Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Tue May 14, 2002; substantive revision Wed Nov 12, 2008

The concept of desert is deeply entrenched in everyday morality. We say that effort deserves success, wrongdoing deserves punishment, innocent suffering deserves sympathy or compensation, virtue deserves happiness, and so on. We think that the getting of what's deserved is just, and that failure to receive what's deserved is unjust. We also believe it's good that a person gets what she deserves, and bad that she doesn't—even if she deserves something bad, like punishment. We assume, too, that it's wrong to treat people better or worse than they deserve, and right to treat them according to their deserts. In these and other ways, the notion of desert pervades our ethical lives.

In spite of its ubiquity, or perhaps because of it, the notion of desert is not especially well understood. This isn't surprising, since there are many difficult questions surrounding desert. For instance, what are the ingredients (as it were) of desert? What sorts of thing can be deserving? What are the grounds or bases for desert? How do bases for desert manage to make a thing that has them deserving? What connections does desert have to other moral-normative concepts, such as justice and goodness? This article sketches some possible answers to these and subsidiary questions about desert.

1. The Ingredients of Desert

Consider some ordinary desert claims:

These desert claims have several things in common: each involves a deserving subject (Hans, Nkechi, innocent victims), a deserved object (praise, promotion, compensation) and a desert basis (effort, contribution, innocent suffering). This suggests that desert itself is a three-place relation that holds among a subject, an object, and a basis. Of course, sometimes the desert claims we utter do not explicitly refer to all three of these ingredients. For example, one might say that Hans deserves praise (without specifying the basis of his desert), or that Nkechi is deserving (without specifying what she deserves). But unless one can fill these claims out further—say, by explaining why one thinks that Hans deserves praise, or what it is one thinks that Nkechi deserves—then the concept of desert is being misused.

It might be thought that desert involves more than three ingredients—more, that is, than a basis, object, and subject. This thought might be due to reflection on desert claims like these:

These desert claims specify a “source” from which the subject deserves the object. Hans deserves praise not from just anyone, but from his teacher. Nkechi deserves promotion not just by any institution, but by her university. The victims of September 11 deserve compensation not from just any group, but from those who harbor terrorists. Thus, it might be supposed that desert has four ingredients: a basis, a subject, an object, and its source (Kleinig 1971).

There are two reasons to resist adding this fourth ingredient to desert. One is that some legitimate cases of desert involve either no object-source, or an object-source so general that specifying it would be otiose. For example, you might deserve some good fortune after a long streak of undeserved bad luck, even though the good luck you now deserve is not deserved from any particular source. Or, in virtue of being a person, you might deserve respect—but from whom? Well, everyone! A second reason for not allowing an independent fourth ingredient (the object-source) into desert is that in fact it is already contained in one of the undisputed ingredients—namely, the desert object itself. For example, the object of Hans's desert is not simply praise, but praise from his teacher; the object of Nkechi's desert is not simply promotion, but promotion by her university; and so on. In these cases, the desert object includes a specific source. In other cases, the desert object will not involve a specific source—as when you deserve good luck from no particular source, or respect from everyone.

2. Subjects of Desert

The most uncontroversial bearers of desert are human beings. Humans are thought to deserve, or be capable of deserving, many things: punishment, reward, apologies, compensation, admiration, contempt, wages, grades, prizes, and so on. But is desert limited to human beings? Can non-human animals, for example, be deserving too?

A conservative view is that only humans can be deserving, and that any attribution of desert to non-humans is either incoherent, false, or translatable into some claim of “human” desert, or perhaps into a claim that does not mention desert at all. So, for example, suppose someone says “The dog deserves a treat.” On the conservative view, this claim could be incoherent, since dogs (it is claimed) neither deserve nor fail to deserve anything. The concept of desert simply does not apply to them. Or it could be coherent but false: the dog does not deserve a treat, since dogs cannot literally deserve anything. Or it could be coherent and even true, provided that it's translatable without change of meaning into some other claim, e.g., “You deserve the satisfaction of giving your dog a treat,” or “Giving the dog a treat will reinforce its good behavior.”

This view seems a bit too conservative. First, it flies in the face of the way we ordinarily apply the concept of desert. Indeed, if ordinary language is any guide, then just about anything can be literally deserving. For in addition to making desert claims about humans, we also say, for example, that the pet deserves our love, the Olympic Peninsula our respect, the proposal our support, the nation our loyalty, the painting our admiration. (It's possible that some of these claims are translatable in ways that would be consistent with the conservative view, but it's not obvious that all of them are. The burden of proof—and of translation!—is on the conservatives.) Second, what makes a human being capable of desert probably is not the biological fact that she is a human being—that is, a member of the species Homo sapiens. It might instead be the fact that she is capable of reason or self-reflection, or that she is capable of experiencing pain and pleasure. If so, then since there are non-human creatures (e.g., dogs) who can either reason or experience pain and pleasure, then at least some non-human creatures are subjects of desert too.

Unfortunately, this isn't saying very much. For one thing, it's not clear how having the ability to reason or experience pleasure or pain would make a creature capable of being deserving. Furthermore, it's not obvious that possession of one or more of those abilities is even necessary for being a subject of desert. Dead people, who don't have those abilities, are sometimes thought to deserve various things, such as a decent burial. Likewise, inanimate objects—such as the Grand Canyon or Big Ben—are also said to deserve certain things, such as preservation or protection.

Clearly, the question of what is necessary or sufficient for being a subject of desert is a difficult one. Is there any way to answer it? One possibility suggests itself: first, draw up a list of the possible bases of desert; then look around and see what sorts of things can have them. The result would be at least a partial catalogue of the sorts of things that can be deserving. In order to do this, of course, we would need a list of possible desert bases. What would that list look like? What are the bases for desert?

3. Bases for Desert

Suppose we are asked to draw up a list of the bases for desert—that is, a catalogue of the sorts of things such that having any of them would make a subject deserving. What would go on the list, and how would each entry be justified? We might agree that effort, for example, is a basis for deserving reward or success, but we might be less sure about whether need, for instance, is a basis for deserving medical care, or whether moral worth is a basis for deserving happiness. In order to settle such doubts and arrive at a justifiable catalogue, some general and defensible principles for identifying desert bases seem necessary.

There is agreement that the basis of a thing's desert must in some important sense be a fact “about” that thing (Feinberg 1970). So, for example, the fact that 3 is a prime number, or that a particular star is two billion years old, is not a basis for your deserving anything. In order for a fact to be a basis of your desert, it must be a fact about you—for example, that you have worked hard, innocently suffered, are a person, and so on. So the basis of a thing's desert must be a fact about that thing. Is there anything more that can be said?

Many writers have claimed that another necessary condition on something's being a desert base is that the deserving subject is responsible for it (see Cupit 1996a and Feldman 1995b, 1996 for references and discussion). A standard version of this condition can be stated as follows:

(DR) A deserves x in virtue of y only if A is responsible for y.

DR is plausible at first glance, and there are many cases that seem to support it. If, for instance, a professor discovers that his student isn't responsible for the high-quality paper she submitted (because she stole it from the Internet), then she can't deserve a good grade for it. Or consider the fact that criminal action deserves punishment, but not if the agent was insane at the time of the action. Presumably, the justification for this is that an insane agent is not responsible for his or her actions, and no one deserves punishment for actions for which he or she isn't responsible.

DR plays a central role in contemporary discussions about desert. It occurs, for instance, in a much-discussed argument for the conclusion that no one deserves anything. (This argument is suggested by some passages in Rawls 1971, though it's not clear that Rawls himself means to endorse the following versions of it. See Miller 1976 for discussion.) The argument goes something like this: all the actions we perform and attributes we possess—in short, all would-be bases for desert—are determined by factors for which we are not responsible, such as our genetic makeup, early training, and environment. But if no one is responsible for his or her possession of any would-be basis for desert, then these are not bases for desert at all (DR). Therefore, no one deserves anything. On another version of this argument, it involves an extra premise: if A deserves x in virtue of y, then A must also deserve y (Nozick 1974 and Zaitchik 1977 add this premise to the argument, and both reject it). So, for example, Rostropovich deserves praise for his musical talent only if he deserves to have that talent. But does he? This is where DR comes in. For if DR is true, then Rostropovich can deserve his musical talent only if he's responsible for it—which he isn't, since he was born with it. Thus, he can't deserve praise for it. Likewise, it's argued, for any alleged desert base: no one could deserve to have any so-called desert base, since no one is responsible for having such things. Thus, once again, no one deserves anything.

DR appears elsewhere in theorizing about desert. A good example is found in the literature on desert of wages. Much of this literature centers on the question of whether the wage a worker deserves depends on the effort exerted (regardless of actual productivity), or on productivity (regardless of effort). Sometimes the following argument is proposed: wages are deserved either for effort or productivity; people are responsible only for their efforts, not for the success or productivity of those efforts; DR is true; thus, it's the worker's effort, not productivity, that determines the deserved wage. (For more discussion of this argument, see Lamont 1994, McLeod 1996, and Sadurski 1985.)

In spite of DRs intuitive appeal and wide acceptance, it has not gone unchallenged. To some, it seems obvious that we can be deserving in virtue of things for which we are not responsible (Cupit 1996a, Feldman 1995b, 1996). Consider a person who innocently suffers a brutal mugging. The victim is not responsible for the attack, but deserves compensation anyway. Or consider a person who innocently suffers an excruciating disease that is very expensive to treat. She is not responsible for contracting this disease, yet she might deserve medical care and sympathy. Or consider the fact that you are a person. No one is responsible for this, yet in virtue of being a person you deserve a modicum of respect. These examples suggest that if there is a connection between desert and responsibility, it's more complicated than the one posited by DR. (For more discussion of the connection, see Section 5.4 below, as well as Cupit 1996a,b and Smilansky 1996a, b.)

Another attempt to place conditions on desert bases does so by attempting to link them with certain emotions or attitudes (Miller 1976). A version of this view begins by calling attention to the class of attitudes that we take up toward people in virtue of various qualities they possess or actions they perform. Those attitudes include admiration, gratitude, disgust, resentment, and so on. These have been called the “appraising attitudes”. The idea here is that the bases for appraising attitudes are, or at least coincide with, the bases for desert. Put another way:

(DAA) x is a desert base if and only if x is the basis of an appraising attitude.

If correct, DAA would provide a useful principle for determining what the desert bases are. For example, it's sometimes held that need is a basis for desert (say, of medical care). Yet need doesn't seem to be the basis of any appraising attitude. We don't respect or resent people, admire or detest them, because of their needs. Thus, if DAA is true, then need isn't a basis for desert. On the other hand, it seems that exerting effort (for example) is a basis for admiring a person. If DAA is true, it follows that effort is a basis for desert.

However, there may be a problem with DAA. To see it, consider the distinction between something's actually being admired or resented, on the one hand, and that thing's being appropriately admired or resented on the other. For example, many admired Hitler even though it would have been appropriate to detest him. And many resented Martin Luther King, Jr., even though it would have been appropriate to admire him. This allows us to ask: is DAA the thesis that x is a basis for desert if and only if x happens to be the object of an appraising attitude? Or is it instead the view that x is a basis for desert if and only if x is an appropriate basis for an appraising attitude? If the former, then DAA reduces to an implausible form of relativism about desert bases. (Desert bases would be properties whose presence we just happened to admire or detest, even if we admired nasty properties and detested noble ones.) If the latter, then DAA is in danger of being vacuous. For what else could make x an “appropriate” basis for an appraising attitude, except for the fact that those who have x deserve to be the object of that attitude?

Still another way of attempting to determine the bases for desert proceeds in two stages (Feinberg 1970). First, draw up a list of all the sorts of treatment that can be deserved: prizes, rewards, punishments, grades, compensation, and so on. Second, for each form of treatment, attempt to specify the basis or bases for which it is deserved. There are two potential problems with this approach. First, just as it is difficult to draw up a catalogue of bases for desert, it is hard to draw up a list of forms of deservable treatment. Second, this way of proceeding might reinforce the assumption that for every sort of deservable treatment, there is a desert base or set of desert bases unique to it. This assumption may be correct, but another possibility is that there is a single set of desert bases, and possession of any or all of them can influence the extent to which one deserves any given form of deservable treatment. If this latter view of the relationship between desert bases and deserved treatment is correct, then attempting to match deserved treatments to their bases might not be the best way to determine the bases of desert (McLeod 1996).

Yet another method for determining desert bases follows directly from an “institutional” theory of desert (Cummisky 1987, Arnold 1987). On that sort of theory, the bases for desert are determined by the rules or purposes of social institutions. For example, if the purpose of the ‘institution’ of Olympic gymnastics is to award the gold medal to the gymnast who receives the highest number of points from the judges, then the gymnast who achieves that score deserves the gold medal. If a theory of this sort is correct, then discovering the bases for desert will be as easy (or as difficult) as discovering the rules or purposes of social institutions. A possible source of trouble for this view, however, is that desert bases do not seem to be entirely determined by the rules or purposes of social institutions. Otherwise morally repugnant rules such as racist restrictions on voting eligibility, sexist restrictions on employee benefits, and so on, could not be fairly criticized on the grounds that race, gender, and so on are not legitimate grounds for deserving the loss of such benefits. But such criticism certainly seems warranted. This has persuaded some writers that there are “pre-institutional” facts about the bases for desert, and that social rules and purposes can be evaluated in terms of them (Feinberg 1970, McLeod 1999).

4. How Desert Bases Work

How do desert bases work? In particular, how does possession of a basis for desert manage to make its possessor deserving? The difficulty of this question can be brought out by imagining a person who has, for example, exerted quite a lot of effort toward achieving some end. Effort is widely thought to be a basis for desert, so let's suppose that it is. Would this mean that the person who exerted effort now deserves to achieve his end? One reason to doubt this is that his end might have been an evil one—for example, the bombing of a building full of innocent people. Surely he can't deserve that this horrible end be realized, no matter how hard he works for it. So maybe we should add that effort is a basis for desert only if it's directed toward a morally unobjectionable end. If correct, this would explain why the terrorist can't deserve that his efforts succeed. After all, those efforts are directed toward the morally objectionable end of murdering innocent people.

However, it's probably a mistake to conclude that exerting effort toward a morally unobjectionable end is sufficient for deserving the end itself. This is because there might be other factors at work that could weigh against one's deserving it, even if the end itself is morally okay. For example, suppose you've worked hard toward getting an A on your term paper. You spent hours in the library doing research, you composed several drafts, you went hours without sleep, and so on. Your end is morally okay, since there's nothing wrong with trying (in these ways!) to get an A. Even so, it's still possible that, in spite of your tremendous efforts, your paper is terrible. In that case, you probably don't deserve an A.

The general phenomenon emerging here is that, at least in many cases, possession of any particular basis for desert is not going to be sufficient for being deserving. You might work hard toward an end, but what if the end itself is wrong? Or the end is okay, and your effort intense, but what if the product of your effort is of very low quality? Even if the product of your effort is of high quality, you still might not be deserving, since other factors could count against you. Until all these of factors are taken into consideration and weighed against each other, it's impossible to render a verdict of desert.

This sort of phenomenon is not unprecedented. In fact it comes up often in philosophical ethics, most notably in theorizing about moral rightness and wrongness. There, it's standard to distinguish prima facie moral rightness from all-things-considered moral rightness (Ross 1930). To illustrate this distinction, imagine that you've made a solemn promise to help your friend. In virtue of this, it would be morally right, in some sense, for you to keep your promise. However, the rightness here is merely prima facie, for it might not be all-things-considered morally right for you to help your friend. This is because your promise might, for example, have been to help your friend by murdering his enemy (who, let's suppose, is an innocent person). In that case, you almost certainly have an all-things-considered obligation to break your promise. Still, the fact that you made a solemn promise to perform a certain action does seem to count toward the action's being right. For in other circumstances, a solemn promise to do something could generate an all-things-considered obligation to do it. It just so happens that, in this case, the prima facie rightness that the act would inherit in virtue of being a promise-keeping is outweighed by the prima facie wrongness of committing murder. Thus, on this way of thinking, the all-things-considered rightness or wrongness of any action is determined by all the respects in which the action would be prima facie right, when weighed against all the respects in which it would be prima facie wrong.

It might be that desert bases work in a similar way. That is, there might be a distinction between prima facie desert and all-things-considered desert. Possession of any given desert base makes one prima facie deserving, but it might not make one all-things-considered deserving. For example, you might have exerted intense effort toward achieving some end. If, as is usually held, effort is a basis for deserving success, then you prima facie deserve success in virtue of your effort. However, you might not be all-things-considered deserving of success. Perhaps this is because your effort was directed toward an evil end. In such a case, the prima facie desert of success that you gained in virtue of exerting effort is outweighed by the prima facie desert of failure and punishment that you acquired in virtue of plotting an evil end. If these are all the desert bases in play, then you all-things-considered deserve failure and punishment, not success.

The obvious drawback to thinking of desert bases as functioning in this way is that the method, if any, for determining the weight or importance of desert bases in particular cases is pretty mysterious. How, for instance, are we to weigh effort against productivity in the context of deserving a wage, or moral worth against need in the context of deserving medical care, or a person's humanity against his criminal behavior in the context of deserving punishment? Until we have some principled way of weighing prima facie desert bases against each other, the distinction between prima facie and all-things-considered desert might serve only to describe, rather than solve, the problem of how desert bases work.

An alternative approach would involve abandoning the distinction between prima facie and all-things-considered desert, and working toward a catalogue of more “finely-grained” desert bases. The idea here is that if the desert bases are specified in enough detail, then the relationship between having them and being deserving would be simple: possession of a desert base would be sufficient for being deserving. On this sort of view, effort itself, for example, is not a basis for desert, nor is effort-directed-toward-a-morally-unobjectionable-end, since neither one seems sufficient for being deserving (say, of an A on a paper). Instead, possession of a much more complicated desert base—viz., effort-directed-toward-a-morally-unobjectionable-end-that-is-not-also-a-grade-on-a-paper-etc.—is sufficient for desert.

This kind of view has the advantage of positing a simple relationship between possessing a desert base and being deserving. That relationship is this: possession of the desert base entails being deserving. However, this simplicity is purchased at the cost of making the desert bases themselves hopelessly complicated. The prior view, by contrast, makes desert bases very simple (e.g., ‘effort’, ‘productivity’, ‘moral worth’), but the price for this simplicity is a complicated and admittedly mysterious relationship between possessing desert bases and being deserving.

5. Desert's Relationship to Some Other Concepts

Fully grasping a concept involves understanding its relationships to other concepts. Thus, in order to fully grasp the concept of desert, it's important to see what connections it has to other concepts. Desert probably bears interesting connections to a large number of concepts, but this concluding section focuses only on four: justice, intrinsic value, entitlement, and responsibility.

5.1 Justice

There are many theories of justice (and, some would say, many sorts of justice—distributive, retributive, social, etc.—for there to be theories about). Some of these theories are egalitarian, since they state that some sort of equality is most central to justice. Other theories of justice are libertarian, because of the supreme importance that they place on liberty or freedom. But an ancient idea is that justice involves the getting of what's deserved—even if this results in inequalities, and even if distribution according to desert involves or requires some loss of liberty. On an old-fashioned version of this view, for instance, justice obtains entirely to the extent that the morally virtuous are happy, and the morally wicked suffer. If happiness were somehow to be distributed according to moral goodness in this way, the result would be inequality with respect to happiness, since the more virtuous would be happier than the less virtuous. There would also be a loss of liberty or freedom for the morally wicked, since they would be punished or otherwise made to suffer. But these inequalities and losses of freedom wouldn't detract from the justice of the world; instead, they would be required by justice itself.

However, contemporary theorists don't agree about the relationship between justice and desert. Some seem willing to accept that justice is entirely a matter of getting what's deserved (Feldman 1992, 1995a, 1995c). A more moderate position is that getting what's deserved is part, but only a part, of justice (Feinberg 1974, Lucas 1980, Slote 1973). Another possible component of justice is fairness, which has to do with the way one's treatment compares to the treatment received by others. Suppose, for example, that every student in the class deserves a C, but one of them is arbitrarily given an A and the rest are given Cs. Some will say, quite plausibly, that although these other students are given the grades they deserve, they are treated unjustly because they are treated unfairly. If this is correct, then justice cannot consist simply in getting what's deserved. Other factors, such as fairness, might be relevant to justice as well (Feinberg 1974). Another such factor might be consent. For suppose a person has worked hard to earn money, for example, and thereby comes to deserve it. Even so, there is no injustice if the person freely consents to giving this money away (Slote 1973).

Some theorists have gone so far as to argue that desert has nothing at all to do with justice. This view contradicts commonsense morality, but the arguments for holding it have been influential. One such argument is that the concept of desert, rather than providing a basis for the explanation of justice, is in fact conceptually parasitic on the notion of justice. On this way of seeing things, to deserve something is to be entitled to it according to rules that are just. The justice of these rules is then explained not in terms of how well or regularly they result in deserved distributions, which would be circular, but rather by some criterion (such as agreement on those rules by rational parties) that has nothing to do with desert (Rawls 1971, Scanlon 1984). The motivation behind a view like this might be that a more robust notion of desert would involve metaphysical mysteries, such as freedom or responsibility (Scheffler 1995). Or perhaps the motivation is simply the pragmatic one that any system designed to distribute goods and evils according to individual deserts would be hopelessly impractical (Rawls 1971). For how could we determine each individual's moral worth, level of effort, productivity, and so on, and then distribute benefits and burdens accordingly?

There is another argument for thinking that desert is irrelevant to justice—or, more precisely, that distribution according to ‘desert’ would actually involve injustice. This argument relies on the intuition that just distributions cannot be based on factors over which the recipients have no control. The distribution of economic and political benefits according to race or gender, for instance, seems unjust since neither one's race nor gender is within one's control. But what if the alleged bases for desert—effort, moral worth, productivity, being a person, and so on—are also beyond or largely outside of one's control, and due instead to factors such as such as genetic endowment and early training? It would seem to follow that distributions based on these factors, these “desert bases”, are unjust (Rawls 1971).

5.2 Intrinsic value

The intrinsic value of a thing is the value it has simply in virtue of what it is, rather than the value it has in virtue of what it leads to, signifies, entails, purchases, and so on. (For reasons that can't be discussed here, the concept of intrinsic value is of central importance in philosophical ethics.) The branch of ethics concerned with intrinsic value is known as axiology. A helpful assumption often made in axiology is that intrinsic value is had not just by anything at all, but rather by states of affairs or propositions. And one of the central questions in axiology is this: what elements can contribute to the intrinsic value of a state of affairs?

Some have argued that one such element involves desert (Feldman 1992, 1995c, Kagan 1999; Hurka 2001). To see why, consider two states of affairs: (i) that Smith is happy, and (ii) that Jones is unhappy. What is the intrinsic value of these states of affairs? One might suppose that (i) is intrinsically good, since happiness seems a likely constituent of intrinsically good states of affairs, and that (ii) is intrinsically bad, since unhappiness seems a likely ingredient of intrinsically bad states of affairs. So far, so good. However, it might be that happiness and unhappiness are not the only contributors to the intrinsic values of states of affairs. Another such factor might be the “fit” between the happiness or unhappiness received, on the one hand, and the happiness or unhappiness deserved, on the other. For suppose that Smith and Jones are morally despicable people, and that therefore their happiness is undeserved. In that case, it seems wrong to say that (i) is intrinsically good and (ii) intrinsically bad. On the contrary, a more plausible view is that (i) is intrinsically bad and (ii) intrinsically good! In any case, an intuitively appealing position is that a state of affairs in which a person who deserves unhappiness but receives happiness is intrinsically bad, and a state of affairs in which a person who deserves unhappiness and gets it is not intrinsically bad, and quite possibly intrinsically good. If this is correct, then the fit between desert and receipt within a state of affairs is at least one determinant of its intrinsic value.

That said, the quality of fit between desert and receipt is almost surely not the only determinant of intrinsic value (Persson 1996). Compare, for instance, two possible worlds (here thought of as extremely large states of affairs). One world contains a million sinners, all of whom suffer the horrible punishment that they deserve. Another world contains a million saints, all of whom enjoy the bliss that they deserve. These are rather different worlds, but in one respect they are the same: the quality of fit between desert and receipt in the sinners' world is equal to that of the saints' world. This is because the fit in each world is perfect: each person in each world receives precisely what he or she deserves, and the worlds have the same population. However, it seems absurd to say that these worlds have the same intrinsic value. On the contrary, the sinners' world seems intrinsically much worse than the saints'. If so, then the intrinsic value of a state of affairs is not exhausted by the quality of fit between desert and receipt.

5.3 Entitlement

We often speak of being entitled to something, like a vacation, a grade, an inheritance, or an apology. Notice, however, that in many of these cases we could just as easily have said that we deserve these things. Thus, the terms ‘entitled to’ and ‘deserve’ are often used interchangeably. This raises the question of desert's relationship to entitlement. Are they one and the same, or are they different? And if they are distinct notions, then what connection, if any, does desert bear to entitlement?

First, though, what exactly is entitlement? Reflecting on a few cases can bring out the sense of ‘entitlement’ of interest here. Suppose, then, that the rules of a certain corporation state that its employees shall receive two weeks of paid vacation after one year of full-time employment. Now suppose that an employee of the company has worked full-time for one year. This employee is now entitled to two weeks of paid vacation. Or, to take another example, suppose the rules of a certain board game specify that a player who rolls “snake eyes” must lose a turn. If a player now rolls snake eyes, then that player is “entitled” to lose a turn. (Admittedly, we don't usually think of penalties as objects of entitlement, but, in the sense of ‘entitlement’ that concerns us, they can be.) Suppose, as a final example, that the accepted rules of etiquette state that the hostess of an upcoming dinner party shall receive RSVPs from her invited guests, even if she fails to request the favor of a response. In that case, the hostess is entitled to a response from all her invitees. These cases have several things in common. First, there is a conventional rule that specifies that a person shall receive a certain treatment in virtue of possessing an “entitlement base” (that is, a particular attribute or performance of a certain action). Second, there is a person who falls under the rule and who has the entitlement base. Third, this person thereby comes to be entitled to the treatment in question. These are paradigmatic cases of entitlement.

Clearly, entitlement thus understood is structurally similar to desert. For entitlement, like desert, is a three-place relation among an entitled subject, a basis of entitlement, and an object of entitlement. Also, as noted above, many objects of entitlement—vacations, punishment, replies to invitations—are also objects of desert. Furthermore, failure to treat in accordance with entitlement, like failure to treat in accordance with desert, can be an injustice. These considerations might lead some to conclude that there is a profound relationship between entitlement and desert.

Some might want to say that the relationship between desert and entitlement is extremely intimate. Indeed, the “institutional” theories of desert mentioned in Section 3 are precisely those that identify desert with some sort of entitlement. However, this proposed connection (identity) is a bit too intimate, for there are cases in which a person is entitled to something but doesn't deserve it, and also cases in which what's deserved isn't something to which the person is entitled. For instance, the rules that govern the state lottery might entitle the winning ticket holder to one hundred million dollars, even if the lucky winner doesn't deserve so much money. Or, it might be that everyone in the United States deserves free or affordable access to basic health care, even though there are no rules that entitle us to it. These cases suggest that if there is an interesting relationship between desert and entitlement, it isn't identity.

At least some authors have claimed that although entitlement is not identical to desert, it is nevertheless a basis for desert (Feldman 1992, 1995a; McLeod 1999). On their view, being entitled to something is a basis for deserving it. Perhaps the main motivation for this position springs from combining the conviction that justice is simply the getting of what's deserved with the apparent fact that failing to treat in accordance with entitlement can involve injustice. If this combination of views is correct, it would seem to follow that being entitled to something must be a basis for deserving it. But this view also suffers from serious problems. One is its implication that evil or morally repugnant rules are capable of generating desert. Suppose, for example, that Nazi laws entitled officers of the SS to property confiscated from Jews. Even so, it hardly seems correct to say that, in virtue of this, the Nazi officers came to deserve (even prima facie) the stolen property. Another problem with the view that entitlement is a basis for desert is that it seems to violate the requirement that a desert basis must be a fact about the deserving subject. Unlike the property of being morally virtuous or being lazy, the property of being entitled by the rules to x is a highly extrinsic property of an individual, and thus cannot count as a basis for desert.

A third proposed connection between desert and entitlement is found in Cupit (1996b). Suppose, for purposes of illustration, that the orchestra has just pulled off an electrifying performance of Dvorak's Ninth Symphony. The musicians deserve the audience's admiration, and there are rules for how it can be expressed. If, as in this case, their admiration is immense, then the rules call for a standing ovation. Put another way, there is a rule that entitles the musicians to a standing ovation from the audience. Thus, if the audience fails to give the orchestra a standing ovation, the message is conveyed that the musicians don't deserve it. In other words, if the audience fails to give the players that to which they are entitled, then it fails to give them what they deserve. In this way, a link seems to be forged between desert and entitlement: the rules that generate entitlement also help to shape the meanings of the actions that fall under those rules; those actions are meant to express what the recipient deserves; therefore, failure to treat in accordance with entitlement can result in failure to treat in accordance with desert.

5.4 Responsibility

Much of the relevant literature presupposes or explicitly considers some conception of the relationship, if any, that desert bears to the concept of responsibility. As noted in Section 3, some authors (e.g., Rawls 1971, Rachels 1978, Pojman 1997) claim that desert always presupposes responsibility. On their view, one cannot deserve anything in virtue of an action or attribute for which one isn't responsible. Feldman (1995a), Cupit (1996a, b), and others challenge this claim by pointing to properties that seem to be bases for desert but that do not presuppose responsibility. Innocent suffering, being a person, being beautiful, being a member of an endangered species - all of these properties are plausibly regarded as bases for desert of various forms of treatment, such as compensation, respect, admiration, protection, and so on, in spite of the fact that one need not be responsible for possessing them. Thus, it seems that if there is a desert-responsibility connection, it's not as simple as some have thought.

There are ways in which proponents of the view that desert always involves responsibility might deal these apparent counterexamples. One is to distinguish “moral” from “nonmoral” desert—moral desert presupposes responsibility, while nonmoral desert does not—and to relegate nonmoral desert to the philosophical scrap heap. But this maneuver seems both ad hoc and implausible: ad hoc because what motivates the distinction is simply a desire to save the alleged desert-responsibility connection; implausible because treatment (or failure to treat) in accordance with innocent suffering, being a person, being beautiful, etc., doesn't really seem to be nonmoral. On the contrary, failure to treat in accordance with a thing's possession of one or more of those properties would be unfitting or wrong, while treatment in accordance with one or more of them would be fitting or right. A similar objection applies to treating desert as a species of “merit”. On this view, merit is based on possession of any quality that is an appropriate basis for treatment, whether the meriting subject is responsible for the quality or not, while desert is a species of merit that requires responsibility for the merit basis (Pojman 1997). This too is ad hoc, since ordinary language doesn't support a sharp merit-desert distinction. It also contradicts the actual practice of competent speakers who readily speak of desert in cases where the subject isn't responsible for the basis.

This isn't to say that desert and responsibility are not connected in any way. In fact, there are cases where desert does require responsibility (perhaps the most obvious is punishment). Thus, rather than focus on simple versions of a desert-responsibility connection, theorists of desert should distinguish those cases in which desert involves responsibility from those in which it does not, and articulate general principles that explain the difference.


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justice: distributive | luck: justice and bad luck | moral responsibility | repugnant conclusion, the | value: intrinsic vs. extrinsic