Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.


First published Wed Sep 16, 2009

Delusions are a symptom of psychiatric disorders such as dementia and schizophrenia, and they also characterize delusional disorders. Here are two short case descriptions of delusions: the former example is a report of erotomania, the delusion that one is loved by someone of higher status (e.g., often a celebrity); the latter example is a report of Cotard delusion, the delusion that one is dead.

She realized he was empty without her and was pursuing her, but enemies were preventing them from uniting. The enemies included a number of people: people in her family, her classmates, neighbours and many other persons who were plotting to keep them apart. She knew that her conclusions were accurate because he would send messages to her proving his love. These messages would often present themselves as the license plates on cars of a certain state, the color purple and other indications that she received from the environment that proved to her that he loved her (Jordan et al. 2006, p. 787)

She repeatedly stated that she was dead and was adamant that she had died two weeks prior to the assessment (i.e. around the time of her admission on 19/11/2004). She was extremely distressed and tearful as she related these beliefs, and was very anxious to learn whether or not the hospital she was in, was ‘heaven’. When asked how she thought she had died, LU replied ‘I don't know how. Now I know that I had a flu and came here on 19th November. Maybe I died of the flu.’ Interestingly, LU also reported that she felt ‘a bit strange towards my boyfriend. I cannot kiss him, it feels strange—although I know that he loves me.’ (McKay and Cipolotti 2007, p. 353)

As in some cases of erotomania, the content of a delusion can be mundane, and does not even need to be false: one can have the delusion that one's spouse is unfaithful or that one's neighbor is a terrorist, and these may turn out to be true beliefs. As in the Cotard delusion, the content of a delusion can be bizarre. Here are some other examples: mirrored self misidentification is the delusion that the person in the mirror is not one's reflection but a stranger, and the Capgras delusion is the delusion that the spouse or a relative has been replaced by an impostor. All types of delusions are rigid to some extent, that is, they are not easily given up because they tend to resist counterevidence. All delusions are reported sincerely and with conviction, although the behavior of people with delusions is not always perfectly consistent with the content of their delusions. People who have delusions of persecution and believe that they are followed by malevolent others live in a state of great anxiety and can give up their jobs and move cities as a result. Other delusions do not significantly impact on people's behavior: hospital patients may say that the nurses are trying to poison them, but do not stop eating their meals.

Here, I can only start addressing some of the philosophical debates centered on delusions. In section one, I offer an overview of the philosophical significance of delusions. In section two, I introduce the issues surrounding the controversial definition of delusions, and then explain some of the common distinctions between types of delusions. In section three, I discuss the most prominent theoretical approaches to the nature and the formation of delusions and highlight the conceptual questions emerging from such approaches. In section four, I review three of the most discussed themes in the philosophical literature on delusions: whether delusions are irrational; whether they are beliefs; and to what extent they overlap with cases of self-deception. The examination of these issues often culminates in the attempt to defend or challenge the thesis that delusions are continuous with non-pathological beliefs.

1. The Philosophical Significance of Delusion

In recent years, delusions have attracted the attention of philosophers in at least three distinct areas. I briefly summarize the general issues that have been addressed, and then offer some examples of specific debates for each of these areas.

1.1 Delusions in the philosophy of mind and the philosophy of psychology

In the philosophy of mind and the philosophy of psychology, there have been various attempts to understand the cognitive processes responsible for the formation of delusions, based on the assumption, widely shared in cognitive neuropsychology, that understanding such processes can lead to the formulation of more empirically sound theories of normal cognition (see Marshall and Halligan 1996, pp. 5–6; Langdon and Coltheart 2000, pp. 185–6). For instance, let's assume that delusions are pathological beliefs. How do they come about? Do people form delusional beliefs as a response to bizarre experiences? Do they form delusional beliefs because they suffer from some reasoning deficit? A detailed account of the formation of delusions can help flesh out the details of the formation of non-pathological beliefs.

As the above questions already suggest, the study of delusions raises conceptual questions about intentionality, and about the relationship between intentionality, rationality and self-knowledge. Moreover, it invites us to reconsider the interaction between perception, cognition, and intentional behavior (see Campbell 2001). One basic question is what comes first, the experience or the belief: are delusions bizarre convictions that alter one's way of seeing the world, or are they hypotheses formulated to account for some unusual experiences, and then endorsed as beliefs? Another debated issue is whether delusions should be characterized as beliefs at all, given that they present significant deviations from norms of rationality, and are often neither consistent with a person's beliefs nor responsive to the available evidence (see Bayne and Pacherie 2005 for a defense of the doxastic nature of delusions).

Another recent strand of investigation in this area concerns the possible failures of self knowledge exhibited by people with delusions. There are several manifestations of poor knowledge of the self in delusions: people reporting delusions of passivity may not recognize a movement or a thought as their own, and thus have a distorted sense of their personal boundaries (e.g., Stephens and Graham 2000); people with delusions may act or feel in a way that is incompatible with the content of their delusions, or be unable to endorse the content of their delusion with reasons that are regarded by others as good reasons (e.g., Bortolotti and Broome 2008); finally, people reporting delusions may encounter difficulties in remembering their experienced past and in projecting themselves into the future, because they construct unreliable self narratives (e.g., Gerrans 2009).

1.2 Delusions in the philosophy of psychiatry

In addition to the literature on the etiology of delusions and their status as beliefs, there is also a growing literature in the philosophy of psychiatry on other aspects of the nature of delusions and on the impact of delusions on people's mental health. This literature aims at addressing the conceptualization of delusional experience and of delusional beliefs in the wider context of psychiatric research and clinical practice, without neglecting the very practical and urgent problems that mental health professionals and clients need to face in the diagnosis and treatment of delusions. More general debates in the philosophy of psychiatry are often applied to schizophrenia and to delusional disorders, such as the difficulty in describing psychiatric disorders as natural kinds, and the difficulty in providing a justification for the divide between the normal and the pathological. In these debates, delusions play an important role. For instance, philosophers ask whether ‘delusion’ is a natural kind (e.g., Samuels 2009) and whether there is a principled and value-free way to distinguish clinical delusions from delusional ideas that are widespread in normal cognition, such as religious beliefs about divine revelation or paranoid beliefs (e.g., Fulford 2004).

There are at least five possible answers to what makes delusions pathological:

  1. Delusions are pathological because they present themselves as what they are not. They resemble beliefs but are not beliefs, because they do not share some of the core features of beliefs such as action guidance, and are irrational to a higher degree than or in a qualitatively different way from irrational beliefs (for a discussion of aspects of this view, see Currie and Jureidini 2001 and Frankish 2009).

  2. Delusions are pathological not because they provide inaccurate descriptions of a person's experience, but because they are signs that the person inhabits a fictional, non-actual reality and no longer shares some fundamental beliefs and practices with the people around her (for different versions of this view, see Stephens and Graham 2004 and 2006; Sass 1994; Gallagher 2009; Rhodes and Gipps 2008).

  3. Delusions are pathological because they are puzzling and unsettling – in so far as they defy folk-psychological expectations - and this feature also makes them less amenable to rationalization and interpretation (this idea is explored in Campbell 2001).

  4. Delusions are pathological because (differently from many false and irrational beliefs) they negatively affect a person's well-being in a number of ways by taking up most of her cognitive resources and causing impaired social functioning, social isolation and withdrawal (see Garety and Freeman 1999 for a multidimensional account of delusions, and Bolton 2008 for a harm-related account of mental illness in general).

  5. Delusions are pathological because of their etiology. Differently from other beliefs, they are produced by mechanisms that are dysfunctional or defective. For instance, the process of their formation may be characterized by perceptual aberrations, reasoning biases or deficits.

The challenge for (i) is to account for the difference in kind between the irrationality of common beliefs that are ungrounded and resistant to change (such as superstitious beliefs or beliefs in alien abductions) and the irrationality of delusions. There is abundance of evidence that delusional phenomena are widespread in the normal population, which suggests that a sharp dichotomy between the normal and the pathological would be a simplification (see data in Maher 1974, Johns and van Os 2001, and Bentall 2003).

Accounts in (ii) and (iii) may be plausible for some delusions that appear to defy commonsense and are accompanied by a certain type of heightened experience, but do not seem to apply equally well to more mundane delusions such as jealousy or persecution. Moreover, it is not always obvious that ascribing a delusion as a belief to someone makes the behavior of that person particularly difficult to explain or to predict.

The view described in (iv) is very attractive because it captures the distinction between delusions and irrational beliefs in terms of their effects on other aspects of a person's psychological and social life. However, using the notions of well-being and harm in accounts of delusions can be problematic, since it is possible for some people to live with the delusion in a way that is preferable to living without the delusion: ceasing to believe that one is a famous TV broadcaster after many years, and starting to accept that one has been mentally unwell instead, can cause low self esteem leading to depression and suicidal thoughts.

The etiological answer to the question why delusions are pathological in (v) needs to be better explored. So far, the consensus seems to be that reasoning biases affect normal reasoning, and are not present only in people with delusions. Perceptual aberrations can explain the formation of some delusions, but are not always a core factor in the formation of all delusions. A problem with the hypothesis evaluation system involved in the formation of beliefs may be at the origin of all delusions, but there is no agreement as to whether the problem is a permanent deficit or a performance error. Thus, etiological considerations cannot support a categorical distinction between pathological and non-pathological beliefs.

1.3 Moral psychology and neuroethics

Moral psychology and neuroethics investigate the implications of the debates on the nature of delusions in the philosophy of mind and the philosophy of psychiatry for the type of participation in the moral community to which people with delusions are entitled. This includes the attempt to understand better how people's rights and responsibilities are affected by their having delusions. For instance, it is important to determine when people with delusions no longer have the capacity to consent to being treated in a certain way, and to safeguard their interests by ensuring that they receive good care. It is also important to understand whether they can be regarded as morally responsible for their actions if they commit acts of violence or other crimes that can be motivated by their believing the content of their delusion (Broome et al. forthcoming).

As a consequence of the failures in rationality and self knowledge that may characterize people with delusions in the acute phase of their mental illness, they may appear as if they were ‘in two minds’, and they may not always present themselves as unified agents with a coherent set of beliefs and preferences (e.g., Kennett and Matthews 2009). As a result, they may be (locally or temporally) unable to exercise their capacity for autonomous thought and action.

2. The Nature of Delusion

We saw some examples of delusions, but no definition yet. How are delusions defined and classified?

2.1 Defining delusion

Commonly used definitions of delusions make explicit reference to their surface features rather than to the underlying mechanisms responsible for their formation. Surface features refer to the behavioral manifestations of the delusions, and are often described in epistemic terms, that is, their description involves the concept of belief, truth, rationality or justification (e.g., delusions are beliefs held with conviction in spite of having little empirical support). According to the Diagnostic and Statistical Manual of Mental Disorders (DSM-IV 2000, p. 765), delusions are false beliefs based on incorrect inference about external reality that persist despite evidence to the contrary:

Delusion. A false belief based on incorrect inference about external reality that is firmly sustained despite what almost everyone else believes and despite what constitutes incontrovertible and obvious proof or evidence to the contrary. The belief is not one ordinarily accepted by other members of the person's culture or subculture (e.g., it is not an article of religious faith). When a false belief involves a value judgment, it is regarded as a delusion only when the judgment is so extreme as to defy credibility.

Philosophers interested in the nature of delusions ask demarcation questions: how can we tell delusions apart from other pathologies involving cognitive impairments or deficits? How can we distinguish delusions from non-pathological, but similarly false or unjustified beliefs? These questions aim at capturing both what is distinctive about delusions, and what makes them pathological. If we were to look for necessary and sufficient conditions for delusions in the DSM-IV definition, we would be disappointed.

Delusions are generally accepted to be beliefs which (a) are held with great conviction; (b) defy rational counter-argument; (c) and would be dismissed as false or bizarre by members of the same socio-cultural group. A more precise definition is probably impossible since delusions are contextually dependent, multiply determined and multidimensional. Examplars of the delusion category that fulfil all the usual definitional attributes are easy to find, so it would be premature to abandon the construct entirely. Equally, in everyday practice there are patients we regard as deluded whose beliefs in isolation may not meet standard delusional criteria. In this way a delusion is more like a syndrome than a symptom. (Gilleen and David 2005, pp. 5–6)

Counterexamples can be found to the DSM-IV definition of delusion: there are delusions that do not satisfy all of the proposed criteria, and there are irrational beliefs that do, even though they are not commonly regarded as delusional. Coltheart summarizes the main problems with the definition:

1. Couldn't a true belief be a delusion, as long as the believer had no good reason for holding the belief? 2. Do delusions really have to be beliefs — might they not instead be imaginings that are mistaken for beliefs by the imaginer? 3. Must all delusions be based on inference? 4. Aren't there delusions that are not about external reality? ‘I have no bodily organs’ or ‘my thoughts are not mine but are inserted into my mind by others’ are beliefs expressed by some people with schizophrenia, yet are not about external reality; aren't these nevertheless still delusional beliefs? 5. Couldn't a belief held by all members of one's community still be delusional? (Coltheart 2007, p. 1043)

In so far as delusions are described as irrational beliefs, it is difficult for them to be uniquely identified because their epistemic ‘faults’ are shared with other symptoms of pathological conditions, and with many non-pathological beliefs. But definitions such as the one in the DSM-IV serve to guide further research into the phenomenon of delusions by conveniently delimitating an area of investigation worth pursuing. Moreover, the criteria in the DSM-IV are diagnostically useful. A widespread critique of the DSM-IV definition is that not enough weight is given to the consequences of having the delusion for the well-being of the person reporting it. Some recent definitions of delusion make more explicit reference to “disrupted functioning”:

A person is deluded when they have come to hold a particular belief with a degree of firmness that is both utterly unwarranted by the evidence at hand, and that jeopardises their day-to-day functioning. (McKay et al. 2005a, p. 315)

Freeman (2008, pp. 24–26) highlights the multi-dimensional nature of delusions and lists among the main characteristics of delusions not just that delusions are unfounded, firmly held, and resistant to change, but also that they are preoccupying and distressing, and that they interfere with the social dimension of a person's life.

2.2 Types of delusion

2.2.1 Functional versus organic

Delusions used to be divided into functional and organic. Now the distinction is regarded by most obsolete, at least in its original characterization. A delusion was called ‘organic’ if it was the result of brain damage (usually due to injuries affecting the right cerebral hemisphere). A delusion was called ‘functional’ if it had no known organic cause and was explained primarily via psychodynamic or motivational factors. It has become more and more obvious with the development of neuropsychiatry that the two categories overlap. Today, the received view is that there is a biological basis for all types of delusions, but that in some cases it has not been identified with precision yet. Some studies have reported very little difference between the phenomenology and symptomatology of delusions that were once divided into organic and functional (Johnstone et al. 1988).

2.2.2 Monothematic versus polythematic

As we saw, in persecutory delusions, people believe that they are followed and treated with hostility, and that others want to harm them. In delusions of mirrored-self misidentification, people usually preserve the capacity to recognize images in the mirror as reflections, but do not recognize their own face reflected in the mirror and come to think that there is a person in the mirror, a stranger who looks very much like they do. In either case, the delusion is resistant to counterevidence and has pervasive effects on one's life. One of the differences is that persecutory delusions are polythematic, that is, they extend to more than one theme, where the themes can be interrelated. Delusions of mirrored-self misidentification are monothematic, and apart from the content of delusion itself, no other (unrelated) bizarre belief needs to be reported by the same person. Thus, a person who systematically fails to recognize her image in the mirror and comes to think that there is a person identical to her following her around (as in mirrored-self misidentification), but has no other unusual beliefs, has a monothematic delusion. Other examples of monothematic delusions often referred to in the philosophical literature are Capgras and Cotard. The Capgras delusion involves the belief that a dear one (a close relative or the spouse) has been replaced by an impostor. The Cotard delusion involves the belief that one is disembodied or dead. Delusions of persecution are very common polythematic delusions. A person who believes that she is surrounded by alien forces and that they control her own actions and are slowly taking over people's bodies might have a number of different delusions (persecution and alien control). These delusions are interrelated and are manifest in the interpretation of most events occurring in the person's life. Other examples of delusions that affect many aspects of one's cognitive life are the belief that one is a genius but is often misunderstood by others (grandeur), and the belief that one is loved by a famous or powerful person (erotomania).

2.2.3 Circumscribed versus elaborated

Monothematic delusions tend to be circumscribed whereas polythematic delusions tend to be elaborated (see Davies and Coltheart 2000 for more detailed explanation and examples). The distinction between circumscribed and elaborated delusions is relevant to the level of integration between delusions and a person's other intentional states and to the extent to which the person's endorsement of the delusion is manifested in verbal reports and observable behavior. Delusions might be more or less circumscribed. A delusion is circumscribed if it does not lead to the formation of other intentional states whose content is significantly related to the content of the delusion, nor does it have pervasive effects on the behavior of the person reporting the delusion. For instance, a person with Capgras who believes that his wife has been substituted by an impostor but shows no preoccupation for his wife and does not go and look for her, appears to have a circumscribed delusion. A delusion can be elaborated, if the person reporting the delusion draws consequences from the delusional state and forms other beliefs that revolve around the theme of the delusion. For instance, a person with Capgras can develop paranoid thoughts related to the content of the delusion, along the lines that the impostor has evil intentions and will cause harm when the occasion presents itself.

2.2.4 Primary versus secondary

Depending on whether the delusion seems to be reported on the basis of some reasons, and defended with arguments, delusions can be described as primary or secondary. The traditional way of distinguishing primary from secondary delusions relied on the notion that primary delusions ‘arise out of nowhere’ (Jaspers 1963). This traditional characterization of the distinction has been found problematic, because it is difficult to establish whether there are antecedents of the delusion in a person's line of reasoning, and for other methodological and clinical reasons (e.g., Miller and Karoni 1996, p. 489). New readings of the distinction have been provided in the recent philosophical literature on delusions, where the need arises for distinguishing between people who can endorse the content of their delusions with reasons, and people who cannot (e.g. Bortolotti and Broome 2008 talk about authored and un-authored delusions; and Aimola Davies and Davies 2009 distinguish between pathologies of belief and pathological beliefs on similar lines).

3. Theoretical Approaches to Delusion

There are several theoretical approaches to delusion formation. Current theories of delusion formation attempt to explain the surface features of delusions by reference to abnormal experiences, reasoning biases, neuropsychological deficits, and motivational factors, but the task of describing the behavioral manifestations of delusions, and reconstructing their etiology is made difficult by the variation observed both in the form and the content of delusions.

When the distinction between functional and organic delusion was still widely accepted, functional delusions were primarily explained on the basis of psychodynamic factors, whereas organic delusions primarily received a neurobiological explanation. At the present stage of empirical investigation in the formation of delusional states, the received view is that all delusions are due to neuropsychological deficits, which might include motivational factors.

3.1 Neuropsychological and psychodynamic accounts of delusion

According to psychodynamic accounts, delusions are caused by motivational factors. For instance, delusions of persecution would be developed in order to protect one from low self-esteem and depression, and would be due to the attribution of negative events to some malevolent other rather than to oneself. The delusion would be part of a defense mechanism. Other delusions, such as Capgras, have also received a psychodynamic interpretation: a young woman believes that her father has been replaced by a stranger looking just like him in order to make her sexual desire for him less socially objectionable. In this way, the delusion would have the function to reduce anxiety and sense of guilt. Psychodynamic accounts of the Capgras delusion have been strongly criticized on the basis of recent findings about the type of brain damage that characterizes people with Capgras and affects their face recognition system. Psychodynamic accounts of other delusions that are supposed to play a defensive or self-enhancing role (e.g., persecution and erotomania) are still very popular.

According to neuropsychological accounts, delusions are the result of a cognitive failure, which can be an abnormal perceptual experience (Maher 1974); an abnormal experience accompanied by milder dysfunctions such as reasoning biases (Garety and Freeman 1999; Garety et al. 2001); or a breakdown of certain aspects of perception and cognition including a deficit in hypothesis evaluation (Langdon and Coltheart 2000). In most perceptual and cognitive deficit accounts, an abnormal event is responsible for the formation of the delusion. The young woman who thinks that her father has been replaced by an impostor would form this belief because she has reduced autonomic response to familiar faces, and this affects her capacity to recognize the face of the man in front of her as her father's face, even if she can judge that the face is identical (or virtually identical) to that of her father. But this abnormal event (reduction of autonomic response) is not the only factor responsible for the formation of the delusion according to influential two-factor theories. In order to explain why the thought that a dear one has been replaced by an impostor is adopted as a plausible explanation of the abnormal event, these theories also postulate a deficit at the level of hypothesis evaluation, or the presence of exaggerated attributional or data-gathering biases, such as the tendency to ‘jump to conclusion’ on the basis of limited evidence (Garety and Freeman 1999).

Neurobiological accounts of delusions offer very satisfactory accounts of some delusions, as one can often identify with some precision the damaged region of the brain and the causal link between the damage and the formation of the delusion. Neurobiological accounts of other delusions – once regarded as ‘functional’ — are also being developed and explored. For some delusions, hybrid accounts have been proposed, where a combination of neuropsychological factors (including motivation) significantly contribute to the formation of the delusion (e.g. McKay et al. 2007). One such case seems to be the Reverse Othello Syndrome, the delusion that a spouse or romantic partner is still faithful when this is no longer the case. The belief can be regarded as a defense against the suffering that the acknowledgement of the infidelity of one's partner would cause (see example in Butler 2000 as cited and discussed by McKay et al. 2005a, p. 313).

3.2 Bottom-up versus top-down theories of delusion

Another useful distinction, introduced and developed in the philosophical literature on delusions, is between bottom-up and top-down theories, where these labels are meant to refer to the direction of the causal relation between experience and belief in the formation of the delusion. Bottom-up theorists argue that the direction of causal explanation is from the experience to the belief. Delusions involve modifications of the belief system that are caused by ‘strange experiences’ due to organic malfunction (Bayne and Pacherie 2004a; Davies et al. 2001). For instance, I experience people watching me with suspicion or hostility, and as a result I form the hypothesis that they want to harm me; or something does not feel right when I see my sister's face, and as a result I come to believe that the person I am looking at is not really my sister but an impostor.

The proximal cause of the delusional belief is a certain highly unusual experience (Bayne and Pacherie 2004a, p. 2).

Top-down theorists about delusion formation argue that delusions involve modifications of the belief system that cause strange experiences. To revisit the previous examples, I believe that people want to harm me, and as a result I perceive them as looking at me malevolently; or I believe that someone looking almost identical to my sister has replaced her, and as a result the person claiming to be my sister doesn't look to me as my sister does. The top-down thesis about delusion formation has been proposed especially for monothematic delusions such as Capgras (Campbell 2001; Eilan 2000) and for delusions of passivity, when people report that there are external influences on their thoughts and actions (Sass 1994; Graham and Stephens 1994; Stephens and Graham 2000).

[D]elusion is a matter of top-down disturbance in some fundamental beliefs of the subject, which may consequently affect experiences and actions (Campbell 2001, p. 89).

The dichotomy between these positions is an obvious simplification, as in some models of delusion formation top-down and bottom-up processes co-exist. A person's prior expectations affect the way in which the perceptual signals are processed and give rise to unusual experiences. Then, the unusual experiences go through reality testing and are subject to further interpretation, after which they become a central factor in the formation of the delusional belief (see Hohwy and Rosenberg 2005 and Hohwy 2004). Both bottom-up and top-down perspectives have to be filled out with further details before gaining plausibility: whereas top-down theorists need to account for where the belief comes from, and why it is so successful in affecting perceptual experiences, bottom-up theorists are pressed to explain why people tend to endorse a bizarre hypothesis to explain their unusual experiences, given that hypotheses with higher probability should be available to them.

Within the bottom-up camp, further divisions apply. For some, it is correct to say that the delusional belief explains the experience. Others claim that the delusion is an endorsement of the experience. According to the explanationist account (Maher 1999; Stone and Young 1997), the content of experience is vaguer than the content of the delusion, and the delusion plays the role of one potential explanation for the experience. For instance, in the Capgras delusion, the experience would be that of someone looking very much like my sister but not being my sister. The delusion would be an explanation of the fact that the woman looks like my sister, but her face feels strange to me: the woman must be an impostor. In persecution, the experience would be that of some people as being hostile, and the delusion would be an explanation why they seem hostile: they have an intention to harm me. This account leaves it open that the same experience could have been explained differently (i.e., without any appeal to the delusional hypothesis).

According to the rival account, the endorsement account (Bayne and Pacherie 2004a; Pacherie et al. 2006), the content of the experience is already as conceptually rich as the content of the delusion. The delusion is not an explanation of the experience, but an endorsement of it: the content of the experience is taken as veridical and believed. In Capgras, the experience is that of a woman looking very much like my sister but being an impostor, and when the experience is endorsed, it becomes the delusional belief that my sister has been replaced by an impostor. In persecution, the experience is that of people having an intention to harm me, and when it is endorsed, it becomes the delusional belief that those people want to harm me.

Both versions of the bottom-up theory seem to imply that the delusion starts with a conscious experience, or better, with an experience whose content is available to a person as something to be explained or to be endorsed. But Coltheart (2005b) suggests instead that in the typical case the process of delusion formation starts with an event that a person is not aware of, such as the absence of an autonomic response.

3.3 One-factor versus two-factor theories of delusion formation

If the delusional belief comes from the experience, why is the delusional hypothesis preferred to more probable and plausible hypotheses (in the explanationist language), or why is the content of the experience endorsed in spite of low probability and plausibility (in the language of the endorsement account)? There are two common replies to this objection in the literature, which have given rise to two competing theories of delusion formation. Bottom-up theorists can be divided in those who think that the unusual experience is sufficient for the formation of the delusion (one-factor theorists), and those who think that the unusual experience is only one factor in the formation of the delusion (two-factor theorists).

For some one-factor theorists (Maher 1974), the delusion is a reasonable hypothesis given the strangeness of the experience, or the strange experience is in a sensory modality or at a processing stage where further reality testing is not available (Hohwy and Rosenberg 2005). But other one-factor theorists (e.g. Gerrans 2002a) argue that, although it may be reasonable to articulate a delusional hypothesis, it is not rational to maintain it in the face of counterevidence. For two-factor theorists (Davies et al. 2001; Stone and Young 1997), the delusion is formed in order to explain a puzzling experience or a failed prediction, but the presence of the experience or the failed prediction is not sufficient for the formation of the delusion. The mechanism responsible for the formulation of the delusional hypothesis must be affected by reasoning biases or deficits.

Thus, there are three main positions as to whether reasoning is impaired in people with delusions: (1) it is not impaired at all or the apparent impairment is due to a performance error rather than to a limitation of reasoning competence; (2) it is impaired due to a hypothesis evaluation deficit, and possibly reasoning biases; (3) it is impaired due to reasoning biases only. Although the predominance of certain reasoning styles and the presence of reasoning biases in people with delusions have been studied extensively, the available evidence does not seem to allow us to decide between the three options above. It is difficult at this stage of theoretical development to establish whether a certain reasoning “mistake” is due to a failure of competence or a failure of performance, or to specify what processes are involved in the hypothesis evaluation system.

By reference to monothematic delusions, Max Coltheart explains the two main factors involved in the formation of delusions as follows:

  1. There is a first neuropsychological impairment that presents the patient with new (and false data), and the delusional belief formed is one which, if true, would explain these data. The nature of this impairment varies from patient to patient.
  2. There is a second neuropsychological impairment, of a belief evaluation system, which prevents the patient from rejecting the newly formed belief even though there is much evidence against it. This impairment is the same in all people with monothematic delusions. (Coltheart 2005b, p. 154)

In Davies et al. (2001) and Coltheart (2007), factor two is described in more details. First there is the generation of a hypothesis which serves as an explanation of the experience or an endorsement of the content of the experience. Second, there is a failure in rejecting the hypothesis, even when it is not supported by the available evidence and it is implausible given the person's background beliefs – such a failure is probably due to frontal right hemisphere damage. Finally the hypothesis is accepted, attended to and reported, and can be subject to further (personal-level) evaluation when counterevidence emerges. When it is endorsed, the hypothesis is regarded as more plausible, more probable, and more explanatory than relevant alternatives. This influential account of the neuropsychology of delusions appeals to general mechanisms of belief formation, namely hypothesis generation and evaluation, and is compatible both with the view that people with delusions have ‘non-optimal hypothesis-testing strategies’ (Kihlstrom and Hoyt 1988, p. 96) and with the thesis that these sub-optimal strategies may be caused by damage to the right hemisphere (Ramachandran and Blakeslee 1998) which would be responsible for examining the fit between hypothesis and reality.

A similar story is told for polythematic delusions, self-deception, and delusion- and confabulation-like episodes in the normal population, although in these cases a single deficit could be at the origin of the reported belief (see McKay et al. 2005a). Experiential information is misinterpreted due to attentional or data-gathering biases that affect the generation of hypotheses or to powerful motivational factors.

4. Delusions and the Continuity Thesis

Here I shall focus on three debates that have animated the philosophical literature on delusions in recent years. They can all be seen as attempts to examine the extent to which the reasoning patterns and styles exhibited by people with delusions are continuous with those exhibited by people who have no known pathology of cognition.

4.1 Are delusions irrational?

There is no doubt that the DSM-IV definition of delusions describes them as irrational beliefs, more specifically, as beliefs that may be both not sufficiently supported by and not sufficiently responsive to the available evidence. However, in the philosophical literature on delusions, the status of delusions as irrational beliefs does not go unchallenged. Are delusions (really) irrational?

In a number of influential papers Brendan Maher (1974, 1988, 1999, 2003) argues that delusions are not ill-formed beliefs, and that there is nothing irrational in the relationship between the evidence supporting the delusional hypothesis and the formation of such a hypothesis. According to Maher, the abnormality of the delusion is entirely due to the abnormality of the experiences on the basis of which the delusion is formed. By reference to Maher's model, Blaney (1999) describes delusions as ‘false but reasonable’. Some difficulties have been identified with this strategy. A first difficulty is that there seem to be people who suffer from the same type of brain damage, and plausibly have the same experience, as the people who develop the delusion, but do not accept any delusional hypotheses. How can these people avoid forming a delusion? One possible answer is that those who have strange experiences and do not form the delusion have hypothesis-evaluation mechanisms that work efficiently, and thus end up rejecting hypotheses with low probability and plausibility. But those who have strange experiences and do form the delusion are instead affected by an additional problem, a deficit at the level of hypothesis evaluation, which can be conceived as a failure of rationality.

On Maher's view, […] [i]t follows that anyone who has suffered neuropsychological damage that reduces the affective response to faces should exhibit the Capgras delusion; anyone with a right hemisphere lesion that paralyzes the left limbs and leaves the subject with a sense that the limbs are alien should deny ownership of the limbs; anyone with a loss of the ability to interact fluently with mirrors should exhibit mirrored-self misidentification, and so on. However, these predictions from Maher's theory are clearly falsified by examples from the neuropsychological literature (Davies et al. 2001, p. 144).

Another difficulty with Maher's original account of delusions as ‘false but reasonable’ is that, even if the abnormality of the experience were to satisfactorily explain the acceptance of the delusional hypothesis and the formation of the delusion, this would not be sufficient to guarantee that the behavior of people with delusions is overall rational. We would still have to explain why delusions are maintained in the face of counterevidence once the delusional hypothesis has been formed and endorsed (see Gerrans 2002a). One aspect of the notion of rationality for beliefs is that people are disposed to revise or abandon beliefs that seem to be in conflict with the acquired evidence. The “incorrigibility” of delusions speaks in favor of their being held irrationally.

Let's concede that maintaining delusions (if not forming them) is irrational. Which norms of rationality are violated by the obstinate attachment to a delusional hypothesis? One norm that does seem to be infringed by delusions is consistency, where this is intended both as consistency between the delusion and the person's other beliefs, and consistency between the delusion and the person's behavior.

Rationality is a normative constraint of consistency and coherence on the formation of a set of beliefs and thus is prima facie violated in two ways by the delusional subject. First she accepts a belief that is incoherent with the rest of her beliefs, and secondly she refuses to modify that belief in the face of fairly conclusive counterevidence and a set of background beliefs that contradict the delusional belief (Gerrans 2000, p. 114).

Delusions do not seem to respect the idea that the belief system forms a coherent whole and that adjustments to one belief will require adjustments to many others (Young 2000, p. 49).

In the course of the same interview, a woman may claim that her husband died four years earlier and was cremated and that her husband is a patient in the same hospital where she is (Breen et al. 2000, p. 91). In Capgras delusion, people may worry about the disappearance of their loved one, but also be cooperative and even flirtatious with the alleged impostor (see Lucchelli and Spinnler 2007). This suggests that delusions do not always give rise to appropriate action (Bleuler 1950; Sass 2001), although they must be reported either spontaneously or after questioning, or they could not be diagnosed as delusions.

There are also examples of people acting on their delusions. Affected by perceptual delusional bicephaly, the delusion that one has two heads, a man who believed that the second head belonged to his wife's gynecologist attempted to attack it with an axe. When the attack failed he attempted it to shoot it down – as a consequence he was hospitalized with gunshot wounds (Ames 1984). Cases of Cotard delusion have been reported where people stop eating and bathing themselves as a consequence of believing that they are dead (Young and Leafhead 1996).

Other possible violations of norms of rationality come from the relationship between the content of the delusion and the available evidence. Resistance to revising or abandoning the delusion in the face of powerful counterevidence or counterargument is a sign of irrationality in normal and abnormal cognition alike: people with delusions ignore relevant evidence or attempt to defend their beliefs from apparent objections with obvious confabulations. Often these attempts are deeply perplexing, as the reasons offered for believing in the content of their delusions do not seem to be good reasons: in one of the examples of delusions I offered at the start, a woman incorrectly believed that a man was in love with her and claimed that he was sending her secret love messages hidden in the license plates on cars of a certain state.

Thus, delusions may be inconsistent with a person's beliefs and behavior, are typically unresponsive to both counterevidence and counterargument, and are often defended by weak evidence or argument. The empirical literature suggests that the reasoning performance of people with delusions reflects data-gathering and attribution biases. For instance, it has been argued that people with delusions ‘jump to conclusions’; they need less evidence to be convinced that a hypothesis is true (Garety 1991; Huq et al. 1988; Garety and Freeman 1999), and are more hasty in their decisions (Moritz and Woodward 2005; Fine et al. 2007). Other biases have also been noted: people with delusions of persecution tend to attribute the responsibility of negative events to other people (e.g., McKay et al. 2005b); in the Cotard delusion there seems to be a tendency to attribute the responsibility of negative events to oneself (Young and Leafhead 1996; Gerrans 2000; McKay and Cipolotti 2007). There are further studies suggesting that people with delusions are worse than controls at inhibiting the evidence of their senses when it conflicts with other things they know (Langdon et al. 2008b) and that they have an accentuated need for closure which comprises a desire for clarity and structure (see Kruglanski 1989, p. 14). These data are not by themselves sufficient to support the view that delusions are irrational, but show interesting deviations from statistically normal performance in the behavior of people with delusions.

What are the implications of the previously mentioned case reports and of the empirical findings on delusional reasoning for the claim that there is continuity between delusions and other beliefs? Although delusions can be irrational to a higher degree than normal beliefs, as they may be less consistent with a person's actions or more resistant to counterevidence, they do not seem to be irrational in a qualitatively different way from normal beliefs. This would suggest that they are continuous with irrational beliefs, although (as we shall see in the next section) there exist sophisticated philosophical arguments challenging the continuity claim.

4.2 Are delusions beliefs?

According to the doxastic conception of delusions (dominant among psychologists and psychiatrists), delusions are belief states – it is an important diagnostic features of delusions that they can lead to action and that they can be reported with conviction, and thus that they behave as typical beliefs. But there is an increasing influential view in philosophy warning that the doxastic characterization of delusions would lead to an oversimplification of the phenomenon. Although some of the alternative accounts of delusions (e.g., experiential, phenomenological and metarepresentational) are critical towards standard doxastic conceptions, they do not necessarily deny that the phenomenon of delusions involves the formation of normal or abnormal beliefs. Rather, the central idea seems to be that, even if people with delusions report false or irrational beliefs, paying attention only to their first-order cognitive states and to the doxastic dimension of their pathology can lead to a partial and incorrect view of the phenomenon of delusions.

Some authors emphasize the experiential and phenomenological character of delusions over the doxastic one (e.g., Sass 1994; Gold and Hohwy 2000), and others conceive of delusions not as mere representations of a person's experienced reality, but as attitudes towards representations (e.g., Currie 2000; Currie and Jureidini 2001; Stephens and Graham 2006). Gallagher (2009) argues that an explanation of the delusion as a mere cognitive error would be inadequate, and introduces the terminology of delusional realities, modes of experience which involve shifts in familiarity and sense of reality and encompass cognition, bodily changes, affect, social and environmental factors.

Most of the authors who deny belief status to delusions have a negative and a positive thesis. The positive thesis is an alternative account of what delusions are. For instance, one might argue that delusions are acts of imagination mistakenly taken by a person to have belief status (Currie and Ravenscroft 2002) or empty speech acts with no intentional import (Berrios 1991). The negative thesis is an account of why delusions are not beliefs. Beliefs have certain characteristics, that is, they are formed and revised on the basis of evidence, they are consistent with other beliefs, they are action guiding in the relevant circumstances. If delusions do not share these characteristics, then they are not beliefs.

Let us list some of the arguments for the negative thesis:

  1. Beliefs are integrated with other beliefs. If delusions are not integrated with a person's beliefs, then they are not beliefs.
  2. Beliefs are supported by evidence. If delusions are unsupported by evidence, then they are not beliefs.
  3. Beliefs are responsive to evidence. If delusions are not responsive to evidence, then they are not beliefs.
  4. Beliefs guide action. If delusions do not guide action, then they are not beliefs.

These arguments are central to the debate about the doxastic nature of delusions (Bortolotti 2009). For instance, Currie and Jureidini (2001, p. 161) argue that delusions are more plausibly imaginings than beliefs, because delusions ‘fail, sometimes spectacularly, to be integrated with what the subject really does believe’, whereas there is no requirement that imaginings are consistent with what the person believes. Berrios (1991) argues that delusions cannot be beliefs, because, as explanations for an abnormal experience, they are not regarded even by the person reporting them as more probable than alternative explanations of the experience. Berrios reaches the extraordinary conclusions that delusions are not even intentional states, but utterances without meaning, “empty speech acts”.

Assessing arguments in (1) to (4) requires assessing empirical and conceptual claims. Let's consider (1), the ‘bad integration’ objection to the belief status of delusions. In order to see whether the conclusion is convincing, we need to examine an empirical claim about delusions first: Do delusions really fail to integrate with a person's beliefs? Then, we need to assess a conceptual claim, the claim that not being integrated with a person's beliefs prevents delusions from being beliefs at all. In many cases, we shall find that the alleged ‘fault’ of delusions has been exaggerated (e.g., delusions sometimes integrate well with beliefs), but that it is correct to claim that delusions exhibit that mark of irrationality (bad integration) to a higher degree than ordinary beliefs.

The most common versions of anti-doxastic arguments seem to rely on an idealization of normal belief states, and impose constraints on delusions that typical beliefs would not meet. The assumption seems to be that beliefs are essentially rational, and that delusions are not beliefs because they are not rational. But the abundant psychological evidence on familiar irrationality tells us that ordinary beliefs are often irrational in exactly the same way as delusions can be – although to a lesser degree. It is sufficient to think about hypocrisy, about prejudiced and superstitious beliefs, and about the many biases that affect belief updating in normal cognition to realize that the same kinds of irrationality that we find in delusions are also common in many ordinary beliefs (e.g., Nisbett and Ross 1980). For the doxastic conception of delusions, the greatest challenge is to provide a satisfactory reply to the double-bookkeeping objection: if people truly believe the content of their delusions, why is their behavior often inconsistent with it? Aren't beliefs distinct from other intentional states in virtue of their action-guiding character? A more general worry is that the very notion of belief is not theoretically useful if the criteria for what counts as a belief become too loose.

Independent of any given answer to the question whether delusions are beliefs, two opposed conceptions of delusions contend the philosophical scene. One highlights the discontinuity between delusions and beliefs, and between normal and abnormal cognition, with consequences for the conceptualization of the disorder, but also for the availability of therapeutic options, such as cognitive behavioral therapy, to people with delusions. The other view insists that there is continuity between delusions and beliefs, and attempts to gather data both suggesting that people with delusions can reason in much the same way as people without, and that delusion-like ideas are widespread in the normal population. Bentall (2003), for instance, gathered a vast amount of empirical data about the temporal variations in delusions reported by people affected by psychopathologies, and the presence of delusion-like beliefs in the normal population.

4.3 Does delusion overlap with self-deception?

There is no consensus on whether self deception and delusion significantly overlap. Self deception has been traditionally characterized as driven by motivational factors. Delusions are now primarily accounted in neurobiological terms, and theories of delusion formation involve reference to perceptual and cognitive impairments. However, motivational factors can still play an important role in the explanation of some delusions, for instance by partially determining the specific content of the reported delusional state. Thus, one plausible view is that self-deception and delusion are distinct phenomena that may overlap in some circumstances (for further analysis, see Bayne and Fernàndez 2008). There are three arguments for the view that delusions and self-deception can overlap.

The first view about the relationship between delusions and self-deception is that, when they overlap, they do so because they both involve a motivationally biased treatment of evidence. If we agree with deflationists that the motivationally biased treatment of the evidence is the key feature of self-deception (Mele 2001 and 2008), then people with delusions can be said to be self-deceived if they treat the evidence at their disposal in a motivationally biased way, or if they search for evidence in a motivationally biased way. This does not seem to be generally the case, but it is useful to distinguish between different types of delusions. Some delusions of misidentification (at least according to neuropsychological accounts) do not seem to be akin to self-deception, given that there is no fundamental role for motivational biases in the explanation of how a person comes to hold or retain the delusion. A different analysis might be appropriate for other delusions, such as delusions of jealousy or persecution.

The second view is that (some) delusions are extreme cases of self-deception and that they have a protective and adaptive function (see Hirstein 2005). An example is offered by Ramachandran, who discusses anosognosia, the denial of illness, and somatoparaphrenia, the delusion that a part of one's body belongs to someone else. Ramachandran (1996) reports the case of a woman (FD) who suffered from a right hemisphere stroke which left her with left hemiplegia. FD could not move without a wheelchair and could not move her left arm. But when she was asked whether she could walk and she could engage in activities which require both hands (such as clapping), she claimed that she could. Ramachandran advances the hypothesis that behaviors giving rise to confabulations and delusions are an exaggeration of normal defense mechanisms that have an adaptive function, as they allow us to create a coherent system of beliefs and to behave in a stable manner. In normal subjects, the left hemisphere produces confabulatory explanations aimed at preserving the status quo (‘I'm not ill’; ‘My arm can move’), but the right hemisphere does its job and detects an anomaly between the hypotheses generated by the left hemisphere and reality. So, it forces a revision of the belief system. In patients such as FD, the discrepancy detector no longer works. It is very plausible that the delusions reported by people with anosognosia involve motivational aspects. But whether we believe that these delusions are an exaggerated form of self-deception depends on the preferred theoretical characterization of self-deception.

The third view about the potential overlap of delusions and self-deception is that the very existence of delusions (which shows that doxastic conflict is possible) can help us vindicate the traditional account of self-deception, according to which a person has two contradictory beliefs, but she is aware of only one of them, because she is motivated to remain unaware of the other (McKay et al. 2005a, p. 314). This account derives from Donald Davidson's theory of self-deception (e.g. Davidson 1982 and 1985b). When I deceive myself, I believe a true proposition but act in such a way as to causing myself to believe the negation of that proposition. Neil Levy argues that the conditions for self-deception set by the traditional approach are not necessary for self-deception, but that the case of FD described by Ramachandran (1996) is living proof that a person can, at the same time, believe that her arm is paralyzed, and believe that she can move her arm. Moreover, it is the belief that her arm is paralyzed that causes her to acquire the belief that her arm is not. This is Levy's analysis of the typical person with anosognosia Levy (2008, p. 234):

  1. Subjects believe that their limb is healthy.
  2. Nevertheless they also have the simultaneous belief (or strong suspicion) that their limb is significantly impaired and that they are profoundly disturbed by this belief (suspicion).
  3. Condition (1) is satisfied because condition (2) is satisfied; that is, subjects are motivated to form the belief that their limb is healthy because they have the concurrent belief (suspicion) that it is significantly impaired and they are disturbed by this belief (suspicion).

If this analysis is correct, at least one case of delusion (e.g., anosognosia) involves doxastic conflict. The most controversial aspect of this analysis concerns condition (2). Is the belief that their limb is impaired truly available to people affected by anosognosia? One could argue that, given that they probably have a deficit in the discrepancy detector of the right hemisphere of the brain, they have no awareness of the impairment they deny (see also Hirstein 2005). But Levy's reply is that availability comes in degrees. He suggests that, given that people with paralysis and anosognosia often avoid tasks that would require mobility when costs for failure are high, and given that they can acknowledge some difficulties in movement (and say ‘I have arthritis’ or ‘My left arm has always been weaker’), it is plausible that they have some awareness of their impairment – although they may lack a fully formed and conscious belief about it.

In sum, the views I have summarized here show that it can be very difficult to justify clear-cut distinctions between delusion and self-deception. Even when it is diagnostically and scientifically useful to maintain a distinction between symptoms of conditions such as amnesia, dementia, or schizophrenia, and the irrational beliefs that characterize normal cognition, there are many elements of genuine overlap.


Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

belief | mental illness | self-deception