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Lady Anne Conway

First published Thu Feb 13, 2003; substantive revision Tue Jan 23, 2007

Lady Anne Conway (nee Anne Finch) was one of a tiny minority of seventeenth-century women who was able to pursue an interest in philosophy. She was associated with the Cambridge Platonists, particularly Henry More (1614-1687). Her only surviving treatise, Principles of the Most Ancient and Modern Philosophy, was published posthumously and anonymously in 1690. This propounds an ontology of spirit, derived from the attributes of God, which she sets out in opposition to More, Descartes, Hobbes and Spinoza. Her concept of the monad, which is indebted to the Kabbalism, anticipates Leibniz.

1. Life

Lady Anne Conway (née Finch) (1631-1679) was the posthumous daughter of Sir Heneage Finch and his second wife Elizabeth Cradock, widow of Sir John Bennet. She was born in London in 1631, and raised in the house now known as Kensington Palace, which then belonged to the Finch family. The youngest child in a large family, she was especially close to her half-brother, John Finch. Nothing is known of her education, though she was clearly well-read by the time she made the acquaintance of one of the Cambridge Platonists, Henry More (1614-1687). Of Anne Conway's remarkable philosophical education, much more is known. Thanks to her brother, who was his pupil at Christ's College, University of Cambridge, More agreed to give her instruction in philosophy. Since, as a woman, she was debarred from attending the university, he instructed her by letter. The few letters that survive from this early correspondence indicate that Cartesianism formed the basis of the course of instruction she followed. Thereafter, Anne Conway and More remained friends for the rest of her life. By this means she had a permanent link to intellectual life beyond the confines of her domestic situation.

In 1651 Anne Conway married Edward, third Viscount Conway, who was heir to estates in Warwickshire and County Antrim in Ireland. Their one child, Heneage, died in infancy. The Conway family possessed one of the finest private libraries of the period, and her husband appears to have encouraged his wife's intellectual interests. However, from her teens she suffered from periodic bouts of illness, which became more acute and more frequent as she got older. It was as a result of a search for relief from this that she came into contact with the Flemish physician and philosopher, Francis Mercury van Helmont, son of the iatrochemist, Jan Baptiste van Helmont. During the last decade of her life, the younger Van Helmont lived in her household. It was through Van Helmont that Anne Conway was introduced to kabalistic thought and to Quakerism. These encounters resulted in radical new departures for her: on the one hand, her study of the Jewish kabbalah contributed to her decisive break with the Cartesianism of her philosophical upbringing; on the other hand, her encounter with Van Helmont's Quaker friends led to her conversion to Quakerism, shortly before she died in 1679.

2. Philosophy

Anne Conway is known to be the author of a single treatise of philosophy. This was written at the end of her life and published anonymously in Amsterdam in 1690 in a Latin translation with the title, Principia philosophiae antiquissimae et recentissimae. It was translated back into English and printed in London in 1692 as The Principles of the Most Ancient and Modern Philosophy. The other source for her philosophical activities is her correspondence with Henry More.

Anne Conway's treatise is a work of Platonist metaphysics in which she derives her system of philosophy from the existence and attributes of God. The framework of Conway's system is a tripartite ontological hierarchy of ‘species’, the highest of which is God, the source of all being. Christ, or ‘middle nature’, links God and the third species, called ‘Creature’. God as the most perfect being is infinitely good, wise and just. A principle of likeness links God and creation. Since God is good and just, his creation too is good and just. Created substance, like God, consists of spirit, but, unlike God, is constituted of particles called monads. All created substance is living, capable of motion and perception Anne Conway denies the existence of material body as such, arguing that inert corporeal substance would contradict the nature of God, who is life itself. Incorporeal created substance is, however, differentiated from the divine, principally on account of its mutability and multiplicity even so, the infinite number and constant mutability of created monads constitute an obverse reflection of the unity, infinity, eternity and unchangeableness of God. The continuum between God and creatures is made possible through ‘middle nature’, an intermediary being, through which God communicates life, action, goodness and justice. ‘Middle nature’, partakes of the nature of both God and creation, and is therefore both a bridge and a buffer between God and created things. Thus, although she conceives of created substance as a continuum, and understands mutability as capacity for increased perfection, she sought to avoid the charge of pantheism. The spiritual perfectionism of Anne Conway's system has dual aspect: metaphysical and moral. On the one hand all things are capable of becoming more spirit-like, that is, more refined qua spiritual substance. At the same time, all things are capable of increased goodness. She explains evil as a falling away from the perfection of God, and understands suffering as part of a longer term process of spiritual recovery. She denies the eternity of hell, since for God to punish finite wrong-doing with infinite and eternal hell punishment would be manifestly unjust and therefore a contradiction of the divine nature. Instead she explains pain and suffering as purgative, with the ultimate aim of restoring creatures to moral and metaphysical perfection. Anne Conway's system is thus not just an ontology and but a theodicy.

Anne Conway presents her system as an answer to the dominant philosophies of her time. Several chapters of her treatise are devoted to a refutation of the dualism of Henry More, and Descartes. (She does, however, express her admiration for Descartes' physics). She also takes issue with Hobbes and Spinoza, whom she charges with material pantheism, which confounds God and created substance. Anne Conway's concept of substance probably owes much to Platonism and Kabbalism (which, in the version she encountered was heavily Platonised). Her thinking also shows the impact of the teachings of the heterodox Christian theologian, Origen, who was much admired by her teacher, Henry More. As a theodicy and monadology, her system anticipates the philosophy of Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz, who owned a copy of her treatise (probably a gift to him by their mutual friend, Van Helmont), and who received her work favourably. However, although she was unusual as a female philosopher of the seventeenth century, by virtue of the fact that her philosophy achieved publication, the anonymity of her work has ensured that she has suffered the same neglect that has been the lot of most pre-modern female philosophers.


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Cambridge Platonists | Descartes, René | Hobbes, Thomas | Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm | More, Henry | Spinoza, Baruch