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Doxography of Ancient Philosophy

First published Thu Mar 18, 2004; substantive revision Sat Jan 26, 2008

The great majority of Greek (and Roman) philosophical writings have been irretrievably lost. But this loss is made good to some extent not only by quotations from lost works recorded by later writers, but also by the varieties of ancient reportage that are extant. The modern name for these forms of reportage is ‘doxography’, which could be be translated ‘tenet-writing’. Broadly speaking, doxography encompasses those writings, or parts of writings, in which the author presents philosophical views of some or other of the ancient philosophers or schools, in some or other areas, or on some or other topics, of philosophy, whether with or without presentation of the argumentation or analysis through which they offered philosophical support or reasons in favor of their 'tenets', and whether or not they also include critical evaluations and comments of the author's own. In other words, these are works (or sections of works) taking as their subject matter the tenets or doctrines of the philosophers, rather than independent works of philosophy in which the author addresses in the first instance issues or topics of philosophy, with ancillary discussion along the way of the opinions of other philosophers. The terms for tenets, or views, in ancient Greek are doxai or dogmata, in Latin opiniones; those for doctrines are, in Greek, areskonta, translated into Latin as placita. But note that these designations were used interchangeably.

1. Introduction and overview

The term ‘doxography’ has come to be applied in a much larger sense than seems to have been intended by its creator Hermann Diels. This name for the genre, if we may misleadingly call it that, derives from the Latin neologism ‘doxographi’ used by Diels to indicate the authors of a rather strictly specified type of literature studied and edited in his monumental Doxographi Graeci (‘Greek Doxographers’) of 1879. His researches were focused on writings concerned with the physical part of philosophy (including principles, theology, cosmology, astronomy, meteorology, biology and part of medicine). But today overviews in the field of ethics are also called doxographical. And scholars speak of ‘doxographies’ to be found in the dialogues of Plato and the treatises of Aristotle, although these are works in which issues of philosophy are addressed, with only ancillary discussion of the views of others.

The following authors and main works, listed in chronological order, are representative of doxography in the broad as well as in the narrower sense (a complete list of names and titles would be impractical).[1]

2. Diels' reconstruction of the narrow doxographical tradition

The starting-point of Diels' (1879) inquiries was a hypothesis provided by his Bonn teacher and Doktorvater Hermann Usener (who had predecessors himself), concerning the identical or closely similar language used in reports of pre-Socratic and other philosophical doctrines contained in two late compendia, the Placita (‘Tenets’) surviving in our manuscripts of Plutarch, and the Eclogae of the anthologizer Stobaeus; this hypothesis Diels modified in certain respects, and also made much more complicated, as he attempted to trace back from ps-Plutarch and Stobaeus a long line of predecessors, each successively relied upon by later authors in compiling philosophers' doctrines, all the way down to ps-Plutarch and Stobaeus themselves. In a truly magisterial way he gave it the aura of absolute certainty and unassailability which did much to ensure its dominating position in the study of ancient philosophy until today. The hypothesis may be briefly set out as follows.

The tradition of authors of works in the doxography of physics begins with Aristotle's pupil and successor Theophrastus. In the catalogue of his oeuvre preserved in his Life in Diogenes Laertius a treatise is listed of ‘Physikôn Doxôn, sixteen books’. For the Greek title in the nominative one has a choice between Physikôn Doxai (‘Tenets of the Natural Philosophers’) and Physikai Doxai (‘Tenets in Natural Philosophy’). Usener and Diels opted for the first alternative, but in the opinion of many scholars today the second option is much more plausible. To this treatise they attributed a number of fragments dealing with the principles (archai: Thales' water, Heraclitus' fire, etc.) transmitted for the most part by Simplicius, a Neoplatonist commentator of Aristotle of the 6th c. CE. That Simplicius and others explicitly quote from Theophrastus' Physics, a different treatise, did not bother them. They further posited that a short monograph of Theophrastus, the De Sensibus, dealing with theories concerning the senses and their objects from Parmenides to Democritus and Plato, is a fragment of this treatise as well. The simple fact however that Plato, not first and foremost a philosopher of nature, is treated here on the same level as Democritus and the other natural philosophers (as is also the case in the fragments dealing with the principles) should have made them more hesitant, even within the scope of their own hypothesis, as to the interpretation of the title of the foundational treatise in sixteen books.

According to Diels' revision of the hypothesis a number of extant writings (as well as sections of writings) concerned with doctrines in the fields of natural philosophy ultimately derive fom this Theophrastean treatise, via several intermediary stages. These stages are:

  1. The Placita of an otherwise unknown Aëtius, who is mentioned several times by Theodoret; to be dated to the 1st or perhaps early 2nd c. CE. Theodoret as source was for the first time adduced by Diels. This Aëtian work, he thought, may be reconstructed (a) from the Placita of ps-Plutarch, (b) from quotations in the Anthology of Stobaeus, and (c) from echoes in the Therapy of Greek Diseases of Theodoret[3]. Ps-Plutarch is an epitome of Aëtius. Stobaeus as a rule quotes verbatim, but has a different systematic lay-out. The Anthology, moreover, has been much abridged and damaged in the course of transmission, so in a number of cases Stobaean parallels for ps-Plutarch are no longer extant. Aëtius would also have been used by other authors, whereas ps-Plutarch would have been used by other authors again. Diels indeed proved that the second part of ps-Galen Philosophical History is an epitome of a version of ps-Plutarch.
  2. In his turn, Aëtius would for the most part derive from a postulated treatise to which Diels gave the name Vetusta Placita (‘Older Tenets’), which would have been used by Cicero, Varro and others. Its latest possible date, accordingly, is the early 1st c. BCE.

The Aëtius hypothesis was new; it has proved to be tenable, though it is in need of revision. Before Diels, scholars believed in the existence of a single early source, parts of which would have been taken over and adapted by Cicero as well as much later by, for instance, ps-Galen. The Vetusta Placita hypothesis, on the other hand, is dubious, and the way back to Theophrastus is much more complicated and uncertain, if only because hard evidence is so scarce, than Diels, who just stuck to Usener's point of view about Theophrastus, wished to consider.

Diels next posited that Theophrastus' treatise, the Vetusta Placita, and Aëtius had the same kind of systematic lay-out as the extant Placita of ps-Plutarch, viz. according to subject. The individual books and sections of books of this tract are indeed concerned with specific themes, such as for instance book two, which deals with the cosmos and the heavenly bodies. Within the framework of a section devoted to a particular subject, e.g., the sun, or the moon, the individual chapters may be concerned with various specific issues pertaining to the sun, or the moon, and so on.

Diels further argued that other reports, in other authors, should also be connected with Theophrastus' foundational treatise. The passages dealing with the tenets of Presocratic philosophers in the history of philosophy by Diogenes Laërtius, which is arranged according to schools and individuals, not subjects, as well as similar sections of the first book of Hippolytus' Refutation of All Heresies and of the Stromateis (‘Patchworks’) of another ps-Plutarch, in Diels' view also went back, ultimately, to the Tenets of the Natural Philosophers. He failed to take sufficiently into account that the difference between treatment according to subject and that according to person, or school, is quite fundamental. His argumentation is also weak in other respects. From the undeniable fact that there are striking resemblances between Theophrastus' fragments concerned with the principles on the one hand, and what is found on that score in Aëtius, Diogenes Laërtius, and Hippolytus on the other, it does not follow that corresponding passages in these later authors for which we have no Theophrastean parallels derive from Theophrastus too. This is source criticism, or Quellenforschung, at its most vulnerable. Diels moreover preferred to overlook the equally undeniable fact that Aristotle's treatment of the principles in the first book of the Metaphysics exhibits equally striking correspondences with Theophrastus' fragments (Zeller 1877), and so with the later tradition as well, which could therefore go back ultimately to Aristotle, and not to Theophrastus.

Diels saw the development from Theophrastus to these later and (in his view) dependent authors as a decline, and a progressive obfuscation and deterioration. His cladistic reconstruction of the doxographical tradition is clearly related to the famous so-called ‘Lachmannian’ stemma of a group of manuscripts, from later copies to the lost common ancestor, or archetype, the text of which (as scholars believed at the time) may be reconstructed in a virtually mechanical way. Diels was very much aware of this analogy, which surely was an important factor in convincing him and others that the splendid results of his investigations were irrefutable. In the 19th century the method attributed to Lachmann was assumed to be beyond criticism.

By thus (so to speak automatically) tracing back these mutually corresponding passages in later authors to the, as he assumed, faithful reporter Theophrastus, Diels believed he gained access to reliable information about Presocratic philosophy. Thanks to the stemmatic method-back-to-the-archetype it became possible to bestow upon a passage (a brief lemma in, for instance, Aëtius) dealing with a tenet of a Presocratic philosopher, the conditional status of being an attestation which, though still at second hand, should be early and therefore the more to be trusted. It is with the importance meted out to such so-called ‘fragments’ that these lemmas, removed by Diels' scissors from Aëtian chapters dealing with subjects, figure in the chronological series of chapters devoted to persons in two fundamental works he published. These are the Poetarum Philosophorum Fragmenta (‘Fragments of the Poet-Philosophers’) of 1901, reprinted 2000, and the famous, several times revised (in later editions by Diels' collaborator Kranz), and often reprinted Fragmente der Vorsokratiker (‘Fragments of the Presocratics’, abbreviated D.-K.), first published in 1903. Scholars indeed still tend to view these Aëtian lemmas as a sort of Theophrastus fragments, and Theophrastus is believed to be a bona fide source. This also holds for those passages in Hippolytus, Diogenes Laërtius and other authors in D.-K. which had been traced back to Theophrastus hypothetically.

However, when one compares Aëtian lemmas concerned with tenets of extant authors, like Plato or Aristotle, with the doctrines found in the original texts, it becomes clear to what extent these doxai have been adapted and distorted, or ‘modernized’, in some sense of the word. This consequently should also hold for lemmas dealing with lost authors, as Xylander already pointed out in his 16th century edition of Plutarch, which included the ps-Plutarch. (For further reading on this topic, see Mansfeld & Runia 1997, and Runia 1999a, 2004.)

3. Objections to Diels' theory: the Aristotelian background

Usener's influence is also the cause of a fatal blind spot in Diels. He failed to acknowledge that Theophrastus, too, had a sort of Doktorvater, namely Aristotle. Aristotle, in his treatises, as a rule lists and discusses the opinions (doxai) of men in general and of the experts (who often are philosophers) in particular, concerning an issue in metaphysics, or physics, or psychology, and sometimes ethics, before embarking on his own investigations. These opinions are ordered according to the method of diaeresis, or division: a classification according to sets, sub-sets and sub-sub-sets with specific differences. Aristotle checks to what extent these opinions are in agreement among themselves or contradict each other, and then tries to establish to what extent one of the available options may prove acceptable, at least as the starting-point for further inquiry, or whether some option may be available which others have failed to consider. We call these exegetical and evaluative overviews ‘dialectical’, in the Aristotelian sense of the word, of course. An overview of this nature should establish which genus, or set, is at issue, that is to say whether we are faced with a theoretical discipline, such as physics (and then with what species, or sub-set, e.g., zoology), or with a non-theoretical discipline such as poetics. This approach should also be applied to the sub-sets, or particular objects of inquiry, embraced by a particular sub-set. According to Posterior Analytics 2.1 various aspects should (or may) be treated separately, viz.: (1) does the object of the inquiry possess a particular property or attribute, or not; (2) the reason why it does possess this attribute; (3) the existence or non-existence of the object (for instance: do gods exist? — a question one does not need to ask when humans, or the sun, are at issue); and (4), the substance or definition of the object. Here an important part is played by the Aristotelian so-called categories and other kinds of predicates, because it is of major importance to establish to what category (viz. substance, or quality, or quantity, or place, or doing and being-affected etc.) a given object of inquiry and/or its attributes belong, or whether and in what sense for instance motion (or rest) may be predicated of it. These four different primary questions, or types of questions, may moreover be formulated in respect of each category (viz., not only of substance, but also of quality, etc.). Take the objects of mathematics. According to Aristotle these do not belong to the category of substance but to that of quantity. But within this latter category one may formulate questions about properties, or attributes, which may belong to them; wonder whether they exist, and if so, in what way; ask whether they move or not; and so on.

In his treatise on dialectic and its methods, the Topics (1.14), Aristotle provides instructions on how to select and classify propositions (protaseis) and problems (problêmata):

We should also make selections from the literature and include these in separate lists for each set, with separate headings, for instance ‘On the Good’, or ‘On the Living Being’ — that is to say the Good as a whole, starting with (the question) ‘what is it?’ One should cite the doxai [opinions, tenets] of individual thinkers, e.g., that Empedocles said that the elements of bodies are four in number […].

Of propositions and problems there are — to comprehend the matter in outline — three sets: some are ethical, others physical, others again logical. Ethical: for instance (the problem) whether one should obey one's parents or the law, when these disagree with each other. Logical: for instance (the problem) whether the knowledge of opposites is the same, or not. Physical: for instance (the problem) whether the cosmos is eternal or not.

Consequently, propositions and problems can be, and therefore in some cases should be, elucidated by means of tenets, or opinions: doxai. As there are three sets of propositions, so there are three sets of doxai: physical, ethical, and ‘logical’ (i.e., general). An example of such a diaeresis, or division, of a sub-set which is of fundamental importance for Aristotle is found at the beginning of his Physics. This division pertains to two categories and one predicate of a different sort: the number (category of quantity), nature (category of substance) and motion vs. rest (category of doing and being-affected) of the principles (archai) and elements (stoicheia) posited by Aristotle's predecessors in the field of natural philosophy. In line with the rule formulated in the Topics names of philosophers are added to some of the doxai. Numerous other examples of this ingredient of the dialectical method are to be found in Aristotle's writings.

The above-cited passage from the Topics, and Aristotle's general practice, help to determine and explain the title of the Theophrastean treatise Diels believed to be foundational: it should be Physikai Doxai, i.e., ‘Tenets in [the various fields of] Natural Philosophy’. And one among the extant fragments of this treatise not only proves (because of the formulation in Greek of the title as quoted) that this title really is ‘Physical Tenets’, but also demonstrates that such tenets were criticized according to the rules of dialectic. Theophrastus, we are informed, cited a tenet of Plato's and then formulated ‘the objections’ against it. The Greek word for ‘objections’ found in this fragment, enstaseis, is a technical term in Aristotle's Topics. Physical tenets are tenets, or theses, in the fields of natural philosophy in the largest sense, ranging from the principles, via cosmology, astronomy and meteorology etc., to human psychology (including philosophy of mind), biology, and even nosology or the theory of diseases. Physical tenets are not only formulated by physikoi, natural philosophers, but also by physicians and astronomers. Aëtius indeed contains a number of medical[4] and astronomical doxai, the oldest of which may derive from sources that can perhaps be attributed to some of Aristotle's collaborators. (For further reading on this topic, see Mansfeld 1990, 1992, 1998, Mansfeld & Runia 1997, Runia 1999a, Runia 2004, with criticism in Zhmud 2001 and rejoinder in Mansfeld 2002.)

4. Theophrastus and the Placita

Theophrastus applies the diaeretic method in his treatise De Sensibus. The chief division — already found in corresponding passages in Aristotle — is between those who posit that knowledge is to be ascribed to similarity (‘like knows like’) and those who posit that it is to be ascribed to contrast (‘unlike knows unlike’). Another division, not paralleled in Aristotle, also plays an important part in classifying and dialectically discussing the tenets, viz. between those who assume that there is a difference between thinking and sense-perception, and those who do not. Finally, within each class the philosophers are treated in a sequence determined by the number of senses that are posited (category of quantity). The last philosopher to be discussed is Democritus, not Plato. This is because Democritus according to Theophrastus assumes that knowledge comes about through both similarity and contrast.

This presentation, viz. a division, or divisions, of contrasting tenets (names included) dealing with specific issues, followed by an exceptional (or compromise) view, which fails to fit this division, is not a standard feature of Aristotle's dialectical overviews. However we do find partial anticipations of this methodology in Aristotle, e.g. in the second chapter of De Anima I he opposes three views concerned with the principles that constitute the soul: some hold that these are corporeal, others that they are incorporeal, while a third group posits a blend of corporeal and incorporeal principles. In Aristotle however we do not find the strings of detailed sortings of individual tenets followed by a compromise or maverick opinion typical of numerous Placita chapters, while Theophrastus' presentation in the De Sensibus is in this respect close to the Placita routine. [5] Consequently, we may submit that it is Aristotle's dialectical methodology, as revised by Theophrastus, which determines the structure of large sections of the Placita. It is moreover stated, in the proem of ps-Plutarch's Placita, that ‘according to Aristotle and Theophrastus and almost all the Peripatetics a perfect human being should devote himself to problems in the fields of natural philosophy and ethics’.

Theophrastus and Aristotle, then, were used in this way. An example: The chapters in Aëtius (Placita 3.9-15) and Cicero (Academics 2.122) dealing with a number of various and occasionally even bizarre views concerning the position, motion, shape, etc. of the earth in the last resort patently derive, as to their main themes and oppositions and even as to some telling details, from a chapter in Aristotle's On the Heavens (2.13) (Mansfeld 1992). Cicero here mentions Theophrastus by name; he therefore may well be involved too, as an intermediary source. But we have no further evidence concerning his contribution in this particular instance. (For further reading on this topic, see Mansfeld 1996.)

5. Using doxographies

When we inquire into the way ancient authors have used the information provided by Aëtius' Placita, by its progeny, and by its post-Theophrastean predecessors, we often find that the function of these collections of doxai is not much different from the functions of similar overviews in the context of Aristotle's dialectical discussions. The main objective of these authors, who are in a position to base themselves on evidence that has already been provided with a definite structure, is to ascertain whether a given doxa may eventually prove to be useful, and which doxai should be rejected — depending, naturally, on the point of view of the user (who may be a physician or a philosopher, a Stoic or an Epicurean, a Platonist or an Aristotelian, a pagan or a Christian). Sometimes all the doxai belonging to a specific sub-set, or dealing with a specific theme, may turn out to be unacceptable, or useless, under certain circumstances or to somebody in particular.

Furthermore, there is a significant difference between Aristotle's overviews (which we know much better than those of Theophrastus, so for the sake of clarity one may restrict oneself to Aristotle) and the corresponding passages and sections in Aëtius and his family. Aristotle's purpose was to make a choice and to find a solution, and many later authors also wanted this. But numerous chapters in the Placita literature when taken at face-value seem to make a decision impossible, because the bald diaeretic contrast between the tenets listed in the lemmas results in a logjam, or diaphonia (‘discordance’), as the ancient Skeptics called it. In this stalemate the only remaining option is to suspend one's judgment. It was at the time impossible, for instance, to find out whether there is one cosmic system, or more. It is an attractive idea that at least part of the material (in the course of time naturally updated by the inclusion of post-Aristotelian tenets) was adapted by Academic Skeptics to induce the tranquillity of mind which follows upon suspension of judgment.

It is somewhat amazing that the great Diels, who clearly was aware of the importance of the diaeretic method in Aristotle's writings and in Theophrastus' De Sensibus, failed to apply this insight to the analysis of the Placita literature. The diaphonic streamlining, moreover, of chapters containing tenets that are listed according to criteria determined by various divisions obviously determines not only the presentation but also, to some extent, the contents of the material.

6. Doxography broad and narrow

Consequently, doxography in the narrower sense (derived from the nature of the majority of the sources discussed and edited by Diels in the Doxographi Graeci), is: the normally very brief presentation according to theme, or subject, of contrasting (or even bizarre, or compromise) tenets in natural philosophy (or science, if you wish), which in itself fails to provide a decisive answer to the issue involved although it may assist you to find a way out. The application of the term ‘doxography’ to what one finds in Aristotle (or, on a much more limited scale, in Plato, who occasionally quotes the views of others to further a discussion) is therefore not entirely to the point (see Mansfeld 2000).

Turning now to doxography in the broad sense we observe that Cicero's leisured and extensive presentations, e.g., in his On the Nature of the Gods of the Epicurean and Stoic doctrines in the field of theology-cum-physics — presentations followed by Academic-Skeptical refutations — may be, and have been, called by the name of doxography. But there are obvious differences from doxographies of the Aëtian type. To be sure, one might perhaps, with some hesitation, maintain that what we have here is a sort of blow-up of the dialectical scheme one also finds in the Placita literature, with the skeptical component made explicit: contrasting doctrines which turn out to be improvable. Such  a move however  is less valid for Diogenes Laërtius, in spite of the fact that this author several times makes a distinction between the life (bios) of a person (Plato; the Stoic Zeno of Citium) and the areskonta or dogmata of this person, or of his school. It is therefore perhaps better to classify these overviews in Cicero and Diogenes Laërtius as belonging with an ancient genre which we may view as a sub-species of doxography, namely the (largely lost) literature Peri Haireseôn (‘On Schools’), which deals with philosophical, or medical, schools and eventually may include arguments contra the position of a particular hairesis (‘school’). Philodemus, and Arius Didymus (on ethics), belong here as well.

Scholars, as we have noticed, also speak of ethical doxographies. One could justify this usage by submitting that this is going beyond Diels, and back to Aristotle. We have seen that Aristotle advised his pupils (and himself) also to construct lists of ethical propositions and problems. In his ethical treatises we actually find dialectical overviews concerning problems in ethics, though on a much more modest scale than in the physical treatises. But a doxographical literature in the field of ethics, which as to scale and taxonomy would be even remotely comparable to physical doxography never existed. Yet one occasionally encounters short lists and overviews of ethical tenets, in some later authors. It is therefore possible that modest doxographical collections of ethical views did circulate, and we may have some evidence concerned with the circulation (and adaptation) of a diaeretical overview of tenets about the End, or Highest Good (Algra 1997).

7. Conclusion

Finally, it should be pointed out that doxographic works are a sort of tools. They constitute a type of secondary literature of a fluid and unstable character, both as to form and as to contents. Shorter and longer versions may be available alongside each other; in fact, for all the losses sustained by ancient literature, some still are. Materials may be added, or lost, or added again in a continuous process of epitomizing and enlarging and updating — and it remained possible, of course, to inspect and excerpt original sources at least in some cases.

In order the better to understand the value of the available evidence pertaining to lost philosophical works from Antiquity one therefore should attempt to understand the traditions and transmissions that are involved as a whole. One should take the rationale of the extant overviews into account, and try to discover the intentions of authors who made use of doxographies. A naïve use of the available collections of philosophical fragments, implying the putting on the same level of reliability of most of the evidence that remains, does not always produce good results.


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