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Divine Simplicity

First published Mon Mar 20, 2006

According to the classical theism of Augustine, Anselm, Aquinas and their adherents, God is radically unlike creatures in that he is devoid of any complexity or composition, whether physical or metaphysical. Besides lacking spatial and temporal parts, God is free of matter/form composition, potency/act composition, and existence/essence composition. There is also no real distinction between God as subject of his attributes and his attributes. God is thus in a sense requiring clarification identical to each of his attributes, which implies that each attribute is identical to every other one. God is omniscient, then, not in virtue of instantiating or exemplifying omniscience — which would imply a real distinction between God and the property of omniscience — but by being omniscience. And the same holds for each of the divine omni-attributes: God is what he has. As identical to each of his attributes, God is identical to his nature. And since his nature or essence is identical to his existence, God is identical to his existence. This is the doctrine of divine simplicity (DDS). It is to be understood as an affirmation of God's absolute transcendence of creatures. God is not only radically non-anthropomorphic, but radically non-creaturomorphic, not only in respect of the properties he possesses, but in his manner of possessing them. God, we could say, differs in his very ontology from any and all created beings.

1. Motivation

What could motivate such a strange and seemingly incoherent doctrine? One central consideration derives from the Anselmian definition of God as maximally perfect, as that than which no greater can be conceived. A God who was less than maximally perfect would not be an absolute reality and appropriate object of worship. A God who was less than ultimate and absolute would be an idol. Now an absolute reality must be a se, from itself, and so not dependent on anything distinct from itself for either its nature or its existence. If God had properties in the way creatures have them, however, he would be distinct from them and so dependent on them. This is the case whether one thinks of a property of x as a constituent of x, or as an entity external to x to which x is tied by the asymmetrical relation (or nonrelational tie) of instantiation. If the properties of x are constituents or ontological (proper) parts of x, then x will depend on them in the same way that any whole composed of parts depends on its parts. But if x is tied to its properties by the asymmetrical relation of instantiation, it is still the case that x will depend on them: if x is F in virtue of x's instantiation of F-ness, then F-ness is a logically prior condition of x's being F. In sum, the divine aseity would seem to require that God be rather have his attributes.

One can also arrive at the simplicity doctrine via the divine necessity. As maximally perfect, as that than which no greater can be conceived, God must be a metaphysically necessary being, one that cannot not exist. A necessary being is one whose possibility entails its existence, and whose nonexistence entails its impossibility. But what could be the ground of this necessity of existence if not the identity in God of essence and existence, possibility and actuality? Saying that God exists in all metaphysically possible worlds does not provide a ground, but merely a graphic Leibnizian representation, of the notion of necessary being. A divine being cannot possess contingent modal status: if God exists, then he is necessary, and if he does not exist, then he is impossible. So if God exists, then there is a very tight connection between the divine nature and the divine existence. The simplicity doctrine assays this ‘tightness’ as identity. The divine simplicity grounds the divine necessity. God is necessary because he is simple. It is easy to see that the divine simplicity also grounds God's possession of essential properties. God has his attributes essentially because he is identical to his attributes. Nothing is more essential to a thing than something to which it is identical.

Besides perfection and necessity, immateriality, eternity, and immutability also seem to point to simplicity as their ground. Because God is simple, he cannot have parts and so cannot have material or temporal parts. And because God is simple, he cannot harbor any unrealized potentialities, and so must be immutable. The centrality of DDS to medieval philosophical theology is shown by its position in the order of topics in Aquinas' Summa Theologica. It occurs as Question 3 right after Question 2 on the existence of God.

2. The Question of Coherence

The very notion of an ontologically simple being will be dismissed by many as self-evidently incoherent. Among theists, there are those who will argue that DDS does not cohere with some other theistic commitment such as the doctrine of the Trinity or the divine freedom of the will. The concern of this article is not with such intramural coherence questions, but with the question of whether or not DDS is coherent at all. This broad coherence question is not whether the doctrine is true, or even possibly true; the question is whether it is possible for us to think it without obvious contradiction. Ultimately, the broad coherence question concerns the sort of general ontological framework that would allow DDS to be discussed as a live option as opposed to being dismissed as incoherent from the outset.

A central threat to coherence is the question of how a thing could be identical to its properties. Alvin Plantinga (1980, p. 47) maintains that if God is identical to his properties, then he is a property, and they are a single property, in which case God is a single property. Given that properties are abstract entities, and abstracta are causally inert, then God is abstract and causally inert — which is of course inconsistent with the core tenet of classical theism according to which God is the personal creator and sustainer of every contingent being. No abstract object is a person or a causal agent. No abstract object can be omniscient, or indeed know anything at all. More fundamentally, no abstract object can be identical to any concrete object. Similar objections have been raised by Richard Gale (1991, p. 23 ff.) and others.

It is easy to see that Plantinga-style objections will not appear decisive to those who reject his ontological framework. Plantinga, along with many other philosophers, thinks of individuals and properties as belonging to radically disjoint realms despite the fact that individuals exemplify properties. Individuals are causally efficacious concreta whereas properties are casually impotent abstracta. Such an approach to ontology renders the divine simplicity inconceivable from the outset. For if God is a concrete individual and his nature (conceived perhaps as the conjunction of his omni-attributes) is an abstract property, then the general ontology rules out an identity of God with his nature. Any such identity would violate the separateness of the two realms. To identify an unexemplifiable concretum with an exemplifiable abstractum would amount to an ontological category-mistake. At most, a Plantinga-style approach allows for God's exemplification of his nature where the (first-level) exemplification relation, unlike the identity relation, is asymmetrical and irreflexive and so enforces the non-identity of its relata. In short, if God exemplifies his nature, then God is distinct from his nature.

3. Constituent Versus Nonconstituent Ontology

Since a Plantinga-type approach to ontology rules out DDS from the outset, no sophisticated adherent of the doctrine is likely to adopt such an approach. The DDS defender will so adjust his ontology as to accommodate an ontologically simple being. Indeed, as Nicholas Wolterstorff (1991) notes, classical proponents of DDS such as Aquinas had a radically different ontological style, one that allowed for the coherent conceivability of DDS. They did not think of individuals as related to their properties as to abtracta external to them, but as having properties as ontological constituents. They, and some atheist contemporaries as well, think in terms of a "constituent ontology" as opposed to what Wolterstorff calls a "relation ontology" or what I prefer to call a nonconstituent ontology. If one takes a thing's nature to be a constituent of it, together with some individuating constituent such as signate or designated matter (materia signata) in the case of material beings, then the notion of an immaterial simple being becomes conceivable. Material beings are individuated and diversified by their signate matter. Thus Socrates and Plato, though the same in nature, differ numerically in virtue of their different portions of materia signata. Matter makes them individuals, and matter makes them numerically diverse individuals. God, however, being immaterial, is a self-individuating nature. His individuation does not require something external to his nature such as matter. In Thomist terms, in God nature and suppositum are identical. (ST I, q. 3, art. 3) The divine nature is not an abstract object related across an ontological chasm to a concrete individual; the divine nature is self-individuating. This is not entirely clear, but it is not obviously incoherent. And our question, you will recall, is concerned solely with coherence.

3.1 God and His Nature

One can see from this that Plantinga-type objections are not compelling. A nonconstituent ontologist like Plantinga may be represented as arguing by Modus Ponens: If God exemplifies his nature, then he is distinct from it; God exemplifies his nature; ergo, God is distinct from his nature, and DDS is false. But the nonconstituent ontologist is within his epistemic rights in switching to Modus Tollens: If God exemplifies his nature, then he is distinct from it; God is not distinct from his nature; ergo, God does not exemplify his nature but has his nature by being identical with it.

We have just seen how God can be identical to his nature where "can be" is elliptical for "can be conceived without obvious incoherence." But there are two other problems that also pose a serious threat to the coherence of DDS. One concerns how God can be identical to his existence, the other how the divine attributes can be identical to each other.

3.2 God and His Existence

Taking the first question first, on a Plantinga-style approach, it makes no sense to say that God is identical either to existence or to his existence. For Plantinga, existence is a first-level property that everything exemplifies. Given that "exemplifies" picks out a two-term irreflexive and asymmetrical relation, God cannot be identical with existence. Nor can God be identical to his existence. The latter is a presumably a state of affairs, an abstract object, and no concretum can be identical with an abstractum on pain of violating the separateness of the concrete and abstract realms.

There are, however, plenty of reasons (Vallicella 2002, Ch. 2) to reject the view that existence is a first-level property and the ontological schemes that entail it. One intuition that many of us share is that existence is not one of an individual's properties, but that in virtue of which it has any properties in the first place: it is more like the unity or cohesion of an individual's properties (Vallicella 2002, Ch. 6).

3.3 The Identity of the Divine Attributes

The foregoing may explain how it is conceivable without obvious incoherence that God and his nature and God and his existence be identical, but how does it answer the second question? How does it explain the conceivability without obvious incoherence of the identity of the divine attributes with each other? If each attribute is identical to God, then each attribute is identical to each other by the Transitivity of Identity. For example, if God = omniscience, and God = omnipotence, then omniscience = omnipotence. But how could each attribute be identical to God? If we can understand how each attribute can be identical to God, then we can understand how each can be identical to every other one.

We have already seen how, if we embrace a constituent approach to ontology, the divine nature can be coherently conceived as identical to God. Being immaterial, there is nothing in God to distinguish him from his nature. So he is identical to his nature. (Admittedly, one must carefully examine the inference from "nothing distinguishes x and y" to "x and y are identical.") The divine nature is, or can be thought of as, a conjunctive property. So there is at least one property that is self-instantiating: it has itself as its sole instance, and indeed as its sole possible instance. If this is coherently conceivable, then the same will be true of perfect knowledge, perfect power, and so on: if instantiated, these attributes are self-instantiated in every possible world and by the same thing in every possible world (Vallicella 1992). Thus not only is the divine nature identical to an individual, each divine perfection is identical to an individual, namely God, whence it follows that each perfection is identical to every other one.

A structurally similar approach is suggested by Christopher Hughes. Think of first-level properties as David Lewis does: as sets of actual and possible individuals. Then the property of being red will be the set of all actual and possible red individuals and the property of being perfectly powerful will be the set consisting of all actual and possible perfectly powerful individuals. But there is only one such individual, God. Only God is perfectly powerful and only God can be perfectly powerful. So perfect power = {God}. Now Hughes (1989, p. 65) finds some support in Quine for the notion that a set and its singleton are identical. I would add that if we have already abandoned nonconstituent ontology with its rigid bifurcation of the concrete and the abstract according to which the two realms are disjoint, then we no longer have a reason to argue that a concrete individual and its singleton must be distinct because the former is concrete while the latter is abstract. Constituent ontology allows for a sort of ‘coalescence’ of the concrete and the abstract, the particular and the universal. Indeed, such a coalescence is what we find in the simple God who is in some sense both concrete and abstract in that he is a nature that is his own suppositum.

Thus there appears to be justification for the move from perfect power = {God} to perfect power = God. And similarly for perfect knowledge, etc. In this way one can render coherent the notion that the perfections constitutive of the divine nature are identical with one another. For if each is identical to God, then each is identical to every other one.

4. Preserving Divine Transcendence While Avoiding Negative Theology

So far we have seen how God can be (i) identical to his nature, (ii) identical to his existence, and (iii) such that his omni-attributes are identical to one another. But a very serious problem remains, a problem that arises when we consider properties shared by God and creatures. It is obvious that the divine perfections cannot be shared with creatures: only God is perfectly powerful, wise, good, and so on. But there must be some properties that God and creatures share if God is not to be a wholly other than creatures and out of all relation to them. These shared properties, however, pose a threat to DDS. The problem in a nutshell is to reconcile the divine transcendence, of which DDS is an expression, with the need for some commensurability between God and creatures. The problem, in other words, is to find a way of preserving transcendence while avoiding a self-vitiating negative theology according to which nothing can be positively affirmed of God, not even that he exists.

God is powerful, but so is Socrates. The use of ‘powerful’ in ‘God is powerful’ and ‘Socrates is powerful’ is not equivocal. That God is perfectly powerful while Socrates is imperfectly powerful does not alter the fact that both are powerful. Whether a thing is perfectly powerful or imperfectly powerful, it is powerful. There is a difference in degree of power, but the difference in degree seems to presuppose (and thus entail) a sameness in respect of being powerful. Now if God and Socrates are both powerful, then God has a property with which he is not identical, namely, the property of being powerful, and this contradicts DDS. For if God is identical with the property of being powerful, then he cannot share this property with Socrates. The argument, then, is this:

(1) Necessarily, for any x, if x is perfectly (maximally) F, then x is F.

From (1) together with the premise that God is perfectly powerful, it follows that

(2) God is powerful.

But among creatures we also find agents of varying degrees of power, so it is also true that

(3) Socrates is powerful.

It follows from (2) and (3) that

(4) There are properties that God and creatures share.

If x and y share a property P, then P is distinct from both x and y. Therefore,

(5) There are properties of God with which God is not identical, which implies that DDS is false.

4.1 Proposal One: Sameness of Predicate No Guarantee of Sameness of Property

Graham Oppy (2003) suggests a way to defeat the foregoing argument. Oppy (in effect) rejects the inference from (2) and (3) to (4). Given the truth of ‘God is powerful’ and ‘Socrates is powerful,’ it does not follow that there is a property expressed by the predicate ‘powerful’ that is shared by God and Socrates. On Oppy's approach, both sentences are true, and the predicate ‘powerful’ has the same sense in both sentences. There is no equivocation and no analogy either. It is just that there is no one property that is expressed by the predicate in its two occurrences. If this right, then there is no warrant for (4) and the above argument against DDS collapses.

Oppy is not denying that many predicates express properties; he is denying that all do. Taking a page from David Armstrong, he is saying that predicates and their senses provide no sure guidance as to what properties (Armstrongian immanent universals) the world contains. It follows that the ontological structure of the truth-maker of a true sentence cannot be read off from the syntactic structure of the sentence of which it is the truth-maker. Therefore, the fact that our two sentences (3) and (4) have the form a is F does not warrant the conclusion that the respective truth-makers have the structure: particular-exemplifying-same universal. Oppy writes:

That two sentences of the form ‘a is red’ and ‘b is red’ are both true does not entail that there is some universal that plays a role in making both of these sentences true; it is possible that none of the universals that play a role in making true the sentence ‘a is red’ have any role in making true the sentence ‘b is red.’ (This point is supported by those lines of thought which suggest that, from a scientific standpoint, ‘redness’ constitutes a highly gerrymandered and heterogeneous ‘kind.’) (Oppy 2003, p. 15)

The idea is essentially this. Suppose that something is an H if and only if it is either an F or a G. One can easily see that if a is H and b is H, it does not follow that there is some one property that they share. For it might be that a is H in virtue of a's exemplifying F-ness and b is H in virtue of b's exemplifying G-ness. Applied to Socrates and the simple God: Socrates is powerful in virtue of exemplifying P1 while God is powerful in virtue of exemplifying P2. Thus there is no one property, the property of being powerful, that both exemplify. So (4) above is false, and the argument against DDS collapses. There are problems with Oppy's defense of DDS, but to discuss them would unduly expand the scope of this article. So what I will do instead is advance to a second, more promising way of defusing the objection.

4.2 Proposal Two: 'Perfect' as an Alienans Adjective

The above argument against DDS requires the assumption that if x is perfectly F, then x is F. This is highly plausible but not quite obvious, since as Barry Miller (1996, Ch. 5) argues, ‘perfect’ might be an alienans adjective. An alienans adjective is one that shifts, alters, alienates, the sense of the noun that it modifies. Thus ‘decoy’ in ‘decoy duck’ is an alienans adjective: from the fact that a thing is a decoy duck one cannot infer that it is a duck in the way in which one can infer from the fact that a thing is a male duck that it is a duck. So if ‘perfectly’ in ‘perfectly powerful’ is an alienans adjective, then God can be perfectly powerful without being powerful, and the above objection to DDS collapses.

At first glance, this may appear to be a senseless suggestion. Power is an attribute that admits of degrees. Perfect power is therefore quite naturally viewed as the maximal degree of power. So viewed, perfect power is generically identical with any submaximal degree of power. According to Miller, however, there is an important distinction between a limit simpliciter and a limit case. A limit simpliciter differs merely in degree from that of which it is the limit simpliciter, whereas a limit case differs absolutely from that of which it is the limit case. Thus the limit simpliciter of an F is an F, while the limit case of an F is not an F. What Miller argues is that the divine perfections are limit cases, not limits simpliciter, of such properties as power and knowledge. As such, they have nothing generically in common with the corresponding attributes in creatures.

To appreciate the limit simpliciter/limit case distinction, consider the speed of moving bodies. It has an upper limit, the speed of light. This is a limit simpliciter. But the lower limit, namely the speed 0 km/sec, is a limit case and not a limit simpliciter. Whereas the upper limit simpliciter is a speed, the lower limit case is not a speed. A particle moving at 0 km/sec is not moving. For a second example, consider the series: 3-place predicable, 2-place predicable, 1-place predicable. Since a predicable (e.g., "___ is wise") must have at least one place to be a predicable, a 1-place predicable is a limit simpliciter of the ordered series of predicables. Although talk of zero-place predicables comes naturally, as when we speak of a proposition as a zero-place predicable, a zero-place predicable is no more a predicable than negative growth is growth. "Zero-place" is an alienans adjective like "negative" in "negative growth." So a zero-place predicable is not a limit simpliciter of the series in question, but a limit case of this series: it is not a member of the series of which it is the limit case. It nevertheless stands in some relation to the members of the series inasmuch as they and the way they are ordered point to the limit case. (Miller 1996, p. 8)

The idea, then, is that God's power is not the maximum, or limit simpliciter, of an ordered series of instances of power, but the limit case of power. This implies that God's power is not an instance of power any more than a zero-place predicable is a predicable. No doubt this will surprise the perfect-being theologians, but, in mitigation, it can be said that God's power, though not an instance of power, is that to which the ordered series of power-instances points, and is therefore something to which the members of that series stand in a definite relation.

Miller's approach allows us to reject the premise of the above argument. The premise stated in effect that anything that is perfectly powerful is powerful. But if Miller is right, and God's power is not the limit simpliciter of an ordered series of instances of power, and thus itself an instance of power, but is instead a limit case of power, then what is perfectly powerful need not be an instance of power.

5. Coda: Nondivine Simple Entities in Contemporary Philosophy

We have surveyed some but not all of the problems DDS faces, and have considered some of the ways of addressing them. We conclude by tying in our topic with some contemporary concerns the better to prepare the reader for taking DDS seriously.

One way to soften up the contemporary reader for the possible coherence of DDS is by adducing some garden variety examples of contemporary philosophical posits that are ontologically simple in one or more of the ways in which God is said to be simple. Three candidates suggest themselves: tropes, Lewisian possibilia, and Meinongian possibilia. To save space, tropes alone will be discussed.

Tropes are ontologically simple entities. On trope theory, properties are assayed not as universals but as particulars: the redness of a tomato is as particular, as unrepeatable, as the tomato. Thus a tomato is red, not in virtue of exemplifying a universal, but by having a redness trope as one of its constituents (on one version of trope theory) or by being a substratum in which a redness trope inheres (on a second theory). A trope is a simple entity in that there is no distinction between it and the property it ‘has.’ Thus a redness trope is red , but it is not red by instantiating redness, or by having redness as a constituent, but by being (a bit of) redness. So a trope is what it has. It has redness by being identical to (a bit of) redness. In this respect it is like God who is what he has. God has omniscience by being (identical to) omniscience. Just as there is no distinction between God and his omniscience, there is no distinction in a redness trope between the trope and its redness. And just as the simple God is not a particular exemplifying universals, a trope is not a particular exemplifying a universal. In both cases we have a particular that is also a property, a subject of predication that is also a predicable entity, where the predicable entity is predicated of itself. Given that God is omniscience, he is predicable of himself. Given that a redness trope is a redness, it is predicable of itself. An important difference, of course, is that whereas God is unique, tropes are not: there is and can be only one God, but there are many redness tropes.

Not only is each trope identical to the property it has, in each trope there is an identity of essence and existence. A trope is neither a bare particular nor an uninstantiated property. It is a property-instance, an indissoluble unity of a property and itself as instance of itself. As property, it is an essence, as instance, it is the existence of that essence. Because it is simple, essence and existence are identical in it. Tropes are thus necessary beings (beings whose very possibility entails their actuality) as they must be if they are to serve as the ontological building blocks of everything else (on the dominant one-category version of trope theory). In the necessity of their existence, tropes resemble God.

If one can bring oneself to countenance tropes, then one cannot object to the simple God on the ground that (i) nothing can be identical to its properties, or (ii) in nothing are essence and existence identical. For tropes are counterexamples to (i) and (ii).


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eternity | God: and other necessary beings | immutability | simplicity