of why substitution fails in (9).)

Similarly, a neo-Fregean might claim that expressions have their customary references and senses whether inside or outside the scope of a propositional attitude verb, thus ensuring semantic innocence, but insist that the propositional attitude verbs themselves are in some way sensitive to the senses of the expressions within their scope and not merely their references. Then substitution of co-referring singular terms within the scope of an attitude verb is blocked, as such substitution affects the semantic value of the attitude verb itself, but innocence preserved. (See Forbes 1989, 1990, 1993 for development of a similar idea. Pietroski 1996 argues for a Fregean account that respects innocence as well, although his account, unlike Forbes's, is developed in the Davidsonian framework.)

Furthermore, it is far from clear that violating semantic innocence is all that troubling. It hardly seems a piece of raw datum that an occurrence of a proper name in the scope of an attitude verb has the same reference as an occurrence of that name outside the scope of that attitude verb. This is pretty theoretical stuff to have raw intuitions about. And the problem of anaphora does little to motivate that claim. In his 1969 Kaplan taught us how we can be Fregeans and allow quantifying into attitude verbs. (See the supplementary document on the de re/de dicto distinction, op cit., for the details.) The key idea was to introduce a relation between an individual-concept and the object it determines; Kaplan, following Church 1951, called this D, which is a “denotation predicate.” The same technique can be used to account for the anaphoric dependence of a pronoun inside the scope of an attitude verb on a singular term outside the scope of that verb. A sentence like (8) would then be read as something like: “Jack and Jill went up the hill and (there is an individual-concept c that “designates” Jill such that) Jack stands in the belief relation to the proposition consisting of c and the semantic value of ‘went up first’.” There may well be problems with this account. But its mere presence shows two things. First, one needs an argument for the claim that a proper treatment of cross-attitudinal anaphoric relations is possible only if semantic innocence is accepted. And that argument will have to show what is wrong with a view like the one suggested by Kaplan, as that view promises to show how a reference-shifting view can accommodate the phenomena. Second, and relatedly, one cannot refute the Fregean claim that proper names have both a sense and a reference and that propositional attitude ascriptions are sensitive to sense and not just reference simply by producing sentences like (8).

The simple Fregean solution, however, faces other, more serious, problems. The account seems to fail when we try to extend it to all types of propositional clauses that can occur in belief contexts. One of our most common ways of referring to individuals is to use indexicals and demonstratives, such as ‘I’, ‘you’, ‘this’, ‘she’, and ‘they’. It is difficult to accommodate the use of such terms with a Fregean theory that requires that the mode of presentation is the semantic value of a singular term in a propositional attitude clause. (See Perry 1977, 1979 and Kaplan 1977, pp. 529-36 for a development of the problem of indexicals. See Evans 1985 for an attempt to solve the problems indexicals pose for a Fregean solution to Frege's puzzle. For more recent attempts, see Heck 2002.)

Frege's solution, remember, involves two claims: that indicating the sense is indicating the way the believer represents the individual and that belief attributions indicate the sense. These two claims seem to get the wrong results for propositional attitude reporting sentences with indexicals in their complement clauses. Consider, for example, the following sentence.

(10) Alice believes that I will solve an important problem in physics.

Suppose that McKay utters (10). McKay's use of ‘I’ tells us nothing about how Alice represents McKay; in particular, it does not refer to or otherwise involve anything that we would ordinarily call the sense of ‘I’. (It would be strange indeed if what made the attribution true was Alice's standing in the belief relation to a proposition containing the first-person mode of presentation associated with ‘I’ and the semantic value of ‘will solve an important problem in physics’. If there is such a first-person mode of presentation, then this is what it is for Alice to believe that she herself will solve an important problem in physics, which is not what McKay was saying in uttering (10).) Only the referent, not its mode of presentation, seems relevant with ordinary uses of indexical expressions. Let's call this the problem of indexicals.

The problem is that the perspective connected to a use of an indexical in an attitude report is typically not intended to represent or match the perspective the target of the report. For example, Jane might tell you that Lois believes that he is strong, pointing at Clark Kent, without expecting the perspective associated with her use of ‘he’ to match in any straightforward way any of Lois's perspectives. Indeed, it is quite intuitive that one might truly report another's beliefs using a demonstrative to refer to something that agent in question is not in a position to refer to demonstratively in any way whatsoever.

A related problem involves attributions of a common belief to many people. Like the problem of indexicals, this problem also highlights how problematic the Fregean idea that a belief attribution must indicate the way in which the believer represents an individual in belief is. It seems plausible that different people can (and do!) associate different modes of presentation with the same name. If so, the following sort of sentence seems to prove difficult for the Fregean.

(11) Many people believe that Tom McKay will solve an important problem in physics.

Someone attributing such a belief cannot be responsible for the many modes of representation that the various believers associate with ‘Tom McKay’. It may seem that the theory could work in this case only if we could find a sense for ‘Tom McKay’ that does not vary from person to person and that can serve as the mode of presentation of that individual for each person. That seem unlikely. Let's call this the problem of variability in sense. (See Richard 1988 for a development of the variability problem. See Forbes 1989, 1990 for an attempt to solve it.)

Let us pause to briefly (and inadequately) present a line of response to the problems of indexicals and of variability. We don't want the truth of (10) to require that Alice think of the speaker under a first-person mode of presentation associated with ‘I’ or the truth of (11) to require that that everyone think of McKay in the same way. But, as Fregeans, we want these reports to require more than mere reference-preservation. To pull this off we might attempt to construct a similarity class of senses. We say that the truth of (10) only requires that Alice needs to think of the speaker in a suitably related way to the first-person mode or presentation the attributer associates with ‘I’ and (11) requires only that everyone think of McKay in some suitably related way to sense the attributer associates with ‘Tom McKay’. The work will all be done in specifying what it is for an arbitrary mode of presentation to be suitably related to the attributer's mode of presentation. Presumably a Fregean would want the similarity class to be defined more narrowly than just in terms of co-reference. (Dummett 1973, p. 384 suggested that Frege subscribed to a view where reference-preservation sufficed for reports with indexicals. There is little plausibility to such a historical claim, particular in light of Frege's comments on indexicals in his 1918.) Finding such a middle ground between identity of sense and mere co-reference may well prove to be difficult indeed. However, much of what Mark Richard says in his 1990 (discussed below in Contextualist theories) about restrictions on correlation functions can be employed by the Fregean to try to find this middle ground.

Related to the above problems is the problem of intuitive entailment-successes. Frege's view is driven by the intuition that (1) (and the co-reference of ‘Superman’ and ‘Clark Kent’) does not entail (4). Here's an example. Suppose that Bill utters the sentence ‘I am happy’ and Lois believes him. Then, intuitively, there is something such that Bill said it and Lois believes it. But it is hard to see how the Fregean can account for such apparent entailment-successes, precisely of the way in which the account explains intuitive entailment-failures like (1) and (4).

Many have taken the problems presented above to show that the only semantically relevant value of a singular term in the scope of a propositional attitude verb is its reference. This, of course, is incompatible with Frege's solution to Frege's puzzle. And focus on the referent alone seems wrong when we consider the intuitive contrast between (1) and (4). So, if we suppose that the sole semantically relevant value of a singular term is always its reference, what is there to say about the intuitive difference between (1) and (4) and the arguments that they differ in truth-value?

4. The naive Russellian theory

Anti-Fregeans draw their inspiration from Bertrand Russell. Russell proposed what we might call an acquaintance-based theory of thought, according to which some of our thoughts are directly about the individuals they concern. We shall follow Kaplan 1977 in calling such propositions singular propositions. A proposition is singular with respect to an object o just in case it is about o in virtue of having o as a direct constituent. It is general with respect to o, on the other hand, just in case it concerns o but only in virtue of having a proxy of o that determines, either by satisfaction conditions or otherwise, o. Russell maintained that there are logically proper names, which contribute only their referents to the propositions expressed by sentences that contain them in subject position. He thus maintained that sentences containing logically proper names express singular propositions.

Russell was stingy indeed in what he counted as a genuine logically proper name. For Russell, only ‘this’, as a name of a sense datum, and perhaps ‘I’, when Russell set aside his Humean doubts with one's acquaintance with a self, are genuine names. Ordinary physical objects cannot be named and are known only by description, according to Russell. (See the supplementary document

Definite Descriptions

for Russell's theory of definite description.) This is because one can have a genuine name only for that with which one is acquainted and one is acquainted only with that for which misidentification is impossible. So, if one is presented with an individual and it is possible to be presented with that individual again and not realize it is the same object as before, then one is not acquainted with that individual; one's thoughts about that individual are, in that case, all indirect. This line of reasoning relies on the Fregean claim that cases of identity confusion must be explained in terms of a difference in thought-constituents. This allows Russell to agree with Frege regarding the truth-values of (1)-(4) and agree that (5) and (6) express different propositions. But, it is important to note, Russell still insisted that such thought is ultimately grounded in acquaintance with individuals, albeit not extra-mental individuals. Frege, on the other hand, fairly clearly thought that all thought was indirect, in the sense that a thought is about an object o not in virtue of having o as a direct constituent but rather by having a surrogate as a direct constituent that then determined o, most plausibly in virtue of satisfaction conditions.

Let's consider an example to better appreciate Russell's views about thought about external reality. Suppose that I am sitting before an object and say to myself, “That apple is green.” I am acquainted, Russell thinks, with the universal GREEN. But I am not acquainted with the apple itself, as misidentification is possible. My thought about the apple is therefore by description. But the description is not, for Russell, purely qualitative. Indeed, the description is individual-involving. In virtue of my visual experience of the apple, I am acquainted with a sense-datum caused by the apple. Call this sense-datum BILL. The content of my thought, according to Russell, is then something like the following.

<[the x: x causes BILL] x is green>

This proposition is general and thus indirect with respect to the external object (in this case, the apple) itself, but singular and thus direct with respect to the sense-datum being demonstratively referred to. Because this is the canonical form thought about external reality takes; thought about concrete particulars is ultimately grounded in acquaintance, albeit acquaintance with sense data as opposed to extra-mental reality itself, while being descriptive. For a very intuitive presentation of this view, see chapter 5 of Russell 1912. For a more detailed presentation, see Russell 1910.

It is clear that this is Russell's view for the contents of thought. It is less clear, however, that Russell was a descriptivist about the semantics of ordinary proper names in public language. Indeed, there is good evidence that Russell thought that ordinary public language names have as their sole semantic value their referents and hence that simple sentences containing them express singular propositions, but that most of us at least cannot entertain those propositions and can only think about them under descriptions. For a very nice defense of this asymmetric interpretation of Russell, see Sainsbury 1993.

More recent Russellians have, following Russell, maintained the objects of our thoughts are, in many cases, singular propositions. But they have broken from Russell in maintaining that extra-mental individuals — like the apple before me — can also be constituents of the thoughts we grasp. Let's call such theorists neo-Russellians. (See Donnellan 1990 for a nice discussion of Russell's view in contrast with what we are here calling neo-Russellians.) The standard, although by no means universal, view in contemporary philosophy of language and mind is neo-Russellian. There is, of course, a number of important differences among neo-Russellians concerning what extra-mental objects can be thought of directly and, more importantly, which relations (perceptual, communicative, etc.) ground and are necessary for direct thought.

All neo-Russellians deny the Fregean idea that all cases of misidentification are to be explained in terms of a difference in thought. Unlike Russell himself, neo-Russellians maintain that singular thought is possible even for entities for which misidentification is possible. So, for such cases, there is simply no appealing to a difference in thought content to explain misidentification; the thought content is the same precisely because the object misidentified is the same and the object exhausts the thought content. Neo-Russellians thus need to develop a quite distinct form of explanation of Frege's puzzle. Broadly speaking, there are two kinds of neo-Russellians. The first — what we will call naive Russellians — insist that the fundamental truth-conditions for belief attributions involve only the objects and properties, not the way those items are represented. According to naive Russellians, we are wrong to think that (1) is true and (4) is false. They are composed in the same way from elements with the same semantic value. Proponents of this view include Bealer 1982, §39; Berg 1983; Braun 1998, 2000, 2001a/b; McKay 1981, 1991; Nelson 2002, 2005; Reddam 1982; Richard 1983, 1987; Salmon 1986, 1989, 1995a; Soames 1987, 1989, 1995; and Tye 1978, for example. (Bealer has changed his view; see his 1993. Richard has also changed his view in 1989 and has subsequently become one of the most effective critics of naive Russellianism. We discuss Richard's later view below in the section on Contextualist theories. Tye has also seemed to have abandoned naive Russellianism. Soames has also to some extent, although much less drastically than the other three, altered his view in his 2002.) The other version of neo-Russellianism, to be discussed below in the section on Contextualist theories, agrees with the Fregean about the truth-values of (1) and (4) but rejects the Fregean claim that this difference requires a difference in thought content. In this section we focus on naive Russellianism.

Many naive Russellians (Bealer, Berg, McKay, Nelson, Reddam, Richard, Salmon, Soames, and Tye, for example) attempt to explain why people wrongly judge that (1) is true and (4) false by appealing to the different pragmatic implicatures utterance of those sentences typically generate. Other naive Russellians (Braun in particular) do not. We shall discuss both versions of naive Russellianism in what follows.

We have responsibilities that go beyond just avoiding falsehood. For example, it is true but inappropriate to utter the sentence ‘John is sober today’ if I know that John is always sober. Uttering that sentence is misleading because it suggests a contrast where there is none. But that doesn't make it false. Someone who claims that the sentence is false is confounding pragmatics with semantics. What the sentence says, as used on that occasion, is true, as John sure is sober on the day in question, but uttering the sentence pragmatically implicates something false: Namely, that John is typically drunk. Or at least it is plausible to so maintain. According to proponents of the first version of naive Russellianism, confounding pragmatic responsibilities with our responsibility to avoid falsehood can lead people astray concerning the fundamental semantics of belief attribution. There are often responsibilities for indicating the way in which the believer represents the individuals that her beliefs are about, but these go beyond the truth-conditions of the attributions. Any additional responsibilities are pragmatic, not semantic, requirements on the speaker. They may be conditions that a speaker must ordinarily fulfill when making a belief attribution. But these conditions stem not from the information semantically encoded by a given utterance of a propositional attitude reporting sentence but instead from the information pragmatically implicated by those utterances.

The naive Russellian must say that (4) is true (given that (1) is and, according to the naive Russellian, they both say the same thing). But an utterance of (4) may nonetheless be very misleading. Although Lois believes that Clark Kent is strong, she would not accept the sentence ‘Clark Kent is strong’. She does not accept that sentence because she does not recognize that it expresses a proposition that she believes; namely, the proposition expressed by ‘Superman is strong’. (Again, this is too meta-linguistic to be fully adequate. See again the supplementary document Ignorance of Identities, op. cit..) According to this pragmatic explanation of why people go wrong, the recognition that some utterances of (4) are very misleading and therefore inappropriate produces the feeling that those utterances of (4) should be counted as false by a semantic theory. But, according to the proponent of naive Russellianism, this is to confuse semantics with pragmatics. On this view, then, (4) is a true but misleading report of a belief Lois does indeed have. Let's call this the standard naive Russellian view.

We can make this proposal more precise by articulating a metaphysics of belief encapsulated in John Perry's between what an agent believes and how she believes it. (See Perry 1977 for an early presentation of the distinction, where he characterized the distinction as one between thoughts and senses, and his 1979, where he characterized the distinction as one between belief contents and belief states, 1980, 1990, 1997, and 1998 for a fuller presentation. It should be noted that Perry himself is not a naive Russellian, although he is a neo-Russellian. In his early papers, he simply left it undetermined whether or not sentences like (4) and (1) say the same thing, although Stalnaker claims that Perry claimed in personal communication that he intended his proposal to be equivalent to the naive Russellian proposal; see note 11 of Stalnaker 1981. In later work, in particular his 1989, co-authored with Crimmins, it becomes clear, however, that he does not. We discuss this view below in the section on Contextualist theories.) As mentioned above, Perry argues against Frege's solution to the problem of Frege's puzzle by considering indexicals in propositional attitude reporting sentences. His attack is based upon the Fregean's identification of the what with the how. Perry argues that we can adequately account for indexicals in attitudes only when we distinguish these two aspect of acts of thinking and recognize that they can vary independently. Perry claims that we believe contents by being in belief states while embedded in a given environment. We can believe different contents in different environments by being in the same belief state and we can believe the same content in different environments by being in the different belief states. So, for example, I can be in the same belief state you are in when you utter ‘I am hungry’ and yet, because of differences in our environments — namely, because I am me and you are you — our belief contents would be different. These differences in environment need to be conceptualized by the agent for them to make a difference to her cognitive states. And you can think what I think when I say to myself ‘I am hungry’ by pointing to me and saying to yourself ‘He is hungry’. In his 1977 Perry identified belief states (what he there called senses) with what he called roles and what Kaplan called character. In later work (see in particular his 1980), Perry gives this identification up and individuates belief states in terms of their narrow functional role. This seems much more promising.

It is perhaps worth briefly noting how Perry's later work on individuating belief states much of the force of Michael Thau's 2002 criticism of what he calls Guise Millianism, which corresponds to the conjunction of what we have here been calling neo-Russellianism and the above Perry metaphysics of belief. Thau claims that rather than distinguishing what is believed and how it is believed, and conceiving of belief as a mediated relation between agents and propositions, one should instead realize that one does not simply believe a single proposition in isolation, but instead believes, as it were, a cluster of propositions, many of them descriptive. We seek some difference in Lois's state of mind when she, as we might say, believes that Superman is strong and believes that Clark Kent is strong. The Fregean finds this difference in a difference in content; the proposition that Superman is strong is distinct from the proposition that Clark Kent is strong. The Guise Millian, on the other hand, finds this difference in a difference in belief state or how she believes what she believes. Thau argues that both are making a similar mistake: Namely, the mistake of thinking that the only difference in content could be a difference in that single proposition grasped. Thau claims, as an alleged alternative, that when Lois entertains and accepts the sentence ‘Superman is strong’ she believes the singular proposition concerning Superman to the effect that he is strong as well as a host of descriptive propositions like <[the x: x is a hunky superhero in tights] x is strong> and its like. When, on the other hand, she entertains and accepts the sentence ‘Clark Kent is not strong’ she believes the negation of the same singular proposition as well as a host of distinct descriptive propositions like <[the x: x is a nerdy reported at Daily Planet] x is not strong> and its like. Thus, what the Guise Millian calls a difference in how Lois believes what she believes is in fact, Thau argues, difference in more of what Lois believes, albeit not the primary proposition as the Fregean insists.

Insofar as belief states are individuated by their functional roles, as Perry is clear in his later work they are, it is hard to see how there is any real difference between Thau's proposal and the Guise Millian's. The appearance of a difference is based on the mistaken idea that proponents of Perry's metaphysics of belief sees belief states mediating our grasp of singular propositions in the way that sense-data mediate our perception of physical objects for the sense-data theorist.

With the above Perry-inspired metaphysics of belief in place, we can say that utterances of propositional attitude reporting sentences pragmatically implicate information about how the agent believes what she believes — they pragmatically implicate information about the type of belief state the agent is in — but semantically encode only information about what is believed. An utterance of (4) will typically pragmatically implicate false information about the type of belief state by which Lois grasps (and takes a positive attitude towards) the singular proposition concerning Clark Kent to the effect that he is strong; namely, it implicates that that belief state is linked, in some way, to the sentence ‘Clark Kent is strong’. An utterance of (1), on the other hand, implicates no such information. This difference in implicating potential accounts for our intuitions that (1) and (4) convey different information. Those intuitions rightly represent the fact that there is a difference in the information an ordinary hearer will take from a typical utterance of (4) as opposed to a typical utterance of (1), but they are wrongly taken to show that (1) and (4) themselves thus differ in truth-value.

What can the naive Russellian say about the two Fregean arguments presented above? They can claim that the principle of rationality, according to which an agent is irrational just in case she simultaneously believes a proposition and its negation, and the converse disquotation principle are false. Let's see how.

Perry 1977 argues that once we accept the distinction between belief states and belief contents, we should see that rational agents can believe a proposition and its negation, so long as they do so by being in “distinct” belief states. That is, Lois simultaneously believes that Superman is strong and that Superman is not strong. This does not call her rationality into question, as she believes the first proposition by being in a belief state properly related to ‘Superman is strong’ and believes the second by being in a belief state properly related to ‘Clark Kent is not strong’. Irrationality is believing a proposition and its negation in virtue of being in the same type of state, not merely believing a proposition and its negation.

Whereas the first Fregean argument above relies upon the following principle

An agent is irrational if she believes a proposition and its negation at the same time.

the Naive Russellian proposes that we instead embrace the following principle.

An agent is irrational if she believes a proposition and its negation at the same time and in the same type of ways.

But if Rationality is rejected and Rationality* adopted in its place, then we can insist that the truth of (1) and (4) does not entail that Lois is irrational. Even though the truth of (1) and (4) entails that Lois believes a proposition and its negation, nothing is entailed about the belief states she is in in virtue of which she believes a proposition and its negation and thus, given Rationality*, nothing about Lois's irrationality follows. Indeed, given the way the story is set up, it is all but irresistible to insist that Lois believes what she does in different ways and hence is rational, despite her believing a proposition and its negation. Neo-Russellianism is thus not forced to ascribe irrationality to Lois.

What about the second Fregean argument from above? It is plausible to insist that we should similarly reject Converse disquotation, according to which, roughly, an agent does not believe a proposition insofar as she sincerely, reflectively, and competently withholds assent from a sentence that expresses that proposition, in favor of the following weaker principle.

Converse disquotation*
If an agent A sincerely, reflectively, and competently denies (or even withholds acceptance from) a sentence s (in a context c), then there is a way of believing what s expresses in c such that, under that way of believing, A does not, at the time of c, take a positive attitude towards what s expresses in c.

With the Perry-inspired metaphysics of belief in place, we should realize first that different sentences can express the same proposition and second that denying or withholding acceptance from one sentence does not entail that one denies or withholds acceptance from every sentence that expresses the same proposition. The original converse disquotation principle should then be seen to be too strong. It tries to derive a negative existential from a single instance, in that it allows us to infer that there is no way of grasping a given proposition such that the agent affirms it from the fact that she does not affirm it from one way of grasping it. That's like inferring that Sally didn't walk to school from the fact that she didn't walk to school naked.

But if Converse disquotation is rejected and Converse disquotation* is adopted in its place, then Lois's acceptance patterns do not entail the contradictory, given naive Russellianism, (1) and (3). (3) is simply false. Lois's denial of the sentence ‘Clark Kent is strong’ simply entails that Lois both believes and withholds belief from one and the same proposition, where withholding belief from a proposition involves grasping a proposition in a given way and taking a negative attitude towards it when so presented. (This intermediate state was first uncovered by Kaplan 1969 in his analysis of de re belief discussed above.) Whereas simultaneously believing and not believing a single proposition is a violation of the indiscernibility of identicals, simultaneously believing and withholding belief from a single proposition is not. [This distinction follows Salmon 1995a.]

As indicated above, Braun follows the standard naive Russellian in insisting that (1) and (4) say the same thing, but he departs from his fellow naive Russellians by refusing to appeal to differences in the pragmatic potential of (1) and (4) themselves to account for our “Frege intuitions.” He doubts such appeals are successful because he doubts that ordinary users of propositional attitude ascribing sentences have the necessary sophistication to impart information about how an agent believes what she believes. (Saul, in her 1998, 1999a/b, also doubts that the sort of information described above concerning belief states or how an agent believes what she believes could be pragmatically implicate, or indeed communicated in any way, by typical utterances of propositional attitude reporting sentences. She does not, however, offer Braun's positive account.) He agrees that there is a difference in implicature-potential between the unembedded sentences (5) and (6) and he argues that this difference itself will account for our intuitions regarding the difference in truth-value between typical utterances of (1) and (4). There is no need, he argues, to go on and insist that utterances of (1) and (4) themselves pragmatically implicate different information or convey in any way information about how Lois believes what she believes. (See Braun 1998.) In subsequent papers Braun offers extremely rich and interesting accounts of the role propositional attitude ascribing sentences play in explaining, predicting, and rationalizing behavior. (See Braun 2000, 2001a/b.) Braun's interesting and carefully constructed position warrants more discussion than we shall give it here. Part of the justification for our short-changing it is that, as we argue below, we doubt the success of his argument that information regarding Lois's belief states is unavailable to ordinary speakers.

5. Problems for the naive Russellian theory

There are several problems and puzzles for naive Russellianism and a thoroughly worked out view will need to respond to all of them. In this section we shall offer a quick overview of some of the main problems and gesture towards possible solutions.

Pragmatic principles. It seems that the naive Russellian should have some account of what leads so many people astray in their judgments that (1) and (4) differ in truth-value. If the naive Russellian wishes to give a pragmatic account of people's ordinary judgments about their truth-value, she must clearly identify the pragmatic principles that make these incorrect judgments are so pervasive and stubborn. (Note: This problem will not face Braun's version of naive Russellianism in quite the same way.)

H.P. Grice, the father of implicature, offered a very compelling theory of conversational implicatures. See Grice 1975, 1978, 1981. See also the entry on implicature. But it is at least arguable that his theory won't help the Naive Russellian. Information about the way the believer believes what she believes cannot, it would seem, be carried as a conversational implicature because such information is not calculable by the conversational participants from what is said and the maxims, as Grice's theory requires conversational implicatures to be. After all, that would require that, at some level, ordinary speakers realize that they are not saying all they mean when they utter, under “ordinary circumstances,” a sentence like (1). But that is implausible. (Schiffer, in his 1987, levels a similar charge, although he does not explicitly present it in terms of Grice's calculability condition; Salmon responds to it in his 1989, although the response doesn't satisfy, as he merely claims that Grice's notion of a conversational implicature is not what he had in mind in claiming that information about how agents believe what they believe is pragmatically conveyed by utterances of belief sentences, but he does not go on to give any kind of indication of what he did have in mind. Recanati 1993, chapter 17 contains a very nice presentation of this objection.)

Obvious permutations on Grice's notion of conversational implicature such a Morgan's and Horn's notion of a short-circuited conversational implicature won't be of much use either. (See Morgan 1978 and Horn and Bayer 1984.) Short-circuiting occurs when a non-literal use of an expression, phrase, or sentence becomes standardized and the necessary inference pattern gets short-circuited. For example, it is at least arguable that uses of ‘Can you pass the salt?’, to take an example of Searle's 1975, standardly mean Please pass the salt. According to Morgan and Horn, this meant information is a conversational implicature. Ordinary speakers may not recognize, even upon reflection, that they are speaking non-literally — i.e., they are not strictly saying what or all that they mean — because the non-literal use has become entrenched through repetition. And even though ‘Do you have the ability to pass the salt?’ and ‘Can you pass the salt?’ (at least arguably) mean the same thing and hence utterances of them have the same conversational implicating potential, because of past uses an utterance of the latter but not the former will naturally give rise to the request for the salt. Short-circuiting is unlikely to be of use to a naive Russellian because it requires past uses that meet the conditions for ordinary conversational implicature, those uses of which then become, through repetition, standardized. But it is at best highly doubtful that there were at any time widespread uses of propositional attitude reporting sentences that met the necessary conditions for being conversational implicatures, as it is highly dubious that ordinary speakers ever realized that sentences like (1) and (4) to say the same thing. Hence, there was never the necessary past use as a standard conversational implicature that can then get standardized.

We have argued that a proponent of (the standard version of) naive Russellianism cannot employ Grice's notion of conversational implicature, or any obvious permutation thereof, to account for our Frege intuitions. This is not to say that she cannot offer an account of the pragmatic principles that generate the implicatures she claims to be present. The important work is done by developing a notion of a pragmatic implicature that does not rely upon calculability and indeed that does not require the propositions semantically encoded by the relevant utterances to play any role in the conscious psychological lives of the participants of the conversation. How could an implicature be generated under such conditions? The naive Russellian might start by first pointing out the widespread conflation of belief contents and belief states, or, more generally, the what and the how in the case of propositional attitudes. Because ordinary folk do not clearly distinguish these two notions in their thinking, it is little surprise that they come to intend to impart information about how a given agent believes what she believes by uttering sentences that are only about what that agent believes. This is all the more understandable in light of the fact that how an agent believes what she believes is so useful to explaining, predicting, and rationalizing actions — something propositional attitude reporting sentences seem made to do. But for the reasons discussed above, we need to keep such information distinct from the proposition believed. So, because ordinary speakers don't distinguish what being said to be believed from how it is being said to believed, it is little surprise that they would use sentences that, as far as their semantics goes, only indicate information about what is believed to convey information about how it is believed without, as it were, being in a position to realize that they are speaking non-literally. They don't realize it because they don't distinguish the information they are intending to get across regarding how a subject believes something from the information expressed by the sentence she uses. Such an account, of course, would need to be fleshed out much more fully.

Asymmetric relations. If names really are inter-substitutable, and if it is true that:

then these must also be true:

Can it really be that these are true and that the typical strong feeling that they are false is really a just feeling of pragmatic inappropriateness? Must Lois also believe that Superman is stronger than himself, or can we differentiate this from the previous claims? And if we can't differentiate, or if the one implies the other, then that seems problematic indeed. How could a thoughtful agent think that something is stronger than itself?

Salmon 1992, McKay 1991 compellingly argue that believing that Superman is stronger than Superman is distinct from believing that Superman is stronger than himself precisely because the proposition that Superman is stronger than Superman is different from the proposition that Superman is stronger than himself, on the grounds that being stronger than Superman is a different property from being stronger than oneself.

Psychological explanation, predication, and rationalization. The explanatory, predictive, and rationalizing potential of (1) differs drastically from that of (4). For example, an utterance of (4), if accepted as true, would typically lead one to expect that, when Lois is looking for some heavy boxes to be moved in her office, sees Clark Kent (dressed in his Daily Planet garb) standing by doing nothing, that she would ask him to help, etc.. This, of course, is the wrong result. Lois does no such thing. The naive Russellian thinks that an utterance of (4) is true in exactly those conditions under which an utterance of (1) is true. But this, it may be thought, is hard to square with the fact that they have such very different explanatory, predicative, and rationalizing potential. (See Richard 1997 for a powerful presentation of this objection.)

The force of this objection really rests on the the force of the first problem of pragmatic principles raised above. For if the first problem is solved, then the solution the problems of psychological explanation, predication, and rationalization will be carried in on its wings. Insofar as utterances of (1) and (4) implicate different information about the way in which Lois believes what she allegedly believes, it seems likely that there will be a very natural account of the difference in their explanatory, predictive, and rationalizing potential; that difference, one could claim, stems from the difference in what is conversationally implicated. So the more fundamental problem facing the naive Russellian is the problem of pragmatic principles.

Schiffer's iteration problem. In his 1987, and further in the appendix to his ms, Schiffer argues the naive Russellianism is implausible when it comes to beliefs about other people's beliefs. Lois, the naive Russellian claims, is rational in believing a contradiction because she has two modes of presentation of Superman such that, as it were, she does not believe that they are modes of presentation of the same object. So, Lois can rationally believe the singular propositions that Superman is strong and that Superman is not strong at the same time because she believes the first in one way and the second in another way. But most of us believe that Lois believes that Superman is strong while believing that Lois does not believe that Clark Kent is strong. So, given naive Russellianism, most of us then believe a proposition and its negation and we seem to not be guilty of irrationality for so doing. But, argues Schiffer, the naive Russellian cannot account for this, as most of us do not have two distinct ways of thinking of Superman (or Lois, for that matter) such that we do not realize that they are ways of thinking of the same individual. So, it seems that the naive Russellian's conditions for rationally believing a proposition and its negation are not met. (Salmon attempts to respond to Schiffer's objection in his 1989. See the papers linked below for an extension of the debate.)

6. Contextualist theories

Most neo-Russellians are reluctant to embrace the claim that co-referring proper names are intersubstitutable within the scope of attitude verbs and thus most neo-Russellians reject naive Russellianism. They would like to find a way to embrace the Fregean intuitions that, for example, (1) is true while (4) is false without embracing the Fregean claim that ‘Superman’ and ‘Clark Kent’ are not directly referential and without accepting the Fregean claim that all cases of identity confusion are to be explained in terms of a difference in thought grasped. Although naive Russellians claim that the information regarding how Lois believes what she does is, at best, merely part of what utterances of (1) and (4) pragmatically convey, “sophisticated” neo-Russellians would like that information to be part of the semantic content of the sentences in question, even though the embedded sentences (5) and (6) express the same singular proposition. In this section we shall look at two broad strategies that promise to deliver these results: The first developed in Mark Crimmins and John Perry 1989 and Crimmins 1992 and the second suggested by a view presented in Mark Richard 1990.

Crimmins and Perry argue that propositional attitude reports involve “unarticulated constituents” that concern how the subject of the report believes what she (allegedly) believes. That is, the proposition semantically encoded by utterances of belief sentences contain constituents about the way in which the believer (allegedly) believes what she does that are not contributed by any syntactic element in the sentence uttered. According to Crimmins and Perry, a typical utterance of (1) will express a truth while a typical utterance of (4) will express a falsehood. Both attributions, they claim, say of Lois that she believes the singular proposition about Superman to the effect that he is strong. But the first involves implicit reference to Lois's “Superman-y” way of thinking of Superman and the second to Lois's “Clark Kent-y” way of thinking of Superman. Because Lois believes that singular proposition in the first implicitly referred to way and not the second, the two sentences will typically express different proposition and indeed typically diverge in truth-value.

As should be apparent, Crimmins and Perry embrace a similar metaphysics of belief as that sketched above on behalf of the standard naive Russellian. Indeed, this is (or can be) a point of agreement between the two views: We grasp propositions in virtue of our being in certain functionally individuated states in a given environment. This then provides two ingredients: A proposition grasped and something that might be called a way of grasping it. The difference, of course, between the Crimmins and Perry view and the standard naive Russellian view is that whereas the latter insists that the information semantically encoded by utterances of belief sentences is insensitive to differences in the way a proposition is grasped, the former view insists that that information is sensitive to differences in the way a proposition is grasped.

Extra-linguistic context determines what way of grasping (what Crimmins and Perry call an idea) is implicitly referred to. (On the most plausible version of the view, a type of way of grasping, instead of a token way of grasping, that is implicitly referred to.) The expressions themselves (and not just their referents or semantic contents) are, however, typically relevant to what way of grasping is implicitly referred to. So, although substitution of co-referring names does not affect the proposition the propositional attitude ascribing sentence claims the believer to believe, as it does on the Fregean view, it does (typically) affect what way of grasping is implicitly referred to and hence is capable of affecting truth-value of a propositional attitude ascribing sentence. (Some call views of this kind “hidden-indexical theories” because they make reference to a type of way of grasping without having any syntactic element that explicitly does just that job. See Schiffer 1992, p. 503. Although Crimmins and Perry do not note this, Schiffer offered a version of this view in his 1977, as did Brian Loar 1972. Greg Fitch also presented a similar kind of view in his 1984 and 1987.)

Crimmins and Perry offer a way of insisting that the objects of many of our beliefs are singular propositions while still denying the substitution principle. Crimmins and Perry can thus accept all of the auxiliary principles and claims used to generate Frege's puzzle (i.e., disquotation, converse disquotation, the principle of rationality, etc.) and, like Frege, deny that the co-reference of ‘Superman’ and ‘Clark Kent’ licenses their inter-substitution in (1), while still claiming that ‘Superman’, as it occurs in (1), is directly referential. The view seems to give us all that we could want: It respects our Fregean intuitions about truth-values without the sins of accepting a sense/reference distinction for singular terms like proper names, demonstratives, and indexicals.

Crimmins and Perry's view has been subject to criticism. (For a sampling, see Bach 1993, Clapp 1995, Reimer 1995, Richard 1993, Rieber 1995, and Saul 1992. Crimmins responds to some of these objections in his 1992, 1995. Schiffer objects to the Crimmins and Perry view in his 1992 and 1994 on the basis that ‘believes’ and other propositional attitude verbs do not express three-place relations, as their view requires. Ludlow responds to Schiffer's “logical form” objection in his 1995, 1996. Schiffer responds to Ludlow in his 1996.) We shall here briefly present only one.

The appeal to unarticulated constituents seems suspect. Although the issues are complex and quickly draw us into general and delicate issues in the philosophy of language, many are drawn to what we can call a principle of linguistic constraint, according to which contextual supplementation of what's said is always traceable to some syntactic element; that is, the information semantically encoded by an utterance must have the same structure as the syntactic form of the sentence uttered. (See, for example, Stanley 2000, 2002 for a defense of this constraint. Recanati 2002 and Carston 1998, 2002 offer very sensitive defenses of unarticulated constituents.) Crimmins and Perry blatantly flout this principle, as they argue that ‘believes’ is syntactically two-place even though it expresses a three-place relation. But this is unacceptable. Or, more cautiously, we can at least say that it would be better to devise a theory that did not flout constraint, assuming it has the other virtues of the account.

What we would like is a way to make the information encoded by utterances of belief sentences sensitive to how the subject of the report grasps the proposition, while insisting that the proposition grasped is just a singular proposition, without making ways of grasping unarticulated constituents. We can get an idea of how to do that by looking at a view developed by Mark Richard 1990, 1993, 1995. Like Crimmins and Perry, Richard offers a semantics of propositional attitude reporting sentences that treats them as context-sensitive, that respects something like neo-Russellianism (although we'll return to this below), and yet that blocks intersubstitution of co-referring names within the scope of propositional attitude verbs. Unlike Crimmins and Perry, however, Richard does not claim that ‘believes’ (and its fellow propositional attitude verbs) expresses a three-place relation and does not appeal to unarticulated constituents. Richard's view is thus consistent with the principle of linguistic constraint. The key to Richard's view is his claim that ‘believes’ itself is context-sensitive, expressing different relations in different contexts.

According to Richard, sentences express what he calls Russellian annotated matrices (RAMs). These are represented as tuples of pairs of linguistic expressions and their “Russellian interpretations.” (Richard notes that strictly speaking we don't want a linguistic expression but rather some kind of internal representation to deal with cases like Kripke's Paderweski case. See the discussion below in Two Further Puzzles: Kripke's puzzles and Richard's puzzle.) The pairs are called annotations. RAMs are both the semantic contents of sentences and the contents of beliefs. According to Richard's account, (1), for example, is true relative to some context c and a world of evaluation w just in case Lois has a thought in w that is properly represented (relative to the standards in effect in c) by the sentence ‘Superman is strong’. The conversational setting generates restrictions on what words and sentences are proper translations of the representations of the alleged believer. Richard calls these restrictions on correlation functions. Correlation functions map annotations onto annotations. The sentence ‘Superman is stong’ properly represents some thought p of Lois's relative to the restrictions in force in some context c just in case a correlation function maps from the RAM expressed by ‘Superman is strong’ relative to c to p and that correlation function respects the relevant restrictions in force in c. Now, as there are contexts (and indeed, ordinary contexts will be just like this) in which ‘Superman is strong’ and ‘Clark Kent is strong’ are associated with different restrictions, we cannot substitute ‘Clark Kent’ for ‘Superman’ in (1) and preserve truth. So, there is no problem in saying that (1) is true while (4) is false.

The content of beliefs — that is, the objects we bear propositional attitudes towards — are not, on Richard's view, neo-Russellian purely singular propositions because, although they do contain the reference itself (so, for example, Superman himself is a constituent of the proposition expressed, relative to some context, by ‘Superman is strong’), so too is something that plays the role of a mode of presentation — the annotation. But Richard's view can be altered in such a way as to still retain its core features while being neo-Russellian. The resulting view is in many ways superior to Richard's own version. Assume the Perry-inspired metaphysics of belief sketched earlier. Richardian correlation functions can then be seen to map complement clauses onto belief states, preserving content. We can then have a neo-Russellian theory of the contents of the attitudes and semantics of singular terms like proper names, indexicals, and demonstratives — and with it a more plausible account of when two agents “believe the same thing,” which Richard's own fine-grained account of the contents of attitudes cannot — while respecting Fregean intuitions about the truth-values of (1)-(4). Such an account seems to be the most promising way to count (1) true and (4) false.

Richard's account faces a serious problem: The problem of conflicting restrictions. (The criticisms affect the neo-Russellian version of that view sketched above.) Sider 1995 and Soames 1995 criticize Richard's account on the grounds that it seems to get the wrong results for cases in which the ascriber — as opposed to the subject of the report, as in standard Frege-style cases — are confused about the identities of the subject her the report. So, for example, suppose Lois is ascribing beliefs to Superman. Now, because she believes that Superman is not Clark Kent, she takes herself to be ascribing beliefs to two different people, depending on how she conceives of Superman. But then we can imagine circumstances in which her intentions generate conflicting restrictions on a single complement clause. So, for example, Lois might intend ‘he’, pointing at a picture of Lex Luther, in ‘He is evil’ to represent a visual/perceptual demonstrative when ascribing beliefs to Superman and ‘Luther’ when ascribing beliefs to Clark Kent. So, when Lois says, “Superman believes that he [pointing at the picture of Luther] is evil,” she intends to convey that Superman has a belief to the effect that he [visual presentation of Luther] is evil and when she says, “Clark Kent believes that he [pointing at the picture of Luther] is evil,” she intends to convey that Clark Kent has a belief to the effect that Luther is evil. We can imagine, if you like, that Lois believes that Superman has been face to face with Luther and so possesses a visual demonstrative representation of him, whereas Clark Kent has not, and what she wishes to convey about Superman's belief crucially involves such a representation of him. This is problematic for Richard because these restrictions conflict and so there is no correlation function that respects all the operative restrictions. As a result, every belief sentence with a singular term designating Superman and ‘he [visual presentation of Luther]’ as subject of the complement clause is false; even ‘Superman believes that he [visual presentation of Luther] is self-identical’ is false. This is intuitively unacceptable.

Richard responds to this problem in his 1995 by adding to his account something like the supervaluationist account of vagueness, saying that when there are conflicting restrictions operative in a sentence, a relevant sentence is true in the context just in case it is true on every resolution of the conflict. Nelson 2002, 2005 criticizes Richard's response, arguing that it still does not accommodate all intuitive truth-value judgments, as it still counts false some utterances that are intuitively true.

Both Crimmins and Perry's account and Richard's account have a similar goal: Accept the intuitive judgments of the truth-value of sentences like (1)-(4) without accepting the Fregean claim that the belief that Superman is strong is distinct from the belief that Clark Kent is strong. We have, however, seen reasons to doubt either succeed in realizing this goal.

7. Denying the assumption of structured-propositionalism

All of the accounts considered above — both Frege's account, the neo-Fregean accounts, and the various versions of neo-Russellianism, from naive Russellianism to Crimmins and Perry's view and Richard's view — share a common assumption of structured-propositionalism, according to which the objects of thought are propositions, which are public, language-independent, abstract entities with a structure that mirrors the syntactic structure of the natural language sentences that express them. This assumption is very widely, although not universally, made by contemporary philosophers of language and mind and we believe that any plausible account of propositional attitudes must be consistent with this assumption. But many have found propositionalism extremely problematic. There are a host of very different problems that have been found, some ontological, some purely semantic, with the thesis. For example, some have found propositions to be unduly mysterious objects, having no place in a naturalistic world. Sometimes this is part of a general rejection of abstract entities and other times a rejection of intensional entities. Others have found propositions to be lacking acceptable individuation conditions. And others have been moved by the so-called unity problem that ultimately led Russell to abandon propositions as the contents of the attitudes in favor of his multiple judgment theory. Finally, some have thought that the propositionalist assumption stands in the way of an acceptable solution to Frege's puzzle.

In this section we survey various accounts that deny structured-propositionalism. There are two broad categories of theories we shall look at: The first denies propositionalism, according to which propositions are the objects of the attitudes. The most natural, although not unique, way to deny propositionalism is to embrace some form of sententialism, according to which the objects of thought are some kind of linguistic entity. The second accepts a commitment to the propositionalist's claim that the objects of thought are public, language-independent, abstract entities, but deny that these entities are structured. The most natural, although, again, not the only, way to deny structured-propositionalism is to identify sets of possible worlds, or functions from worlds to truth values, with the objects of thought. We shall consider each of these theses in turn.

First sententialism. The most simple-minded form of sententialism, roughly inspired by Rudolph Carnap's analysis of belief sentences, claims that what we have been calling "propositional attitudes" are really attitudes towards sentences. (See, for example, Carnap 1958. Quine too was a proponent of this view. See, for example, his 1956.) On this view, (1) is analyzed as (12),

(12) Lois believes-true ‘Superman is strong’

where ‘believes-true’ expresses a primitive relation between an agent and a sentence. (Similar relations will have to be introduced to correspond to ‘hopes-true’, ‘desires-true’, etc..)

This proposal obviously won't do. As Church famously pointed out — in, for example, his 1943, p. 45 — construing propositional attitude verbs as relating agents to sentences seems to require that the agent in question understandings the language used in the report. Suppose that Lois is a monolingual German speaker, but that everything else about the Superman stories are the same. Then we'd still be inclined to count (1) as true. But (12), which is proposed to analyze (1), is obviously false, as Lois bears no relation whatsoever to the English sentence ‘Superman is strong’.

Proponents of sententialism are well aware of the problem. But it is much less obvious that they have succeeded in overcoming it. Carnap 1958, supplement C responds to Church's objection by claiming that the proposal need not require that the agent believe-true the very sentence contained in the complement clause, but only some sentence or other that bears some relation (Carnap calls it ‘B’) to the sentence the ascriber uses. But this relation can't simply be left unanalyzed. And one cannot analyzed it in terms of believing-true a sentence that expressing the same proposition or worse still believing the proposition expressed by the embedded sentence, on pains of reverted to the thesis of propositionalism that the theory was designed to avoid.

There is a further problem. Although the issue is delicate, it seems highly plausible that some non-language-using animals have propositional attitudes or at least that some attitude ascribing sentences about non-language-using animals are true. For example, it seems true that the dog wants to go out when she scratches at the door and that the cat believes food is on its way when she hears the can open. But there seems to be absolutely no way of analyzing this in terms of such creatures being related to sentences.

Quine famously responded to this problem by writing: “We may treat a mouses's fear of a cat as his fearing true a certain English sentence. This is unnatural without being therefore wrong. It is a little like describing a prehistoric ocean current as clockwise” (1956, p. 186). Although an excellent turn of the pen, it seems clear that the worry is in no way answered. Ascribing a clockwise current to a prehistoric ocean does not require the existence of clocks in prehistoric time, any more than our using actual resources to describe a counterfactual circumstance in which, say, there are no words requires that there are words in that counterfactual circumstance. But this is a false comparison to the case of treating a mouses's fear of a cat as fearing true a English sentence when one is fairly certain the mouse doesn't understand English. In the case of non-language-using animals we aren't using features of context to fix a content that we then evaluate at contexts without those features. It is still hard to see how a mouse can fear- or believe-true any sentences, English or otherwise, even though it can fear a cat and believe that it is dangerous.

Donald Davidson 1968 famously proposed a more complex version of sententialism. Although his account was first proposed as an account of indirect discourse (i.e., of sentences like ‘Bill said that the proposition won't pass’), it has been extended to a general theory of propositional attitudes. (Davidson himself hinted at such in extension in the opening paragraph of his original paper.) The idea is fairly straightforward. Let's start with indirect speech reports. Roughly, Davidson claims that a sentence like (13) has as its true logical form (14) below.

(13) Galileo said that the earth moves.

(14) Galileo said that. The earth moves

Davidson's idea is that ‘that’ in (13) functions as a demonstrative that refers to the utterance of the sentence that follows. So an utterance of (13) is really an utterance of two sentences, one with a demonstrative that then refers to the utterance that follows. Galileo need not have uttered the exact sentence demonstratively referred to for an utterance of (13) to be true. Instead, he must have uttered a sentence that “samesays” the utterance demonstratively referred to. So the account may seem to hold the promise of overcoming Church's translation argument. This is often called the paratactic account of indirect speech reports.

Extending the paratactic account of indirect speech reports to propositional attitude reports more generally may seem straightforward. (1) is claimed to have the logical form of (15) below.

(15) Lois believes that. Superman is strong.

An utterance of (1) is then seen to assert of Lois that she has a belief whose content is captured by the ascriber's utterance of the second sentence ‘Superman is strong’.

The truth of (1) plus the true identity statement ‘Superman is Clark Kent’ is compatible with (4)'s falsity. This is because (15) plus the true identity statement does not entail (16) below.

(16) Lois believes that. Clark Kent is strong.

The two occurrences of ‘that’ in (15) and (16) do not refer to the same utterance and so there is no guarantee that the two utterances samesay the same things. So, the account respects the intuitive truth-value judgments of (1)-(4).

The paratactic account, both solely as account of indirect speech reports and as an account of propositional attitude reports more generally, has been subject to a wide range of criticisms. (For a sampling, see Bigelow 1980, Blackburn 1975, Burge 1986, Clapp 2002, McFetridge 1980, Rumfitt 1993, and especially Schiffer 1987b, pp. 122-38. See Lepore and Loewer 1989 for a defense.) First, there are plenty of languages where the apparent complementizer — ‘that’, in English — is not homophonic with a demonstrative. How deep of a problem this is depends on how seriously the paratactic account is about taking surface syntactic form as some kind of guide. There is no question that the account is a good account of English reporting sentences only if it extends to reporting sentences in other languages. And there is no question that there are plenty of languages in which the apparent complementizer is not homophonic with a demonstrative. One might still claim that ‘believes’ (and its fellows) express a two place relation between an agent and some kind of utterance-like entity, where the embedded sentences functions as a representer of the utterance-like entity that the agent in question bears the relation in question to. There is no need, at least not without other assumptions, that the apparent complimentizer itself function as a demonstrative. And even if there is a need for the complimentizer itself to function as a demonstrative, there is no need for it to be a demonstrative.

Second, and we think far more telling, there are plenty of entailment relations that are intuitively valid that the account counts as invalid and for the precise reasons that it counts invalid the intuitively offending entailments involved in Frege cases. Recall how the account invalidates substitution of co-referring names within the scope of ‘believes’ sketched above. The same kind of reasoning will, it seems, also lead one to think that the following invalid.

(A) Lois believes that. Superman is strong.

So, (B) Lois believes that. Superman is strong.

Just as the two occurrences of ‘that’ in (15) and (16) refer to different utterances, so too do the different occurrences of ‘that’ in (A) and (B). But something has evidently gone wrong if (A) does not entail (B). (It should be noted that this is similar to Kaplan's argument for why sentences-in-context, as opposed to utterances, which are concrete events, should be the primary bearers of semantic contents.) This problem can be avoided if, following Rumfitt 1993, utterance-types as opposed to utterance-tokens are seen to be the referent of ‘that’.

But there are other entailment relations that are also problematic for the paratactic account and are not avoided by Rumfitt's move. (Similar points are made by Burge 1986 and Schiffer 1987b.) Intuitively, (1) entails (17).

(17) There is something that Lois believes.

And consider the following entailment relations.

(C) Superman said something funny.
(D) Lois believes what Superman said.
So, (E) Lois believes something funny.


(1) Lois believes that Superman is strong.
(F) Superman exists.
So, (G) There is something such that Lois believes that he is strong.

All of these are invalid if they are analyzed according to the paratactic analysis, whereas they are intuitively valid. This counts heavily against the paratactic analysis, especially as that account is designed to respect intuitive validity judgments.

Lepore and Loewer 1989 respond to these entailment problems. They try to deal with all but the last, which concerns the relationship between so-called de dicto belief and de re belief (see the supplementary document, The De Re/De Dicto Distinction, op. cit.), by showing how the validity of the entailment is preserved by the addition of a premise which it is plausible to say we simply take for granted in assessing the validity of the entailments displayed above. The success of their strategy depends on the plausibility of the original entailment intuitions turning on our implicitly assuming the additional premise in question. We remain neutral on this issue.

There is a final problem that faces the paratactic account that we shall briefly discuss. (We follow Schiffer 1987b.) The key idea behind the paratactic view is that the utterance of the embedded sentence serves as a surrogate for some entity that the report then asserts the subject of the report bears some relation of samesaying to. But this is problematic for at least two reasons. First, the proponent of the paratactic account owes an account of when two utterances samesay one another. And, as was the case with Carnap's proposal, this account cannot make appeal to a proposition which both utterances bear some relation to in virtue of which they samesay one another, on pains of the view collapsing into a version of a propositionalist view. (Indeed, it seems that any sense that the account is correct derives from our explicating the samesaying relation in terms of sameness of content, which of course the proponent of the paratactic account cannot have.) Davidson himself thought he had such an account by treating a Tarskian theory of truth as a theory of meaning. (See his 1967.) Although there is no question of doing the issue justice here, Davidson's proposed that the primary aim of a theory of meaning is to explain speaker competence and in particular the knowledge by which speakers can understand a potentially infinite number of sentences. And what's more, he thought that a Tarskian truth theory did just that. Although there are still practitioners of Davidsonian semantics, their numbers are diminishing within philosophy and the view has the subject of quite successful criticism. (Foster 1976 is the ultimate source of many of these criticisms. See Soames 1989, 1992 and chapter 12 of his 2003 for a further critique of the view. For a defense of the strategy, see, for example, Larsons and Segal 1995.)

This problem is even more pressing when one moves from indirect speech reports to other propositional attitude reports. For, as Schiffer 1987b has stressed, whereas (13)'s truth plausibly does requires the existence of an utterance on Galileo's part, it is implausible to insist that the truth of (1) requires an actual utterance on Lois's part. Lois might truly be said to believe that Superman is strong even though she has produced no utterances that samesay the ascribers utterance of ‘Superman is strong’. So, let ‘u′’ name the attributer's utterance of ‘The earth moves’. If (13) is true, then there exists an utterance u such that Galileo produced u and u′ and u samesay one another. Now let ‘u″’ name the attributer's utterance of ‘Superman is strong’. The truth of (1) does not entail that there exists an utterance u such that Lois produced u and u″ and u samesay one another. So, even if one can give an adequate account of when two utterances samesay one another without presupposing a common meaning or proposition they are both related to, one's work in defending the paratactic account as an account of belief sentences (and other propositional attitude reporting sentences) is not complete.

The natural move to make, of course, in light of this fact is to try to find another token state — a belief state, for example — whose existence is guaranteed by the truth of a sentence like (1) which can then be thought to enter into the samesaying relation to u′. Indeed, this is exactly what Lepore and Loewer 1989 suggest. But, we want to insist, problems still remain. First, even if some beliefs involve an actual episode in the believers mind of, let's say, being in a token brain state that can be said to samesay u″, there are other beliefs — implicit beliefs — for which it is simply implausible to insist that they are had because of the actual existence of a token state that is capable of entering into the samesaying relation to an utterance. It seems true to say of you that even before you read this sentence you believed that there is not a pink elephant before you. (It doesn't seem enough to say that you merely don't believe that there is a pink elephant before you, although that too is, much less problematically, true. The matter, even before you explicitly thought about it, wasn't a matter that, as it were, you left open.) But, at least prior to your reading these sentences, it seems implausible that you were in some token belief state that samesays an utterance of ‘There is not a pink elephant before that person’. So, implicit beliefs still seem to be a problem for this account. Second, recall the problem mentioned above. It is well and fine to say that a propositional attitude report involves an utterance of an embedded sentence which samesays something that that the subject of the report bears the appropriate relation to. But the proponent of the paratactic account owes an analysis of the samesaying relation that doesn't presuppose the notion of the two tokens having a common content, on pains of the view collapsing into a propositionalist view. Even if one remains hopeful that a Tarskian truth theory, properly constrained, will serve the purpose as an analysis of the meaning of utterances and then sentences, it is far from clear that one should be at all hopeful that a similar theory will serve the purpose of analyzing the content of belief, desire, and other attitude states. Prospects for the paratactic account seem dim.

There is a different proposal made by several members of the Davidsonian tradition that has come to have a larger following that, like the paratactic account, can be seen as in some key ways deriving from the simple-minded sentential accounts of the attitudes with which we began this section. The basic idea for the account derives from a claim Gilbert Harman made in his 1972 that the contents of the attitudes should be seen to be interpreted logical forms (ILFs). The idea has been worked out in more detail by Higginbotham 1991 and especially by Larson and Ludlow 1993.

The key idea is to see propositional attitude verbs as expressing relations between agents and ILFs, where an ILF is a syntactic tree structured with each of its nodes “interpreted,” or assigned semantic values. Take a simple example. (18) is the ILF associated with (5). (We assume, for simplicity, that the semantic value of a predicate is the set of individuals that it applies to.)

(5) Superman is strong.
(18) <S, true>
<NP, Superman> <VP, Superman>
<‘Superman’, Superman> <‘is strong’, set of strong things>

Even though the semantic values of all the nodes of tree structures associated with (5) and (6) are the same, their ILFs differ precisely because their LFs differ and this precisely because of the different linguistic items ‘Superman’ and ‘Clark Kent’. The account thus views the contents of propositional attitudes as being hybrids of linguistic and non-linguistic items; i.e., the expressions of the complement clauses and those expressions's semantic values. And it promises to account for the intuitive truth of (1)-(4) by distinguishing the proposition that Superman strong from the proposition that Clark Kent is strong in virtue of the difference in linguistic items.

Larson and Ludlow's paper is rich and there is no question of giving it sufficient attention. But we shall consider a number of objections that have been raised. Clapp 2002 argues that Larson and Ludlow's account violates Davidson's constraint that the truth condition of a sentence is a function of the values of its constituent syntactic units and thus, Clapp argues, the account as a whole fails to provide an account of our semantic competence. Soames appears to make a similar point in his 2002, pp. 150-2. He too argues that Larson and Ludlow's account fails when viewed as a part of the Davidsonian project of accounting for the meanings of sentences, and thus accounting for what speakers know in virtue of which they can understand arbitrary sentences with which they are competent, in terms of offering a Tarskian truth theory for the language. (Unlike Clapp, however, Soames doesn't fault the account on the grounds that it fails the constraint of extensional compositionality.)

There are problems facing the account that are independent of its fitting in with the Davidsonian project. For example, Soames argues that the very mechanisms by which Larson and Ludlow account for the consistency of (1) and (3) — namely, by distinguishing the proposition that Superman is strong from the proposition that Clark Kent is strong on the grounds that the linguistic item ‘Superman’ is distinct from the linguistic item ‘Clark Kent’ — proves problematic for other cases in which we are inclined to think that differences in the linguistic items in the complement clauses cannot lead to a difference in truth-value. One example is an application of Church's translation argument. If (1) is true, then a faithful translation of (1) into Spanish should preserve truth. (We shall follow the practice of not translating names.)

(19) Lois creen que Superman es fuerte

But, of course, the ILF associated with ‘Superman es fuerte’ is different from the ILF associated with (5), and for the very reason that the ILF associated with (6) is. But if the core of the explanation of why (1) and (3) are consistent and, more generally, why substitution fails in the case of co-referring proper names is that the substitution alters the ILF associated with the complement clause, then it would seem that the above translation, for the very same reason, should not be guaranteed to preserve truth. But it intuitively does.

Larson and Ludlow are not unaware of this problem — they consider it in §7 of their paper. However, it is far from clear that they have adequately solved it. They suggest two strategies. They don't try to work out the details for either strategy and both seem to be deeply problematic. First they suggest altering the account so that the truth of (1) does guarantee the truth of (19). This is well and good, but it has to be done in such a way that we don't loose our explanation of why (1) and (3) are consistent and why (1) doesn't entail (4). It is hard to see how to carry that combination out. Second they suggest admitting that (1) does not entail (19) and seeking to explain why (1) and (19) can nonetheless be used to report the same attitude by an auxiliary account. Again, this is well and good, but then they owe us an explanation of why we must go to such pains to explain one set of entailment intuitions semantically — namely, the intuition that (1) is consistent with (3) and so does not entail (4) — while being so cavalier about relegating other, equally (if not even more) robust entailment intuitions to a non-semantic theory? Indeed, the availability of contextualist theories described above, and in particular Richard's theory, which at least promises to respect both sets of entailment relations — that is, respect our intuitions of entailment failures, as in the Frege-style cases, as well as our intuitions about entailment successes, as in the relation between (1) and (19) — makes this second strategy all the more questionable.

Fiengo and May 1996 argue that ILF accounts have no adequate explanation of Kripke's Paderewski puzzle. (See Two Further Puzzles: Kripke's puzzles and Richard's puzzle below.) The problem, in brief, is that there seem to be sentence pairs that, like (1) and (3), intuitive are consistent but are referentially identical, but where there at least appears to be no linguistic difference between the embedded sentences. If there is no difference in linguistic items, then the ILFs are the same and so the explanation offered for why (1) and (3) are consistent cannot be carried over to Kripke's case. Ludlow 2000 offers a response, although it seems to us that he moves drastically away from the key idea of the initial proposal.

The move to ILFs as the contents of the attitudes seems to hold little promise of helping to account for propositional attitude reports.

The assumption of structured propositionalism has two components: The claim that the objects of the attitudes are propositions and the view that those items are structured. So far we have discussed various ways of denying the first of these components. We shall now turn to a discussion of views that deny the second.

Hintikka 1969, Stalnaker 1984, and Lewis 1986 are the foremost proponents of unstructured-propositionalism. (Although the latter develops, in his 1972, a version of a structured view of propositions. See the entry on structured propositions for further details.) Briefly, the idea is that propositions are sets of possible worlds. The proposition that Bush is president, for example, just is the set of all possible worlds in which Bush instantiates the property being president. (Or, to remain neutral on issues of the metaphysics of transworld identity, all the worlds in which Bush or a counterpart of Bush instantiates that property.)

There is no denying that a proposition determines a set of possible worlds — namely, the worlds in which the proposition is true. And for a good many semantic purposes — in particular, for giving the truth-conditions of sentences other than attitude sentences — treating propositions as sets of worlds suffices. But there are well known problems with this account when it comes to propositional attitudes. The most famous problem is the problem of equivalence. Intuitively, the proposition that arithmetic is incomplete is distinct from the proposition that 2+2=4. My son knows the latter and can't even entertain the former. But, as both propositions are true in exactly the same set of worlds — namely, all, assuming the necessity of mathematical truths — unstructured-propositionalism entails that they are the same proposition. Indeed, unstructured propositionalism entails that there is exactly one necessary proposition. This is problematic, as it entails that my son believes that 2+2=4 just in case he believes that arithmetic is incomplete.

The view also seems to have all of the problems that face the neo-Russellianism. Because Superman is Clark Kent and assuming that identity is necessary, the set of worlds in which Superman is strong is exactly the set of worlds in which Clark Kent is strong. But then (5) and (6) express the same proposition. But, as the Frege case shows, there is a strong intuition, and a pair of powerful arguments to back it up, that an agent can believe the one without believing the other. Proponents of unstructured-propositionalism are well aware of these problems. Stalnaker 1984, 1987, and 1988 contain extremely ingenious attempts to solve them.

Whereas proponents of possible world semantics see the contents of the attitudes being possible worlds, or functions from possible worlds to truth values, proponents of situation semantics, developed by Barwise and Perry 1983, see the contents of the attitudes being portions of possible worlds, situations. Situations are more fine-grained than possible worlds and so avoid some of the problems discussed above. But, as Soames shows in his 1985 critique of situation semantics, the account inherits many of the problems. We shall here discuss just one. Recall that one of the problems facing naive Russellianism was that

Lois believes that Superman is stronger than Clark Kent.

threatens to entail

Lois believes that Superman is stronger than Superman.

which in turn threatens to entail

Lois believes that Superman is stronger than himself.

Because the situation that Superman is stronger than Clark Kent just is the situation that Superman is stronger than himself, these are the same beliefs. The situation semanticist cannot appeal to the difference between the property of being taller than Superman and the property being taller than oneself, as the neo-Russellian can, to distinguish the properties. This is because a difference in structure doesn't correspond, for the situation semanticist, in a difference in proposition. But then the situation semanticists, as opposed to the naive Russellian, is committed to the claim that Lois believes that Superman is stronger than himself. But surely that is irrational!

We don't claim to have established the assumption of structured propositionalism. But the problems facing the alternatives do seem daunting enought to make that assumption a good bet.

8. Ambiguity theories

Ambiguity theories share many features of the contextualist theories described above. Consideration of such views is useful, even if we find the views ultimately unsatisfactory.

First let's consider the view that ‘believes’ is ambiguous. In one use, the verb is used to relate us to a Fregean proposition, a way of representing the world. On the other use, it relates us to a Russellian proposition or state of affairs, something that has individuals, properties, relations, etc., as contituents.

When there is an ambiguity, usually the most useful thing is to introduce two terms, one for each of the two different meanings involved. Thus, for a time, let's introduce ‘accept’ and ‘doxate’. Since it is natural to say that we ‘accept’ sentences and other sentence-like representations, let us extend this usage to say that we ‘accept’ Fregean thoughts, which include modes of presentation of individuals. By contrast, let us say that we ‘doxate’ Russellian propositions. For example, using quoted sentences to refer to Fregean thoughts:

(20) Lois Lane accepts ‘Superman is strong’.

(21) Lois does not accept ‘Superman is not strong’.

(22) Lois accepts ‘Clark Kent is not strong’.

(23) Lois does not accept ‘Clark Kent is strong’.

(24) Lois doxates the Russelian proposition that Clark Kent is strong. (Because of (1).)

(25) Lois doxates the Russellian proposition that Clark Kent is not strong. (Because of (3).)

It is natural to hold that there are two standards of consistency. One applies to sentences, according to which the sentences ‘Superman is strong’ and ‘Clark Kent is not strong’ are consistent. Nothing in the form of the sentences rules out the possibility that both are true. There is nothing about the use of negation that would create inconsistency between the quoted sentences within (20) and (22), in the way that it does for the quoted sentences within (20) and (21). The Russellian propositions that the quoted sentences in (20) and (22) express, on the other hand, are propositionally inconsistent. They cannot both be true. That cannot be seen just by inspecting the sentences that express those propositions; one must also know the co-reference relations among the terms used. Thus the sentences that Lois accepts are consistent (by the first standard), but the Russellian propositions that she doxates in virtue of accepting those sentences (in the world we imagine for her story) are inconsistent. Because ‘Superman’ and ‘Clark Kent’ refer to the same individual, the two sentences that Lois accepts express Russellian propositions that cannot both be true.

The puzzles that arise when we consider the question of whether Lois has consistent beliefs can at least be addressed if we instead ask about what she accepts and about what she doxates, for use of these two terms helps to make it clear that two standards of consistency apply. One standard applies to the form of the sentences accepted, without taking account of co-reference relations among terms, and the other considers the content of terms and applies to Russellian objects of doxation. The sentences she accepts are consistent by the first standard — they are the kinds of sentences that could be used to express propositions that are both true, and Lois has no reason to believe that that is not the case in the current situation. She is wrong, however, because these sentences express propositions that cannot both be true. By identifying an ambiguity, we provide resources for an answer to the vexing puzzles.

Some philosophers have connected the de dicto/de re distinction with such an ambiguity in ‘believes’. That view, though, has many difficulties, and the de dicto -de re terminology is used in other ways, to mark distinctions among beliefs or distinctions among belief attributions. Rather than trying to sort out different interpretations of that terminology, though, let's stick with the invented disambiguating verbs ‘accept’ and ‘doxate’, briefly, for heuristic purposes. (Interested readers may pursue a more in-depth discussion in the supplementary document on the de re/de dicto distinction, op. cit..)

The ambiguity theory of belief attribution has a certain appeal. In ordinary cases of belief attribution, the sentence attributing the belief can do both things at once. It can indicate the Russellian proposition that is the object of doxation, and it can indicate the sentence (or sentence-like representation) that is accepted by the believer. (When you say, “Alice believes that George Eliot was a great novelist”, you indicate the way that Alice represents the novelist and the individual her belief is about.) Those are paradigm cases of the use of ‘believes’. Treating ‘believes’ as univocal, however, would leave us with a problem in cases like Lois's, where we need to say different things about acceptance and doxation. (For example, regarding what she accepts, she is epistemically in the clear. Her view meets the appropriate standard of consistency. However, the propositions that she doxates are inconsistent. And she rejects certain sentences that express propositions that she doxates (such as (2) and (4)).)

The situation with ‘believes’, on this view, is something like the situation with ‘is heavier than’ as ordinarily used. That expression could be talking about greater weight or greater mass. Ordinarily it doesn't matter; we can express both propositions at the same time, since for the most part their truth-conditions vary together. (We can have polysemy, where the two meanings are simultaneously expressed, not just ambiguity.) But if we are comparing objects that are on different planets, or even at very different elevations on this planet, then we will have to make it clear whether we are concerned with mass or weight. Similarly, we can often indicate what is accepted and what is doxated, but in some situations we cannot do both, and so we must make it clear which we are concerned with. We can make it clear by employing the language of acceptance and doxation instead of the language of belief.

This first ambiguity view, then, just claims that believes’ is ambiguous (in the way that ‘is heavier than’ is ambiguous) and that the ambiguity can be resolved by recognizing the two different things that are ordinarily captured in successful belief attributions. The strategy suggested here is the ordinary one for dealing with an ambiguity; we find or invent two terms and stipulate which will go with each of the meanings. Thus we might firmly stipulate that ‘is heavier than’ will be associated with weight comparisons and introduce ‘has more mass than’ for comparisons of mass.

Ultimately such a strategy will not work for ‘believes’ however, because the situation is more complicated. Some belief attributions involve sentences that use one singular term in a purely referential way but use other terms in a way that seems to require getting the mode of representation right. For example, it could be that Lois spots a man walking in the corridor, and makes a height judgment that leads her to say two things:

He is taller than Superman.

He is not taller than Clark Kent.

I might recognize the man in question as Rudy Sanchez, someone known to me and the people I am speaking to, but unknown to Lois (outside of the brief sighting in the corridor). I can then make these attributions:

Lois believes that Rudy Sanchez is taller than Superman.

Lois believes that Rudy Sanchez is not taller than Clark Kent.

Is this acceptance or doxation? It seems that it must be both, because the name ‘Rudy Sanchez’ is not being used to indicate Lois's mode of representation of the individual, but the names ‘Superman’ and ‘Clark Kent’ are (according to a theorist who might find this ambiguity theory attractive). With the following pair, where Rudy Sanchez is the speaker, the situation is perhaps even clearer.

Lois believes that I am taller than Superman.

Lois believes that I am not taller than Clark Kent.

This cannot be an ambiguity located in the verb ‘believes’ after all. Our intuitions support the idea that there are two different kinds of uses of singular terms (de re and de dicto) in belief attributions, but that will not divide belief attributions into the de re and de dicto, because names being used in different ways can occur in a single attribution.

Edward N. Zalta (1983, 2001) has suggested a different approach that involves ambiguity in belief attributions.

9. Two further puzzles: Kripke's puzzles and Richard's puzzle

We have concluded our survey of the main accounts of propositional attitude reports and their problems. The discussion has focused on Frege's puzzle. In this section we shall briefly discuss two further, related sets of puzzles that any account of propositional attitude ascribing sentences must deal with. The first is a pair of puzzles that Saul Kripke introduced in his 1979 and the second is a puzzle Richard introduced in his 1983.

In his 1980 (originally presented as a series of lectures in 1970) Kripke argued, among many other things, that the reference of a name is not determined by identifying descriptions a speaker associates with the name but rather by real world causal connections between uses of names and objects in the world. In so arguing Kripke, among others, paved the way for the now widely (although not universally) accepted direct reference theory of proper names. He also ran flat into Frege's puzzle. In his 1980, Kripke simply says that he does not know what to say about Frege's puzzle and the related puzzle of cognitive significance, on the one hand, and the problem of negative existentials and the related problem of empty names, on the other. In his unpublished John Locke lectures of 1973, delivered three years after his famous Naming and Necessity lectures, Kripke addresses the second set of problems; in his 1979, he addresses the first. Kripke's focus was on Frege's puzzle in particular. His aim was to show that his thesis of names, which he admitted seems to entail the substitution of co-referring proper names within the scope of attitude verbs is legitimate, is not the true source of the problems discussed in “Frege's puzzle” above, because, Kripke argued, those same problems can be replicated without assuming Kripke's thesis about names. He presents two sets of cases to convince us of this claim.

The first case involves a monolingual (French-speaking) Frenchman — Kripke names him ‘Pierre’ — who hears about a city under the name ‘Londres’ while in France. Pierre forms a good opinion of the city based on what he hears of it (again, all in French) and is disposed to utter (26) below.

(26) Londres est jolie.

Pierre is competent and reflective, we can suppose, and so, by an application of the (French version of the) disquotation principle, we get (27) below.

(27) Pierre croit que Londres est jolie.

Kripke then employs a translation principle, according to which a good translation of a sentence from one language into another preserves the truth-value of the original. (28) below is a good English translation of (27).

(28) Pierre believes that London is pretty.

So, like (27), (28) is also true. Suppose next that Pierre moves to a foreign land where he learns the native tongue by immersion; he doesn't learn the translation of any of the words in his new language into French. He is confined to a rather dreary party of the city he lives in and comes to believe of it that it is not pretty. The foreign land, of course, is London and the language he learns is English. He is soon disposed to assent to (29).

(29) London is not pretty.

Now Pierre has become quite fluent in English. We can suppose that he is as competent as any monolingual English speaker. We are then justified in using the disquotation principle to derive (30) below.

(30) Pierre believes that London is not pretty.

We can go further. Suppose that Pierre not only remains neutral on whether or not (31) below is true but that he positively rejects it.

(31) London is pretty.

Then, given the converse disquotation principle, we get (32).

(32) Pierre does not believe that London is pretty.

We can suppose that Pierre is all the while still disposed to assent to (26); Pierre has not, we can suppose, changed his mind about what he believed about that foreign city he learned about in France under the name ‘Londres’.

It should be apparent that we now have the same set of contradictions we derived earlier in “Frege's puzzle.” Because both (28) and (30) are true of Pierre at the same time and they appear to involve attribution to Pierre of belief in a proposition and its negation, it would seem that Pierre is irrational. But this contradicts the supposition that Pierre is free of irrationality in his beliefs. (28) and (32) seem to be, themselves, incompatible; and yet we derived them both from our principles and rather innocent assumptions. Because we nowhere assumed the thesis of direct reference or relied on any substitution principle seemingly entailed by the thesis of direct reference, Kripke concludes that simply denying the thesis of direct reference is not sufficient for solving original Frege puzzle. After all, we get the very same set of problems without that thesis.

The puzzle of Pierre relies upon a translation principle. But, lest one think that merely denying that translation principle suffices to solve Kripke's puzzle, Kripke presents another version of the puzzle that does not involve translations across languages. This second puzzle has come to be known as “the Paderewski puzzle.” Suppose that Peter has had interactions with a politician he knows under the name ‘Paderewski’ and interactions with a pianist he knows under the name ‘Paderewski’. Peter has no idea that Paderewski-the-politician is the same person as Paderewski-the-pianist; he thinks that they are two different people who happen to have the same name, or at least names that are pronounced the same. From this assumption, we can see that we could employ disquotation, rationality, and converse disquotation to derive a set of contradictions similar to those involving Lois.

Notice that the puzzle here is not that of belief but that of belief attributions. So, for example, Taschek 1988 is quite right to observe that, no doubt, Peter possesses two separate modes of presentation of Paderewski under which he believes of him what he does. But this observation in itself does not solve Kripke's puzzle, especially if we think that the public language name ‘Paderewski’ is univocal, at least when tied to the relevant Paderewski, as it were, and that Peter is speaking the public language. (I don't think that Taschek would disagree. He offers solutions to the problem Kripke's puzzles raise for attitude attributions in his 1997, 1998.) This is not to say that the puzzle is intractable — indeed, there have been many attempted solutions to both of Kripke's puzzles; see, for example, Bach 1997, Bealer 1993, Crimmins 1992a, Crimmins and Perry 1989, Forbes 1990, Lewis 1981, Recanati 1993, Richard 1990, Salmon 1995a, Sosa 1996. Rather, it is to say that in order to tract it, one must give an account of propositional attitude ascriptions. Any adequate account of propositional attitude ascriptions must account for what is going on in Kripke-style cases.

In his 1983, Mark Richard introduced us to a puzzle that seems to show that apparent substitution-failure is not confined to failures inside the scope of attitude verbs. Let us describe the case and then explain the seeming moral further. Suppose Sally is talking to Bill on the phone when she looks out the window and sees a steamroller heading towards an occupied phone booth. Sally doesn't realize that the person in the phone booth is Bill. Let's consider the belief ascribing sentences Sally would accept of herself. She would be disposed to accept (33) below but reject (34).

(33) I believe that he [pointing out her window at the person in the phone booth] is in danger.

(34) I believe that you [addressing Bill on the phone] are in danger.

So far, nothing too surprising; so far, that is, we just have a classic Frege-style case. But let's continue the story. Sally decides to try to catch the attention of the person in the phone booth to warn him of the impending danger. She leans out her window and waves her arms madly, screaming at the top of her lungs. Bill sees someone waving and yelling at him, comes to believe that that person believes of him that he is in danger (although, as he quickly looks around, not seeing the steamroller, can't imagine why), but doesn't realize that it is Sally waving her arms. He says to Sally over the phone, “There's someone waving to me and she believes that I am in danger.” Sally believes what he says and so is disposed to accept (35) below.

(35) The person waving at you [addressing Bill on the phone] believes that you [addressing Bill on the phone] are in danger.

Now, of course, Sally is the person waving at Bill and so (34) and (35) seem to ascribe the same belief to the same person. Notice that the terms referring to Sally (namely, ‘I’ in (34) and ‘the person waving at you’ in (35)) are outside the scope of ‘believes’. (35), it would seem, is intuitively true. But then how could (34) be false?

In 1983, Richard thought that this case showed that our apparent substitution-failure intuitions should be explained pragmatically and not semantically; otherwise, he thought, we have substitution-failures outside the scope of attitude verbs which is evidently unacceptable. In their 1989, Crimmins and Perry accept this consequence, claiming that there are substitution-failures even outside the scope of attitude verbs. But, they claim, such failures are limited to self-attributions like (35), because of what the call “the pragmatic principle of utterance of ‘I believe that …t…’ provides (or, is about) the notion that is connected to the speaker's use of ‘t’.” (p. 708). However, the use of the first-person pronoun in constructing the case is unnecessary. All one needs to construct a Richard-style case is for the ascribers to be ignorant of the identities of the agents they are ascribing beliefs to. (Recall the case described above as proving problematic for Richard's 1990 account of ‘believes’.) One can then use nothing but third-person means of designating the alleged believers and get the same intuitive variation in truth-values. Crimmins and Perry's hope that such substitution-failures will be confined to cases involving the first-person pronoun is ill-founded. Hence, if one is simply going to accept the consequence that there are substitution failures even outside the scope of the attitude verb, then one will have to accept that consequence in an unrestricted form.

Richard himself has responded to his own argument in his 1990. Richard appeals to the idea of context-shifts. He claims that when we judge (34) to be false, we are evaluating it relative to a context c such that, were we to evaluate (35) relative to c as well we would see that (34) too is false. When, on the other hand, we judge that (35) is true, we are evaluating it relative to a context c′ such that, were we to evaluate (34) relative to c′ as well we would see that (34) too is true. So, claims Richard, our intuitions turn on shifting the context. If we focus on a single context, we see that there are no substitution failures; or at least none outside the scope of the attitude verb.

This strategy works only if the only circumstances in which we can generate the intuitive judgment that a sentence like (35) is true while its mate (34) is false are circumstances in which it is plausible to posit a context-shift. In Kripke cases, where the attributor is conscious of the misidentification, this is highly plausible. In those cases, the speaker will be conscious of 'London', for example, coming to represent Pierre's "Londres"-beliefs as opposed to his "London"-beliefes she previously used it to represent; the speaker, we can say, is in control of the shift in context. But in Richard's case, the speaker need not be conscious of the misidentification and hence will in no way recognize, as it were, any need to shift the context. She will take her utterances of (35) and (34) to be part of a single communicative exchange in which no context shifts have been needed. A theorist might insist that context shifts in the representational powers of words occur any way, but there may well be reason to balk at this. It is worth noting how very different the Richard case is from other cases in which there are context-shifts outside the speaker's control, such as when a speaker intends her use of 'today' to pick out the same day as her previous use, not realizing that it has turned, say, from 11:59 to 12:01 between her utterances. At the very least we can say that the success of Richard's strategy to explain his steamroller cases is held hostage by an account of context-shifts.

Kripke's puzzle of Pierre and Paderewski and Richard's puzzle, like Frege's puzzle, provide more data that any adequate account of attitude ascribing sentences must accommodate. Ultimately, that account must fit with a broader theory of human interaction. People communicate their beliefs, they agree when they share a belief, and beliefs play a role in motivating and explaining action. Any account of belief attributions must say how these attributions can accurately reflect these many roles.


Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

anaphora | descriptions | Frege, Gottlob | implicature | indexicals | intensional transitive verbs | intentionality | propositions: singular | propositions: structured | Quine, Willard van Orman | reference | Russell, Bertrand