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God and Other Necessary Beings

First published Fri Apr 29, 2005

It is commonly accepted that there are two sorts of existent entities: those that exist but could have failed to exist, and those that could not have failed to exist. Entities of the first sort are contingent beings; entities of the second sort are necessary beings.[1] We will be concerned with the latter sort of entity in this article.

There are various entities which, if they exist, would be candidates for necessary beings: God, propositions, relations, properties, states of affairs, possible worlds, and numbers, among others. Note that the first entity in this list is a concrete entity, while the rest are abstract entities.[2] Many interesting philosophical questions arise when one inquires about necessary beings: What makes it the case that they exist necessarily? Is there a grounding for their necessary existence? Do some of them depend on others? If so, how might one understand the dependence relation?

1. God as a Necessary Being

The “classical” conception of God includes God's necessary existence (see Plantinga 1974a, 1974b, 1980, Morris 1987a (in particular chapter 7, “Absolute Creation,” written with Christopher Menzel), 1987b, Wierenga 1989, Adams 1983; and MacDonald 1991). Perhaps the strongest motivation for thinking that God exists necessarily is perfect-being or Anselmian theology. On an “Anselmian” conception of God, God is the greatest possible being; it is in the very nature of God that he essentially (and necessarily) possess all compossible perfections. Necessary existence is a perfection, it is thought, and therefore God must possess it. One should note that denying God's necessary existence does not entail that God or anyone else can commit “deicide.” It is far more plausible to think that for any world W that is such that God exists at some time in W, God exists at every time in W. Anselmian theists also typically think that God is essentially (and thus necessarily) omniscient, omnipotent, and maximally good.

A second reason for accepting the necessary existence of God would be available if one accepted the ontological argument as a sound argument. There are, of course, many ontological arguments. But, all of them entail that God exists necessarily. (Their premises are necessary truths, and if a necessary truth or truths entails another truth p, p must be necessary). The most sophisticated version of the argument has been formulated by Alvin Plantinga (1974a, 1974b, 1990). This motivation is, of course, closely tied to the first motivation.

A final reason for thinking that God exists necessarily is one that we will consider in-depth in the next section of the essay: Abstract objects depend on God for their existence, and abstract objects exist in every world; therefore, God exists in every world (see Plantinga 1980, Davidson 1999).

2. God and Abstract Objects

Historically, many theists have thought that anything that exists must depend on God for its existence. Call this the sovereignty-aseity intuition (see Plantinga 1980, Davidson 1999). Abstract objects exist, and so they too must depend on God for their existence. But problems arise at this point (Wierenga 1998, Davidson 1999). Consider the following proposition, which seems clearly true:

(1) Necessarily, x depends on y for its existence iff y were not to exist, neither would x.

Now, consider the number four. If it depends on God for its existence, then the truth of Four exists depends counterfactually on the truth of the proposition God exists; if God exists were false, then Four exists would be false. According to the widely-accepted Lewis (1973) semantics for counterfactuals, any proposition is counterfactually implied by a necessarily false proposition. However, It is false that four exists is necessarily false, and thus counterfactually implies any proposition. So, it's also true that if four didn't exist, neither would God, and by (1) God depends on four for God's existence. This dependence relationship is problematic; the dependence relation between God and abstracta should be asymmetrical if we are to understand the claim that God is the source of being for abstract objects.

There are four solutions that typically are discussed in the literature. The first is to think that (1) is false. One might say something such as the following. “(1) does look prima facie very plausible. But its plausibility comes from considering contingently existing objects. When we consider abstract objects in light of a principle like (1), our intuitions break down. Denying the truth of (1) in this case is not as damaging as it might appear at first; we still can affirm its truth with respect to contingently existing entities.”

However, one might insist that it is crucial to understanding the claim that some object x depends on some object y that the correct asymmetrical dependence relationship hold between the two. This claim has considerable intuitive force, one might think. However, it leaves the task of specifying exactly what the relation is.

A second solution is to deny the claim that abstract objects exist necessarily. Up to this point, we have been speaking of the existence of abstracta depending on the existence of God. But, how exactly do they depend on God's existence? Is it merely God's existence on which they depend, or are they dependent on some feature of God? If a particular cup depends on my existence for its existence, it is not my mere existence that explains why it exists. It is true that if I did not exist then neither would it. But, it exists because of certain activities in which I engaged: Shaping clay, firing the clay in a kiln, and the like. Similarly, theists have thought that there are two features of God on which abstract objects might depend: God's intellect and God's will. Historically, figures such as Aquinas (ST Ia, 15; SCG I 51-54), Anselm, and most-famously, Leibniz (e.g. Monadology 43-45) claimed that abstract objects depend on God's cognitive activity (more particularly are God's thoughts or exist “in God's mind”) which, at least with respect to this sort of cognitive activity, is not subject to God's will, and more particularly, God cannot think other than he does. Descartes famously held that the modal status of propositions depends on God's will. So, had God willed that 2+2=5 be true (and he could have willed this), 2+2=5 would have been true.[3]

Suppose we take a Cartesian approach to the relationship between God and abstracta. If the modal status of propositions depends on God's volition, and this entails that it could have been false that 2+2=4, we might maintain that strictly, there are no necessary truths or falsehoods. Thus, the problem with dependence goes away; we do not have to worry about trivial counterfactual implication from necessary falsehoods.

In the eyes of most philosophers, it's not clear this solution is coherent, much less that it has any plausibility to it. It requires that we take truths of logic and arithmetic, which are paradigm examples of necessary truths, as not necessary after all.

A third solution to the problem starts with the Leibnizian conception of the relationship between God and abstract objects. Suppose we think that abstract objects are divine thoughts. Furthermore, suppose we think, along with the Medievals, that God is simple.[4] Divine simplicity allows us to say that God is identical with each of his attributes, and in particular with his thoughts. So, the number four is identical with God, and the sentences “God exists” and “Four exists” express the same proposition. So, it becomes unproblematic that the truth of God exists depends on the truth of Four exists; any proposition will be counterfactually dependent on itself.

This solution, like the last, requires one to accept quite a bit of metaphysical baggage. Although divine simplicity has contemporary defenders of its coherence, it also has many detractors (Plantinga 1980 contains a particularly incisive critique of divine simplicity). If one already accepts divine simplicity, then one has a ready answer to the problem of dependence. But, if one agrees with most contemporary philosophers that divine simplicity is deeply problematic (if not incoherent), then one will want to look for another solution to the problem (or give up the dependence claim and insist that the sovereignty-aseity intuition does not require abstracta to depend on God).

A fourth solution, and perhaps the most promising one, is to find fault with the Lewis semantics for counterfactuals (see Vander Laan 2004, Wierenga 1998, Davidson 1999). Again, we've seen that on the Lewis semantics, any proposition is counterfactually implied by a necessary falsehood. Call a counterfactual with a necessarily false antecedent a counterpossible. It seems that there are some counterpossibles which aren't trivially true, and it also seems that there are some that are false. Consider

(2) If an omniscient being knew no mathematics, he would fail Calculus.

(2) seems to be true, but it seems to be true in a non-trivial manner. That is, although the antecedent of (2) is necessarily false, the conditional is true because of the relationship between the antecedent and the consequent. We also can see that (2) appears to be true in a non-trivial manner if we consider

(3) If an omniscient being knew no mathematics, he'd do well in Calculus.

On the Lewis semantics, (3) is true, trivially. But (3) appears to be false, and (3) makes it even clearer that (2) is non-trivially true.

But then something seems amiss with the Lewis semantics in the way it deals with counterpossibles—or at least some philosophers have concluded this from examples like the two above.

David Vander Laan (2004) and others have argued that in order to account for counterpossibles that are non-trivially true and even false, we must expand the Lewis semantics for counterfactuals to include impossible worlds.[5] On Vander Laan's proposal, an impossible world is, or is modeled by, a maximal class of propositions (one which for every proposition p, either p or its complement is a member of the class) and whose members, when conjoined, are inconsistent (2004, p. 2). We thus amend the semantics in the following way. Let “A” be the antecedent of a counterfactual and “C” the consequent.

(4) A counterfactual is true iff some (possible or impossible) A&C world is more similar to the actual world than every world in which A is true and it's false that C is true (2004, p. 8).

The metaphysical waters are deep here, and an investigation into the adequacy of this sort of proposal is beyond the scope of this essay. However, to the extent that one wants to maintain both some sort of possible worlds semantics for counterfactuals which is based on similarity relations between worlds (and most philosophers agree with this sort of account), and one wants to maintain that not all counterpossibles are trivially true, one might think something like Vander Laan's proposal has to be correct. If one wants to maintain that the dependence of abstracta on God entails that certain counterpossibles are true, but not all, and not all trivially-so, a semantics like Vander Laan's is most promising.

3. God and Abstract Objects II: Divine Bootstrapping?

We have noted three different manners whereby abstract objects may depend on God: 1) The Cartesian model, 2) The Leibnizian-cum-simplicity model (held by the Medievals), and 3) The Leibnizian model. The last model, the Leibnizian model on which abstract objects exist “in God's mind” (this is a metaphor, of course, if in is equivalent to “inside”), is the model which holds out the most promise (or so think most contemporary philosophers of religion). Accepting that God makes necessary truths necessary or that God is identical with each of his attributes is a bit much for most philosophers today. We will concern ourselves, then, with a Leibnizian account.[6]

On a Leibnizian account, divine cognitive activity (of a non-volitional sort) is responsible for the existence of abstract objects. Christopher Menzel and Thomas Morris have defended this sort of view and have dubbed the view “theistic activism” (see fn. 6). Because it is not clear how to understand abstract objects being inside God's mind as anything more than a metaphor (which is strictly false), Menzel and Morris make the plausible claim that the relationship between God's mental activity and abstract objects is a causal one. God's thinking the thoughts he does causes abstract objects to exist. But problems lurk in the neighborhood. The theistic activist claims that God causes properties such as being omniscient, being omnipotent, existing necessarily, being able to cause abstracta to exist, and having cognitive activity to exist. She also claims that God causes his own haecceity, being God, to exist.[7] However, to claim this is to get the dependence relationship backwards. Surely, God's being able to cause abstract objects to exist must be posterior to his having properties like the ones mentioned above. And if God has these properties, they must exist. But, the proponent of this theory is committed to the existence of properties being posterior to God's causing them to exist. Thus, the objection concludes, theistic activism is false.

This sort of argument has seemed to many to be decisive. However, there is a response that the theistic activist can give at this point. It might be claimed that although God's ability to cause abstracta to exist is logically dependent on his having certain properties, it is not causally dependent. The account would be problematically circular only if God's ability to cause abstracta to exist were causally dependent on his having certain properties, and his having these properties were in turn causally dependent on his having caused these properties to exist. There is a circle of logical dependence here (as there is between any two necessary truths), but there is no circle of causal dependence.

The opponent of theistic activism might make the following retort. Certainly, the above response is right in that if there is a problem of circularity, it is one of causal circularity. Earlier, we saw that there is a one-way causal relationship between God's cognitive activity and the existence of abstracta such as being the number two. We can say that the necessary existence of being the number two (or any abstract object) causally depends on God's having the cognitive activity that he does. Or, perhaps we might say that the necessary existence of being the number two causally depends on God's being omniscient, omnipotent and existing necessarily. However, the entities on which being the number two causally depends are themselves properties. On what do they causally depend? It seems that on the activist account they wind up causally depending on themselves. But this is incoherent, one might charge.

Furthermore, one might think that there are additional problems for the theistic activist. There is a distinction between an abstract object's existing and its being realized, instantiated, or obtaining, etc. God causes all properties to exist, but he only causes some of them to be exemplified. He causes the property being red to exist, but there are many occasions where he doesn't cause its exemplification. I may paint my car red, and in this case God would not be causally responsible for the exemplification of being red. Suppose that we could show that, in causing properties such as being omnipotent and being God to exist, God causes them to be exemplified. Then, the theistic activist would be in dire straits. Claiming that God causes himself to exist and to be omnipotent is all by itself quite implausible. However, if we could show that God causes himself to exist and to be omnipotent, we also would have our causal circle. Certainly God's ability to cause abstracta to exist is relevantly dependent on his existing, and it also seems quite plausible that it is relevantly dependent on his being omnipotent. Davidson (1999) argues we can show that theistic activism entails that God causes himself to exist and causes himself to be omnipotent.

To cause something to exist is to cause its essence (or, in the terminology of Plantinga 1980, its nature) to be exemplified. Suppose God creates a certain table which has as a part of its essence being red. Then God causes the property being red to be exemplified by the table when he creates it. Consider the property being omnipotent. The property being exemplified by God is contained in its essence. So, God causes the property being exemplified by God to be exemplified by being omnipotent in causing being omnipotent to exist. Similar to the manner with which God causes being red to be exemplified by the table in exemplifying the table's essence, God causes being omnipotent to be exemplified by himself. But, surely God can't cause the property being omnipotent to be exemplified by himself: How can God make himself omnipotent? Furthermore, one might think that God's omnipotence should be causally prior to his causing properties to exist. However, on this occasion it is not. Then, if one does think that God's omnipotence should be causally prior to his causing properties to exist, this would be an instance of causal circularity. This sort of argument will work for other properties like being omniscient or having divine cognitive activity (although the causal circle may be more difficult to establish with the former, and the implausibility of self-exemplification may be more difficult to establish with the latter).

Consider God's haecceity, the property being God. The property being necessarily exemplified is contained in the essence of this property. So, when God causes his haecceity to exist, he causes the property being necessarily exemplified to be exemplified by his haecceity. Just as God causes being red to be exemplified by the table when he causes it to exist, God causes being God to be exemplified necessarily. However, surely this is incoherent. Here, we have the divine causing his own existence; God is pulling himself up by his own bootstraps.

We may run the same sort of argument using propositions instead of properties. Consider the following two propositions:

(5) God exists


(6) God is omnipotent.

Each of these propositions has as part of its essence the property being true (at least from the point of view of most orthodox theists who have thought about these issues). If to cause something to exist is to cause its essence to be exemplified, then in causing (5) and (6) to exist, God causes them to exemplify being true—he makes them true. As we have seen, one may think this quite problematic.

There is yet another argument against theistic activism that trades on similar sorts of considerations. For the theistic activist (for anyone, for that matter), possible worlds (if there are such things) most likely will be abstract entities of some sort: properties, sets of propositions or states of affairs, or maximal propositions or states of affairs. The theistic activist will want to say that God is responsible for the existence and nature of possible worlds. In particular, then, God is responsible for the fact that (5) and (6) are true in all worlds. But this fact leads to familiar problems for the theistic activist. It seems that if God makes it the case that (5) and (6) are true in every world, then he makes it the case that they are true in the actual world. Here, I am appealing to something like the following principle

(7) Necessarily, if S makes it the case that p is true in every world, S makes it the case that p is true in the actual world.

(7) looks to me clearly to be true: If S makes it the case that p is true in each world, then S makes it the case that p is true in the actual world, too. But, as we have already seen, claiming that God makes it the case that he exists and makes it the case that he is omnipotent would seem (to many, at least) to be implausible.

4. Conclusion

What should one conclude about the relationship between various necessary beings? Some philosophers think we can make sense of the claim that they depend on God if we accept an impossible-worlds semantics for counterfactuals.[8] But, it seems that the claim that abstract objects depend for their existence on God in a Leibnizian fashion has problems. What grounds the being of necessary beings, then? What makes it the case that they exist in every world? Perhaps the best that can be said about this is that nothing accounts for their necessary existence. It is a “brute” fact that they exist necessarily. One may say something to the effect that it is part of their nature that they exist necessarily, but if we take a nature to be an individual essence (see Plantinga 1980), we have not done much explaining at all.[9] Suppose we consider an haecceity to be a nature. Then by claiming that it is part of an object's nature that it exist necessarily, we are saying something like it is necessarily the case that the haecceity of the object is exemplified. But this is no explanation. Perhaps this “lack of grounding” is objectionable, however. Apart from the fact that it is not at all clear what a “grounds for truth” is supposed to be (though we have at least an inchoate grasp of the notion), perhaps ontological grounding applies only to contingently existing objects (or to “composite” abstract objects and contingent objects). The issues here are deep, though, and there is much room for further philosophical inquiry concerning the relationship between various sorts of necessary beings.


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abstract objects | Anselm, Saint [Anselm of Bec, Anselm of Canterbury] | Aquinas, Saint Thomas | conditionals: counterfactual | Descartes, René | Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm | Lewis, David | simplicity: divine