Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Distributive Justice

First published Sun Sep 22, 1996; substantive revision Mon Mar 5, 2007

Principles of distributive justice are normative principles designed to guide the allocation of the benefits and burdens of economic activity.

After outlining the scope of this entry and the role of distributive principles, the first relatively simple principle of distributive justice examined is strict egalitarianism, which advocates the allocation of equal material goods to all members of society. John Rawls' alternative distributive principle, which he calls the Difference Principle, is then examined. The Difference Principle allows allocation that does not conform to strict equality so long as the inequality has the effect that the least advantaged in society are materially better off than they would be under strict equality. However, some have thought that Rawls' Difference Principle is not sensitive to the responsibility people have for their economic choices. Resource-based distributive principles, and principles based on what people deserve because of their work, endeavor to incorporate this idea of economic responsibility.

Advocates of Welfare-based principles do not believe the primary distributive concern should be material goods and services. They argue that material goods and services have no intrinsic value and are valuable only in so far as they increase welfare. Hence, they argue, the distributive principles should be designed and assessed according to how they affect welfare. Advocates of Libertarian principles, on the other hand, generally criticize any patterned distributive ideal, whether it is welfare or material goods that are the subjects of the pattern. They generally argue that such distributive principles conflict with more important moral demands such as those of liberty or respecting self-ownership. Finally, feminist critiques of existing distributive principles note that they tend to ignore the particular circumstances of women, especially the fact that women often have primary responsibility for child-rearing. Some feminists therefore are developing and/or modifying distributive principles to make them sensitive to the circumstances of women and to the fact that, on average, women spend less of their lifetimes in the market economy than men.

1. Scope and Role of Distributive Principles

Distributive principles may vary in numerous dimensions. They can vary in what is subject to distribution (income, wealth, opportunities, jobs, welfare, utility, etc.); in the nature of the subjects of the distribution (natural persons, groups of persons, reference classes, etc.); and on what basis distribution should be made (equality, maximization, according to individual characteristics, according to free transactions, etc.). This entry will focus on principles of distributive justice designed to cover the distribution of the benefits and burdens of economic activity among individuals in a society. Although principles of this kind have been the dominant source of Anglo-American debate about distributive justice over the last four decades, there are other important distributive justice questions, some of which are covered by other entries in the encyclopedia. These include questions of distributive justice at the global level rather than just at the national level (see justice: international), distributive justice across generations (see justice: intergenerational) and how the topic of distributive justice can be approached, not as a set of principles but as a virtue (see justice: as a virtue).

Although the numerous proposed distributive principles vary along different dimensions, for simplicity, they are broadly grouped here. It is important to keep in mind though that this involves oversimplication, particularly with respect to the criticisms of each of the groups of principles. The criticisms may not apply to every principle in the group. The issue of how we are to understand and respond to criticisms of distributive principles is discussed briefly in the section on methodology at the end (see Methodology).

There has never been, and never will be, a purely libertarian society or Rawlsian society, or any society whose distribution conforms to one of the proposed principles. Some are misled by this fact to believe that discussions of distributive justice are exercises in ideal theory, which is unfortunate because, in the end, distributive justice theory is a practical enterprise.

Throughout most of history, people were born into, and largely stayed in a fairly rigid economic position. The distribution of economic benefits and burdens was seen as fixed, either by nature or by God. Only when people realized that the distribution of economic benefits and burdens could be affected by government did distributive justice become a live topic. Now the topic is unavoidable. Governments continuously make and change laws affecting the distribution of economic benefits and burdens in their societies. Almost all changes, from the standard tax and industry laws through to divorce laws have some distributive effect, and, as a result, different societies have different distributions. Every society then is always faced with a choice about whether to stay with the current laws and policies or to modify them. Distributive justice theory contributes practically by providing guidance for these unavoidable and constant choices. For instance, advocates of the difference principle are arguing that we should change our policies and laws to raise the position of the least advantaged in society. Others are arguing for changes to bring economic benefits and burdens more in accordance with what people deserve. Libertarians usually urge a reduction in government intervention in the economy. Sometimes a number of the theories will recommend the same change in policy; other times they will diverge. Contrary to a popular misconception, economics alone cannot decide what policy changes we should make. Economics, at its best, can tell us the effects of pursuing different policies; it cannot, without the guidance of normative principles, recommend which policy to pursue. The arguments and principles discussed in the present entry aim to supply this kind of guidance.

2. Strict Egalitarianism

One of the simplest principles of distributive justice is that of strict or radical equality. The principle says that every person should have the same level of material goods and services. The principle is most commonly justified on the grounds that people are owed equal respect and that equality in material goods and services is the best way to give effect to this ideal.

Even with this ostensibly simple principle some of the difficult specification problems of distributive principles can be seen. The two main problems are the construction of appropriate indices for measurement (the index problem), and the specification of time frames. Because there are numerous proposed solutions to these problems, the ‘principle of strict equality’ is not a single principle but a name for a group of closely related principles. This range of possible specifications occurs with all the common principles of distributive justice.

The index problem arises primarily because the goods to be distributed need to be measured if they are going to be distributed according to some pattern (such as equality). The strict equality principle stated above says that there should be ‘the same level of material goods and services’. The problem is how to specify and measure levels. One way of solving the index problem in the strict equality case is to specify that everyone should have the same bundle of material goods and services rather than the same level (so everyone would have 4 oranges, 6 apples, 1 bike, etc.). The main problem with this solution is that there will be many other allocations of material goods and services which will make some people better off without making anybody else worse off. For instance, a person preferring apples to oranges will be better off if she swaps some of the oranges from her bundle for some of the apples belonging to a person preferring oranges to apples. Indeed, it is likely that everybody will have something they would wish to trade in order to make themselves better off. As a consequence, requiring identical bundles will make virtually everybody materially worse off than they would be under an alternative allocation. So specifying that everybody must have the same bundle of goods does not seem to be a satisfactory way of solving the index problem. Some index for measuring the value of goods and services is required.

Money is an index for the value of material goods and services. It is an imperfect index and its pitfalls are well-documented in most economics textbooks. Moreover, once the goods to be allocated are extended beyond material ones to include opportunities, etc. it needs to be combined with other indices. (For instance, John Rawls' index of primary goods — see Rawls 1971.) Nevertheless, using money as index for the value of material goods and services is the most practical response so far suggested to the index problem and is widely used in the specification and implementation of distributive principles.

The second main specification problem involves time frames. Many distributive principles identify and require that a particular pattern of distribution be achieved. But they also need to specify when the pattern is required. One version of the principle of strict equality requires that all people should have the same wealth at some initial point, after which people are free to use their wealth in whatever way they choose. Principles specifying initial distributions after which the pattern need not be preserved are commonly called ‘starting-gate’ principles. (See Ackerman 1980, 53-59,168-170,180-186; Alstott and Ackerman 1999)

Because ‘starting-gate’ forms of the strict equality principle may lead in time to very inegalitarian wealth distributions they are not common. The most common form of strict equality principle specifies that income (measured in terms of money) should be equal in each time-frame, though even this may lead to significant disparities in wealth if variations in savings are permitted. Hence, strict equality principles are commonly conjoined with some society-wide specification of just saving behavior.

There are a number of direct moral criticisms made of strict equality principles: that they unduly restrict freedom, that they do not give best effect to equal respect for persons, that they conflict with what people deserve, etc. (see Desert-Based Principles) But the most common criticism is a welfare-based one: that everyone can be materially better off if incomes are not strictly equal. (see Carens) It is this fact which partly inspired the Difference Principle.

3. The Difference Principle

The wealth of an economy is not a fixed amount from one period to the next. More wealth can be produced and indeed this has been the experience of industrialized countries over the last few centuries. The most common way of producing more wealth is to have a system where those who are more productive earn greater incomes. This partly inspired the formulation of the Difference Principle.

The most widely discussed theory of distributive justice in the past three decades has been that proposed by John Rawls in A Theory of Justice, (Rawls 1971), and Political Liberalism, (Rawls 1993). Rawls proposes the following two principles of justice:

1. Each person has an equal claim to a fully adequate scheme of equal basic rights and liberties, which scheme is compatible with the same scheme for all; and in this scheme the equal political liberties, and only those liberties, are to be guaranteed their fair value.

2. Social and economic inequalities are to satisfy two conditions: (a) They are to be attached to positions and offices open to all under conditions of fair equality of opportunity; and (b), they are to be to the greatest benefit of the least advantaged members of society. (Rawls 1993, pp. 5-6. The principles are numbered as they were in Rawls' original A Theory of Justice.)

Under Rawls' proposed system Principle (1) has priority over Principle (2). In addition to (2b) it is possible to think of Principles (1) and (2a) as principles of distributive justice: (1) to govern the distribution of liberties, and (2a) the distribution of opportunities. Looking at the principles of justice in this way makes all principles of justice, principles of distributive justice (even principles of retributive justice will be included on the basis that they distribute negative goods). Keeping in line with the primary focus of this entry though, let us concentrate on (2b), known as the Difference Principle.

The main moral motivation for the Difference Principle is similar to that for strict equality: equal respect for persons. Indeed the Difference Principle materially collapses to a form of strict equality under empirical conditions where differences in income have no effect on the work incentive of people. The overwhelming opinion though is that in the foreseeable future the possibility of earning greater income will bring forth greater productive effort. This will increase the total wealth of the economy and, under the Difference Principle, the wealth of the least advantaged. Opinion divides on the size of the inequalities which would, as a matter of empirical fact, be allowed by the Difference Principle, and on how much better off the least advantaged would be under the Difference Principle than under a strict equality principle. Rawls' principle however gives fairly clear guidance on what type of arguments will count as justifications for inequality. Rawls is not opposed to the principle of strict equality per se, his concern is about the absolute position of the least advantaged group rather than their relative position. If a system of strict equality maximizes the absolute position of the least advantaged in society, then the Difference Principle advocates strict equality. If it is possible to raise the absolute position of the least advantaged further by having some inequalities of income and wealth, then the Difference Principle prescribes inequality up to that point where the absolute position of the least advantaged can no longer be raised.

Because there has been such extensive discussion of the Difference Principle in the last 30 years, there have been numerous criticisms of it from the perspective of all the other theories of distributive justice outlined here. Briefly, the main criticisms are as follows.

Advocates of strict equality argue that inequalities permitted by the Difference Principle are unacceptable even if they do benefit the least advantaged. The problem for these advocates is to explain in a satisfactory way why the relative position of the least advantaged is more important than their absolute position, and hence why society should be prevented from materially benefiting the least advantaged when this is possible. The most common explanation appeals to solidarity (Crocker): that being materially equal is an important expression of the equality of persons. Another common explanation appeals to the power some may have over others, if they are better off materially. Rawls' response to this latter criticism appeals to the priority of his first principle: The inequalities consistent with the Difference Principle are only permitted so long as they do not compromise the fair value of the political liberties. So, for instance, very large wealth differentials may make it practically impossible for poor people to be elected to political office or to have their political views represented. These inequalities of wealth, even if they increase the material position of the least advantaged group, may need to be reduced in order for the first principle to be implemented.

The Utilitarian objection to the Difference Principle is that it does not maximize utility. In A Theory of Justice, Rawls uses Utilitarianism as the main theory for comparison with his own, and hence he responds at length to this Utilitarian objection and argues for his own theory in preference to Utilitarianism (some of these arguments are outlined in the section on Welfare-Based Principles).

Libertarians object that the Difference Principle involves unacceptable infringements on liberty. For instance, the Difference Principle may require redistributive taxation to the poor, and Libertarians commonly object that such taxation involves the immoral taking of just holdings. (see Libertarian Principles)

The Difference Principle is also criticized as a primary distributive principle on the grounds that it mostly ignores claims that people deserve certain economic benefits in light of their actions. Advocates of Desert-Based Principles argue that some may deserve a higher level of material goods because of their hard work or contributions even if their unequal rewards do not also function to improve the position of the least advantaged. They also argue that the explanations of how people come to be in more or less advantaged positions is relevant to their fairness, yet the Difference Principle wrongly ignores these explanations.

Like desert theorists, advocates of Resource-based principles criticize the Difference Principle on the grounds that it is not ‘ambition-sensitive’ enough, i.e. it is not sensitive to the consequences of people's choices. They also argue that it is not adequately ‘endowment-sensitive’: it does not compensate people for natural inequalities (like handicaps or ill-health) over which people have no control.

4. Resource-Based Principles

Resource-based principles (also called Resource Egalitarianism) prescribe equality of resources. Interestingly, resource-based principles do not normally prescribe a patterned outcome — the idea being that the outcomes are determined by people's free use of their resources. Resource-theorists claim that the Difference Principle is insufficiently ‘ambition-sensitive’ and that provided people have equal resources they should live with the consequences of their choices. They argue, for instance, that people who choose to work hard to earn more income should not be required to subsidize those choosing more leisure and hence less income.

Resource-theorists also make a related complaint that the Difference Principle is not sufficiently ‘endowment-sensitive.’ While part of Rawls' motivation for the Difference principle is that people have unequal endowments, resource-theorists explicitly emphasize this feature of their theory though they differ on which endowments are relevant to questions of distributive justice. They agree that, ideally, social circumstances over which people have no control should not adversely affect life prospects or earning capacities. Some resource-theorists further argue that, for the same sorts of reasons, unequal natural endowments should attract compensation. For instance, people born with handicaps, ill-health, or low levels of natural talents have not brought these circumstances upon themselves and hence, should not be disadvantaged in their life prospects.

The most prominent Resource-based theory, developed by Ronald Dworkin, (Dworkin 1981a, 1981b), proposes that people begin with equal resources but end up with unequal economic benefits as a result of their own choices. What constitutes a just material distribution is to be determined by the result of a thought experiment designed to model fair distribution. Suppose that everyone is given the same purchasing power and each use that purchasing power to bid, in a fair auction, for resources best suited to their life plans. They are then permitted to use those resources as they see fit. Although people may end up with different economic benefits, none of them is given less consideration than another in the sense that if they wanted somebody else's resource bundle they could have bid for it instead.

As mentioned above, many resource-theorists, including Dworkin, add to this system of equal resources and ambition-sensitivity, a sensitivity to inequalities in natural endowments. They note that natural inequalities are not distributed according to people's choices, nor are they justified by reference to some other morally relevant fact about people. Dworkin proposes a hypothetical compensation scheme in which he supposes that, before the hypothetical auction described above, people do not know their own natural endowments. However, they are able to buy insurance against being disadvantaged in the natural distribution of talents and they know that their payments will provide an insurance pool to compensate those people who are unlucky in the ‘natural lottery’.

Because the Resource-based theory has a similar motivation to the Difference Principle the moral criticisms of it tend to be variations on those leveled against the Difference Principle. However, unlike the Difference Principle, it is not at all clear what would constitute an implementation of Resource-based theories and their variants in a real economy. It seems impossible to measure differences in people's natural talents — unfortunately, people's talents do not neatly divide into the natural and developed categories. A system of special assistance to the physically and mentally handicapped and to the ill would be a partial implementation of the compensation system, but most natural inequalities would be left untouched by such assistance while the theory requires that such inequalities be compensated for. It is simply not clear how to implement equality of resources in a complex economy and hence despite its theoretical advantages, it is difficult to see it as a practical improvement on the Difference Principle.

5. Welfare-Based Principles

Welfare-based principles are motivated by the idea that what is of primary moral importance is the level of welfare of people. Advocates of Welfare-based principles view the concerns of other theories - equality, the least advantaged, resources, desert-claims, or liberty as derivative concerns. Resources, equality, desert-claims, or liberty are only valuable in so far as they increase welfare, so that all distributive questions should be settled according to which distribution maximizes welfare. However, ‘maximizes welfare’ is imprecise, so welfare theorists propose particular welfare functions to maximize. The welfare functions proposed vary enormously both on what will count as welfare and the weighting system for that welfare. For almost any distribution of material benefits there is a welfare function whose maximization will yield that distribution (at least in a one sector period).

Distribution according to some welfare function is most commonly advocated by economists, who normally state the explicit functional form. Philosophers tend to avoid this. Philosophers also tend to restrict themselves to a small subset of the available welfare functions. Although there are a number of advocates of alternative welfare functions (like ‘equality of well-being’), most philosophical activity has concentrated on a variant known as Utilitarianism. This theory can be used to illustrate most of the main characteristics of Welfare-based principles.

Historically, Utilitarians have used the term ‘utility’ rather than ‘welfare’ and utility has been defined variously as pleasure, happiness, or preference-satisfaction. So, for instance, the principle for distributing economic benefits for Preference Utilitarians is to distribute them so as to maximize preference-satisfaction. The welfare function for such a principle has a simple theoretical form: it involves choosing that distribution maximizing the arithmetic sum of all satisfied preferences (unsatisfied preferences being negative), weighted for the intensity of those preferences.

The basic theory of Utilitarianism is one of the simplest to state and understand. Much of the work on the theory therefore has been directed towards defending it against moral criticisms, particularly from the point of view of ‘commonsense’ morality. The criticisms and responses have been widely discussed in the literature on Utilitarianism as a general moral theory. Only two of the criticisms will be mentioned here.

The first is that Utilitarianism fails to take the distinctness of persons seriously. Maximization of preference-satisfaction is often taken as prudent in the case of individuals — people may take on greater burdens, suffering or sacrifice at certain periods of their lives so that their lives are overall better. The complaint against Utilitarianism is that it takes this principle, commonly described as prudent for individuals, and uses it on an entity, society, unlike individuals in important ways. While it may be acceptable for a person to choose to suffer at some period in her life (be it a day, or a number of years) so that her overall life is better, it is often argued against Utilitarianism that it is immoral to make some people suffer so that there is a net gain for other people. In the individual case, there is a single entity experiencing both the sacrifice and the gain. Also, the individuals, who suffer or make the sacrifices, choose to do so in order to gain some benefit they deem worth their sacrifice. In the case of society as a whole, there is no single experiential entity — some people suffer or are sacrificed so that others may gain. Furthermore, under Utilitarianism, there is no requirement for people to consent to the suffering or sacrifice.

A related criticism of Utilitarianism involves the way it treats individual preferences or interests referring to the holdings of others. For instance, some people may have a preference that some minority racial group should have less material benefits. Under Utilitarian theories, in their classical form, this preference or interest counts like any other in determining the best distribution. Hence, if racial preferences are widespread and are not outweighed by the minorities' contrary preferences, Utilitarianism will recommend an inegalitarian distribution based on race.

Utilitarians have responded to these criticisms in a number of ways. Utilitarians may apply their theory to the preferences themselves, arguing that utility is best promoted in the long run when people's preferences are shaped (if this is possible) in ways that are harmonious with one another, suggesting racist preferences should be discouraged. However, the utilitarian then must supply an account of why racist or sexist preferences should be discouraged when the same level of total long term utility could be achieved by encouraging the less powerful to be contented with a lower position. It is difficult for utilitarians to explain why the position of the oppressed is aptly described as one of oppression. Utilitarians have also argued that the empirical conditions are such that utility maximizing will rarely require women or racial minorities to sacrifice or suffer for the benefit of others, or to satisfy the prejudices of others. But if their theory on rare occasions does require people sacrifice or suffer in these ways, Utilitarians have defended this unintuitive consequence on the grounds that our judgments about what is wrong provide us with ‘rules of thumb’ which are useful at the level of commonsense morality but ultimately mistaken at the level of ‘critical theory’.

Utilitarian distribution principles, like the other principles described here, have problems with specification and implementation. Most formulations of Utilitarianism require interpersonal comparisons of utility. This means, for instance, that we must be able to compare the utility one person gains from eating an apple with that another gains from eating an apple. Furthermore, Utilitarianism requires that differences in utility be measured and summed for widely disparate goods (so, for instance, the amount of utility a particular person gains from playing football is measured and compared with the amount of utility another gains from eating a gourmet meal). Critics have argued that such interpersonal utility comparisons are impossible, even in theory, due to one or both of the following: (1) It is not possible to combine all the diverse goods into a single index of ‘utility’ which can measured for an individual; (2) Even if you could do the necessary weighing and combining of the goods to construct such an index for an individual, there is no conceptually adequate way of calibrating such a measure between individuals. (see Elster 1991)

Utilitarians face a greater problem than this theoretical one in determining what material distribution is prescribed by their theory. Those who share similar Utilitarian theoretical principles frequently recommend very different material distributions to implement the principle. This problem occurs for other theories, but appears worse for Utilitarian and Welfare-based distribution principles. Recommendations for distributions or economic structures to implement other distributive principles commonly vary among advocates with similar theoretical principles, but the advocates tend to cluster around particular recommendations. This is not the case for Utilitarianism, with adherents dispersed in their recommendations across the full range of possible distributions and economic structures. For instance, many Preference Utilitarians believe their principle prescribes strongly egalitarian structures with lots of state invention while many other Preference Utilitarians believe it prescribes a laissez faire style of capitalism.

There is an explanation for why Utilitarians are faced with greater difficulties in implementation. Other distributive principles can rule out, relatively quickly, some practical policies on the grounds that they clearly violate the guiding principle, but Utilitarians must examine, in great detail, all the policies on offer. For each policy, they must determine the distribution of goods and services yielded by the policy and at least three other factors: the identity of each person in the distribution (if individuals' utility functions differ); the utility of each person from the goods and services distributed to them; the utility of each person from the policy itself. The size of the information requirements make this task impossible. Hence, broad assumptions must be made and each different set of assumptions will yield a different answer, and so the answers range across the full set of policies on offer. Moreover, there is no obvious way to arbitrate between the different sets of assumptions. For instance, suppose three Utilitarians agree on the same Utilitarian distributive principle. Utilitarian 1 however, asserts that the population's utility function conforms to function A (e.g. people's marginal utility is linear in the goods and services they consume) and is maximized by Policy 1; while Utilitarian 2 asserts that half the population's utility function conforms to function A and half to function B (e.g. people's marginal utility is diminishing) and is maximized by Policy 2; Utilitarian 3 asserts Utilitarian 2 is correct about the utility functions of the population but claims that Policy 3 will maximize utility. What seems impossible for advocates of Utilitarian-distribution principles to answer is how we would arbitrate these claims. If Utilitarian principles are to play a role in debates about distributive justice then this is the most important question to answer.

6. Desert-Based Principles

Another complaint against welfarism is that it ignores, and in fact cannot even make sense of, claims that people deserve certain economic benefits in light of their actions. The complaint is often motivated by the concern that various forms of welfarism treat people as mere containers for well-being, rather than purposeful beings, responsible for their actions and creative in their environments.

The different desert-based principles of distribution differ primarily according to what they identify as the basis for deserving. Most contemporary proposals for desert-bases fit into one of three broad categories:

  1. Contribution: People should be rewarded for their work activity according to the value of their contribution to the social product. (Miller 1976, Miller 1989, Riley 1989)
  2. Effort: People should be rewarded according to the effort they expend in their work activity. (Sadurski 1985a,b, Milne 1986)
  3. Compensation: People should be rewarded according to the costs they incur in their work activity. (Dick 1975, Lamont 1997)

Aristotle argued that virtue should be a basis for distributing rewards, but most contemporary principles owe a larger debt to John Locke. Locke argued people deserve to have those items produced by their toil and industry, the products (or the value thereof) being a fitting reward for their effort. His underlying idea was to guarantee to individuals the fruits of their own labor and abstinence. According to the contemporary desert theorist, people freely apply their abilities and talents, in varying degrees, to socially productive work. People come to deserve varying levels of income by providing goods and services desired by others. (Feinberg) Distributive systems are just insofar as they distribute incomes according to the different levels earned or deserved by the individuals in the society for their productive labors, efforts, or contributions.

Contemporary desert-principles all share the value of raising the standard of living — collectively, ‘the social product’. Under each principle, only activity directed at raising the social product will serve as a basis for deserving income. The concept of desert itself does not yield this value of raising the social product; it is a value societies hold independently. Hence, desert principles identifying desert-bases tied to socially productive activity (productivity, compensation, and effort all being examples of such bases) do not do so because the concept of desert requires this. They do so because societies value higher standards of living, and therefore choose the raising of living standards as the primary value relevant to desert-based distribution. This means that the full development of desert-based principles requires specification (and defense) of those activities which will or will not count as socially productive, and hence as deserving of remuneration. (Lamont 1994)

It is important to distinguish desert-payments from entitlements. For desert theorists a well-designed institutional structure will make it so that many of the entitlements people have are deserved. But, of course, entitlements and just deserts can come apart — a person can be entitled to a payment without it being deserved, just as a person can be entitled to assume the presidential office without deserving it. (Feinberg 1970, 86) Similarly, a person may deserve a payment but not being entitled to it (such instances are potential areas for institutional reform for a desert theorist). Payments designed to give people incentives are a form of entitlement particularly worth distinguishing from desert-payments as they are commonly confused. Incentive-payments are ‘forward-looking’ (Barry 1965, 111-112) in that they are set up to create a situation in the future, while desert-payments are ‘backwards-looking’ that they are justified with reference to work in the present or past. Even though it is possible for the same payment to be both deserved and an incentive, incentives and desert provide distinct rationales for income and should not be conflated. (Lamont 1997)

While some have sought to justify current capitalist distributions via desert-based distributive principles, John Stuart Mill and many since have forcefully argued the contrary claim — that the implementation of a productivity principle would involve dramatic changes in modern market economies and would greatly reduce the inequalities characteristic of them. It is important to note, though, that contemporary Desert-based principles are rarely complete distributive principles. They usually are only designed to cover distribution among working adults, leaving basic welfare needs to be met by other principles.

The specification and implementation problems for desert-based distribution principles revolve mainly around the desert-bases: it is difficult to identify what is to count as a contribution, an effort or a cost, and it is even more difficult to measure these in a complex modern economy.

The main moral objection to desert-based principles is that they make economic benefits depend on factors over which people have little control. John Rawls has made one of the most widely discussed arguments to this effect (Rawls 1971), and while the strong form of this argument has been clearly refuted (Zaitchik, Sher), it remains a problem for desert-based principles. The problem is most pronounced in the case of productivity-based principles — a person's productivity seems clearly to be influenced by many factors over which the person has little control.

It is interesting to note that under most welfare-based principles, it is also the case that people's level of economic benefits depend on factors beyond their control. But welfarists view this as a virtue of their theory, since they think the only morally relevant characteristic of any distribution is the welfare resulting from it. Whether the distribution ties economic benefits to matters beyond our control is morally irrelevant from the welfarist point of view. (As it happens, welfarists often hold the empirical claim that people have little control over their contributions to society anyway.) However, for people's benefits to depend on factors beyond their control is a more awkward result for desert theorists who emphasize the responsibility of people in choosing to engage in more or less productive activities.

7. Libertarian Principles

Most contemporary versions of the principles discussed so far allow some role for the market as a means of achieving the desired distributive pattern — the Difference Principle uses it as a means of helping the least advantaged; utilitarian principles commonly use it as a means of achieving the distributive pattern maximizing utility; desert-based principles rely on it to distribute goods according to desert, etc. In contrast, advocates of Libertarian distributive principles rarely see the market as a means to some desired pattern, since the principle(s) they advocate do not ostensibly propose a ‘pattern’ at all, but instead describe the sorts of acquisitions or exchanges which are themselves just. The market will be just, not as a means to some pattern, but insofar as the exchanges permitted in the market satisfy the conditions of just exchange described by the principles. For Libertarians, just outcomes are those arrived at by the separate just actions of individuals; a particular distributive pattern is not required for justice. Robert Nozick has advanced this version of Libertarianism (Nozick 1974), and is its most well-known contemporary advocate.

Nozick proposes a 3-part "Entitlement Theory".

If the world were wholly just, the following inductive definition would exhaustively cover the subject of justice in holdings:
  1. A person who acquires a holding in accordance with the principle of justice in acquisition is entitled to that holding.
  2. A person who acquires a holding in accordance with the principle of justice in transfer, from someone else entitled to the holding, is entitled to the holding.
  3. No one is entitled to a holding except by (repeated) applications of (a) and (b).

The complete principle of distributive justice would say simply that a distribution is just if everyone is entitled to the holdings they possess under the distribution (Nozick, p.151).

The statement of the Entitlement Theory includes reference to the principles of justice in acquisition and transfer. (For details of these principles see Nozick, pp.149-182.) The principle of justice in transfer is the least controversial and is designed to specify fair contracts while ruling out stealing, fraud, etc. The principle of justice in acquisition is more complicated and more controversial. The principle is meant to govern the gaining of exclusive property rights over the material world. For the justification of these rights, Nozick takes his inspiration from John Locke's idea that everyone ‘owns’ themselves and, by mixing one's labors with the world, self-ownership can generate ownership of some part of the material world. However, of Locke's mixing metaphor, Nozick legitimately asks: ‘...why isn't mixing what I own with what I don't own a way of losing what I own rather than a way of gaining what I don't? If I own a can of tomato juice and spill it in the sea so its molecules... mingle evenly throughout the sea, do I thereby come to own the sea, or have I foolishly dissipated my tomato juice?’ (Nozick 1974, p.174) Nozick concludes that what is significant about mixing our labor with the material world is that in doing so, we tend to increase the value of it, so that self-ownership can lead to ownership of the external world in such cases (Nozick 1974, pp. 149-182).

The obvious objection to this claim is that it is not clear why the first people to acquire some part of the material world should be able to exclude others from it (and, for instance, be the land owners while the later ones become the wage laborers). In response to this objection, Nozick puts a qualification on just acquisition, called the Lockean Proviso, whereby an exclusive acquisition of the external world is just, if, after the acquisition, there is ‘enough and as good left in common for others’. One of the main challenges for Libertarians has been to formulate a morally plausible interpretation of this proviso. According to Nozick's interpretation, an acquisition is just if and only if the position of others after the acquisition is no worse than their position was when the acquisition was unowned or ‘held in common’. For Nozick's critics, his proviso is unacceptably weak. This is because it fails to consider the position others may have achieved under alternative distributions and thereby instantiates the morally dubious criterion of whoever is first gets the exclusive spoils. For example, one can satisfy Nozick's proviso by ‘acquiring’ a beach and charging $1 admission to those who previously were able to use the beach for free, so long as one compensates them with a benefit they deem equally valuable, such as a clean up or life-guarding service on the beach. However, the beach-goers would have been even better off had the more efficient organizer among them acquired the beach, charging only 50 cents for the same service, but this alternative is never considered under Nozick's proviso. (Cohen, 1995)

Will Kymlicka has given a summary of the steps in Nozick's self-ownership argument:

  1. People own themselves.
  2. The world is initially unowned.
  3. You can acquire absolute rights over a disproportionate share of the world, if you do not worsen the condition of others.
  4. It is relatively easy to acquire absolute rights over a disproportionate share of the world. Therefore:
  5. Once private property has been appropriated, a free market in capital and labor is morally required. (Kymlicka, p.112)

The assessment of this argument is quite complex, but the difficulties mentioned above with the proviso call into question the step from (3) to (4).

The challenge for Libertarians then is to find a plausible reading of (3) which will yield (4). Moreover, at one point, Nozick claims the proviso must apply to both acquisitions and transfers, compounding the problem.

Of course, many existing holdings are the result of acquisitions or transfers which at some point did not satisfy principles (a) and (b) above. Hence, Nozick must supplement those principles with a principle of rectification for past injustice. Although he does not specify this principle he does describe its purpose:

This principle uses historical information about previous situations and injustices done in them... and information about the actual course of events that flowed from these injustices, until the present, and it yields a description (or descriptions) of holdings in the society. The principle of rectification presumably will make use of its best estimate of subjunctive information about what would have occurred... if the injustice had not taken place. If the actual description of holdings turns out not to be one of the descriptions yielded by the principle, then one of the descriptions yielded must be realized. (Nozick 1974, pp. 152-153)

Nozick does not make an attempt to provide a principle of rectification. The absence of such a principle is much worse for a historical theory than for a patterned theory. Past injustices systematically undermine the justice of every subsequent distribution in historical theories. Nozick is clear that his historical theory is of no use in evaluating the justice of actual societies until such a theory of rectification is given:

In the absence of [a full treatment of the principle of rectification] applied to a particular society, one cannot use the analysis and theory presented here to condemn any particular scheme of transfer payments, unless it is clear that no considerations of rectification of injustice could apply to justify it. (Nozick 1974, p.231)

Unfortunately for the theory, no such treatment will ever be forthcoming because the task is, for all practical purposes, impossible. The numbers of injustices perpetrated throughout history, both within nations and between them, are enormous and the necessary details of the vast majority of injustices are unavailable. Even if the details of the injustices were available, the counterfactual causal chains could not be reliably determined and, as Derek Parfit has pointed out, in a different context, even the people who would have been born would have been different. (Parfit 1986) As a consequence, Nozick's entitlement theory will never provide any guidance as to what the current distribution of material holdings should be nor what distributions or redistributions are legitimate or illegitimate. (Indeed Nozick suggests, for instance, the Difference Principle may be the best implementation of the principle of rectification.) Although Nozick is fairly candid about this consequence, many of his supporters and critics have ignored it and have carried on a vigorous debate as though his theory is an attempt to tell us something about the justice of current economic distributions.

Libertarians inspired by Nozick usually advocate a system in which there are exclusive property rights, with the role of the government restricted to the protection of these property rights. The property rights commonly rule out taxation for purposes other than raising the funds necessary to protect property rights. The strongest critique of any attempt to institute such a system of legally protected property rights comes, as we have seen, from Nozick's theory itself — there seems no obvious reason to give strong legal protection to property rights which have arisen through violations of the just principles of acquisition and transfer. But putting this critique to one side for a moment, what other arguments are made in favor of exclusionary property rights?

As already noted, Nozick argues that because people own themselves and hence their talents, they own whatever they can produce with these talents. Moreover, it is possible in a free market to sell the products of exercising one's talents. Any taxation of the income from such selling, according to Nozick, ‘institute[s] (partial) ownership by others of people and their actions and labor’. (Nozick, p.172) People, according to this argument, have these exclusive rights of ownership. Taxation then, simply involves violating these rights and allowing some people to own (partially) other people. Moreover, it is argued, any system not legally recognizing these rights violates Kant's maxim to treat people always as ends in themselves and never merely as a means. The two main difficulties with this argument have been: (1) to show that self-ownership is only compatible with having such strong exclusive property rights; and (2) that a system of exclusive property rights is the best system for treating people with respect, as ends in themselves.

Nozick candidly accepts that he does not himself give a systematic moral justification of the exclusionary property rights he advocates: ‘This book does not present a precise theory of the moral basis of individual rights.’ (Nozick, p.xiv) But others have tried to provide more systematic justifications of similar rights (Lomasky, Steiner) or to develop, more fully, justifications to which Nozick alludes.

In addition to the arguments from self-ownership, and the requirement to treat people as ends in themselves, the most common other route for trying to justify exclusive property rights has been to argue that they are required for the maximization of freedom and/or liberty or the minimization of violations of these. (Hayek) As an empirical claim though, this appears to be false. If we compare countries with less exclusionary property rights (e.g. more taxation) with countries with more exclusionary property regimes, we see no systematic advantage in freedoms/liberties enjoyed by people in the latter countries. (Of course, we do see a difference in distribution of such freedoms/liberties in the latter countries, the richer have more and the poorer less, while in the former they are more evenly distributed.) Now if Libertarians restrict what counts as a valuable freedom/liberty (and discount other freedoms/liberties people value), it will follow that exclusionary property rights are required to maximize freedom/liberty or to minimize violations of these. But the challenge for these Libertarians is to show why only their favored liberties and freedoms are valuable, and not those which are weakened by a system of exclusive property rights.

8. Feminist Principles

There is no one feminist conception of distributive justice; theorists who name themselves feminists defend positions across the political spectrum. Hence, feminists offer distinctive versions of all the theories considered so far as well as others. One way of thinking about what unifies many feminist theorists is an interest in what difference, if any, the practical experience of gender makes to the subject matter or study of justice; how different feminists answer this question distinguishes them from each other and from those alternative distributive principles which most inspire their thinking.

The distributive principles so far outlined, with the exception of strict egalitarianism, could be classified as liberal theories — they both inform, and are the product of, the liberal democracies which have emerged over the last two centuries. Lumping them together this way, though clumsy, makes the task of understanding the emergence of feminist critiques (and the subsequent positive theories) much easier.

John Stuart Mill in The Subjection of Women (1869) gives one of the clearest early feminist critiques of the political and distributive structures of the emerging liberal democracies. His writings provide the starting point for many contemporary liberal feminists. Mill argued that the principles associated with the developing liberalism of his time required equal political status for women. The principles Mill explicitly mentions include a rejection of the aristocracy of birth, equal opportunity in education and in the marketplace, equal rights to hold property, a rejection of the man as the legal head of the household, and equal rights to political participation. Feminists who follow Mill believe that a proper recognition of the position of women in society requires that women be given equal and the same rights as men have, and that these primarily protect their liberty and their status as equal persons under the law. Thus, government regulation should not prevent women from competing on equal terms with men in educational, professional, marketplace and political institutions. From the point of view of other feminisms, the liberal feminist position is a conservative one, in the sense that it requires the proper inclusion for women of the rights, protections, and opportunities previously secured for men, rather than a fundamental change to the traditional liberal position. The problem for women, on this view, is not liberalism but the failure of society and the State to properly instantiate liberal principles.

One phrase or motto around which a whole range of feminists have rallied, however, marks a significant break with Mill's liberalism: ‘the personal is political.’ Feminists have offered a variety of interpretations of this motto, many of which take the form of a critique of liberal theories. Mill was crucial in developing the liberal doctrine of limiting the state's intervention in the private lives of citizens. Many contemporary feminists have argued that the resulting liberal theories of justice have fundamentally been unable to accommodate the injustices that have their origins in this ‘protected’ private sphere. This particular feminist critique has also been a primary source of inspiration for the broader multicultural critique of liberalism. The liberal commitments to government neutrality and to a protected personal sphere of liberty, where the government must not interfere, have been primary critical targets.

While issues about neutrality and personal liberty go beyond debates about distributive justice they also have application within these debates. The feminist critics recognize that liberalism correctly identifies the government as one potential source of oppression against individuals, and therefore recommends powerful political protections of individual liberty. They argue, however, that liberal theories of distributive justice are unable to address the oppression which surfaces in the so-called private sphere of government non-interference. Susan Moller Okin, for example, documents the effects of the institution of the nuclear family, arguing that the consequence of this institution is a position of systematic material and political inequality for women. Standard liberal theories, committed to neutrality in the private sphere, seem powerless to address (or sometimes even recognize) striking and lasting inequalities for women, minorities, or historically oppressed racial groups, when these are merely the cumulative effect of individuals' free behavior. Okin and others demonstrate, for example, that women have substantial disadvantages in competing in the market because of childrearing responsibilities which are not equally shared with men. As a consequence, any theory relying on market mechanisms, including most liberal theories, will yield systems which result in women systematically having less income and wealth than men. Thus, feminists have challenged contemporary political theorists to rethink the boundaries of political authority in the name of securing a just outcome for women and other historically oppressed groups.

While the political effects of personal freedom pose a serious challenge to contemporary liberal theories of distributive justice, the feminist critiques are somewhat puzzling because, as Jean Hampton puts it, many feminists appear to complain in the name of liberal values. In other words, their claims about the fundamental flaws of liberalism at the same time leave in tact the various ideals of liberty and equality which inspire the liberal theories of justice. Moreover, the task of defining feasible pathways for modifying the structure of liberal democracies without undermining their virtues and protections has proved more difficult than the setting out the criticisms of liberalism. Indeed, despite a legitimate feminist worry about the effects of so-called government neutrality on women's material status, the relative neutrality of liberal democracies compared to non-liberal societies has been one of the significant contributing factors both to the flourishing of feminist theory and to the many significant practical gains women in liberal democracies have made relative to women in other parts of the world. The challenge, being taken up by many, is to navigate both a coherent theoretical and practical path in response to the best feminist critiques available (see the entry on feminist ethics).

9. Methodology and Empirical Beliefs about Distributive Justice

How are we to go about choosing between the different distributive principles on offer, and respond to criticisms of the principles? Unfortunately, few philosophers explicitly discuss the methodology they are using. The most notable exception is John Rawls (1971, 1974) who explicitly brought the method of wide reflective equilibrium to political philosophy. This method has been brilliantly discussed by Norman Daniels over the years and the reader is strongly encouraged to refer to his entry (see reflective equilibrium) to understand how to evaluate, revise and choose between normative principles. While there is no point in reiterating the method here there are some supplementary issues worth noting.

Empirical data on the beliefs of the population about distributive justice was not available when Rawls published A Theory of Justice (Rawls 1971) but much empirical work has since been completed. Swift (1995, 1999) and Miller (1999, chaps. 3-4) have provided surveys of this literature and arguments for why those committed to the method of reflective equilibrium in distributive justice literature should take the beliefs of the population seriously, though not uncritically. Indeed, some go even further, arguing that the distributive decisions arising through the legitimate application of particular democratic processes might even, at least in part, constitute distributive justice.(Walzer 1984) Data on people's beliefs about distributive justice is also useful for addressing the necessary intersection between philosophical and political processes. Such beliefs put constraints on what institutional and policy reforms are practically achievable in any generation — especially when the society is committed to democratic processes.

Two final methodological issues need to be noted. The first concerns the distinctive role counterexamples play in debates about distributive justice. As noted above, the overarching methodological concern of the distributive justice literature must be, in the first instance, the pressing choice of how the benefits and burdens of economic activity should be distributed, rather than the mere uncovering of abstract truth. Principles are to be implemented in real societies with the problems and constraints inherent in such application. Given this, pointing out that the application of any particular principle will have some, perhaps many, immoral results will not by itself constitute a fatal counterexample to any distributive theory. Such counter-evidence to a theory would only be fatal if there were an alternative, or improved, version of the theory, which, if fully implemented, would yield a morally preferable society overall. So, it is at least possible that the best distributive theory, when implemented, might yield a system which still has many injustices and/or negative consequences. This practical aspect partly distinguishes the role of counterexamples in distributive justice theory from many other philosophical areas. Given that distributive justice is about what to do now, not just what to think, alternate distributive theories must, in part, compete as comprehensive systems which take into account the practical constraints we face.

The second and related methodological point is that the evaluation of alternate distributive principles requires us (and their advocates) to consider the application of the distributive principle in the world. If it is uncertain or indeterminate how a particular distributive principle might in practice apply to the ordering of real societies, then this principle is not yet a serious candidate for our consideration. This is also true of principles whose implementation is practically impossible given the institutional/psychological/informational/technical constraints of a society. Distributive justice is not an area where we can say an idea is good in theory but not in practice. If it is not good in practice, then it is not good in theory either.


Strict Egalitarianism

The Difference Principle

Resource-Based Principles

Welfare-Based Principles

Desert-Based Principles

Libertarian Principles

Feminist Principles

Methodology and Empirical Beliefs about Distributive Justice

Further Theories and General Reference

Extended Bibliography

Extended Bibliography on Distributive Justice [Supplement]

Other Internet Resources

Current Issues in Distributive Justive

People in Distributive Justice

Further Resources

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Related Entries

consequentialism | desert | egalitarianism | feminist (interventions): ethics | justice: as a virtue | justice: intergenerational | justice: international | liberalism | libertarianism | Locke, John | Marx, Karl | Mill, John Stuart | property | reflective equilibrium