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Ancient Skepticism

First published Tue Nov 4, 1997; substantive revision Fri Jan 11, 2008

Skepticism embraces doubt. "Ancient skepticism," as it is standardly understood, encompasses two schools of philosophy which make doubt their fundamental theme. One is Pyrrhonism, which claims Pyrrho of Elis (4th–3rd c. B.C.E.) as its founder, though Pyrrho's ties to “Pyrrhonism” are loose and often indirect. The other school is Academic Skepticism, which comprises a skeptical phase of Plato's Academy that stretches from the 3rd to the early 1st century B.C.E. The latter influences many later thinkers associated with the Academy (most notably, Cicero and Plutarch). Its relationship to subsequent phases of the Academy has been studied by Tarrant.

The figures associated with these two schools include Pyrrho, Timon of Phlius, Arcesilaus, Carneades, Clitomachus, Philo of Larissa, Cicero, Aenesidemus, Agrippa and Sextus Empiricus. Cicero and Sextus are significant because their works have served as vehicles that convey skeptical arguments and views to medieval, renaissance, modern and contemporary philosophy (Diogenes Laertius is another ancient author who plays an important role in this regard). Their influence is well documented in Floridi, Popkin and Schmitt (see the bibliography below).

Pyrrhonism, which flourished during and after the 1st c. B.C.E., is the most mature variant of ancient skepticism. In part this is because Pyrrhonians like Sextus freely borrow and incorporate the arguments, themes and opinions they find in earlier skeptics and in other skeptically inclined philosophers. The latter include figures like Protagoras, Socrates, Gorgias, Democritus, Aristippus and Diogenes of Sinope (Diogenes “the Cynic”). In Sextus, the result is a rich collection of skeptically inclined arguments on a broad array of topics. Recent editions of his works make these arguments increasingly available for detailed scrutiny and discussion.

1. Overview

Sextus Empiricus, who flourished at the end of the second century C.E., describes the “skeptic” (from a Greek verb meaning “to examine carefully”) as an “investigator” (a “zetetic”). According to Sextus, the skeptic is someone who has investigated the questions of philosophy but has “suspended judgment” (practicing epochê) because he is unable to resolve the differences among the contrary attitudes, opinions and arguments he found. Instead of adhering to a definite philosophical position, the skeptic is someone who continues to investigate.

The most mature skeptical perspective in ancient times is Pyrrhonism. Sextus describes its relationship to other ancient philosophies in the opening passage of his Outlines of Pyrrhonism (henceforth PH).

When people search for something, the likely outcome is that either they find it or, not finding it, they accept that it cannot be found, or they continue to search. So also in the case of what is sought in philosophy, I think, some people have claimed to have found the truth, others have asserted that it cannot be apprehended, and others are still searching. Those who think that they have found it are the Dogmatists, properly so called — for example, the followers of Aristotle and Epicurus, the Stoics, and certain others. The followers of Clitomachus and Carneades, as well as other Academics, have asserted that it cannot be apprehended. The Skeptics [skeptikoi] continue to search. (PH 1.1–3, Mates)

One controversial aspect of these remarks is Sextus' suggestion that the Pyrrhonian leaves open the possibility that truth may be found. While this is a logical corollary of the suggestion that the skeptic has not made up his mind about the issues of philosophy, anyone familiar with Sextus might question whether he is open to this possibility. At the very least, it must be said that the Pyrrhonian stance is an overwhelmingly negative one which seems (conceptually and in spirit) to undermine any and all attempts to establish truth.

Another controversial aspect of Sextus' work is his description of the views of Carneades, Clitomachus and other Academic skeptics. In the Outlines of Pyrrhonism, he struggles to separate Arcesilaus' outlook and the Pyrrhonean point of view, suggesting that Arcesilaus' “Way” is “almost the same as ours” (1.234). In discussing the members of the “New” Academy (headed by Carneades and Clitomachus), he claims that they maintain that truth cannot be apprehended, attributing them a position which seems to (inconsistently) imply that they can apprehend that this is so (PH, 1.226). This suggestion is plausibly interpreted as an attempt to drive a wedge between Pyrrhonism and a competing school of skepticism.

Whatever one decides about Sextus' account of the different Academic skeptics, the Academics he treats as rivals can be classified as skeptics in the sense in which we now use the term. For even if some of them adopted the negative dogmatism he implies, their philosophy is still centred on the conviction that claims to truth are inherently uncertain, and it is this conviction which is the heart of ancient skepticism.

In their defense of skepticism, the ancient skeptics adopt an attitude of opposition. In the first half of the third century C.E., Diogenes Laertius attributes a method of opposition to Academic skepticism, writing that Arcesilaus (mid-3rd c. B.C.E.) “was the originator of the Middle Academy, being the first to suspend his assertions owing to the contrarieties of arguments, and the first to argue pro and contra” (4.28–44, Long & Sedley). The most famous of the Academic skeptics, Carneades (mid-2nd c. B.C.E.), was famous for his ability to oppose Stoic arguments, and is said to have demonstrated his ability to construct opposing arguments on a famous trip to Rome, where he argued impressively for justice and, on the following day, argued with equal force against it (Lactantius, Div. Ins., 5.16, 6.6).

Judging by Cicero's account in De Finibus 2.2, an attitude of opposition played an integral role in lessons in the skeptical Academy, where Arcesilaus, at any rate, proceeded by opposing some thesis enunciated by a student (e.g., “The Chief Good in my opinion is pleasure”). The Academics' principal argument against Stoic epistemology employs opposition in a more specific way, opposing alleged examples of the Stoics' “cataleptic” impressions (impressions which are clear and distinct, and said to be a guarantor of truth), with presumed or admitted false impressions which are equally forceful and convincing. There is, the Academics conclude, no way to establish the trustworthiness of the impressions that are the basis of Stoic claims to truth.

The suspension of judgment that characterizes Pyrrhonism also:

…comes about because of the setting of things in opposition. We oppose either appearances to appearances, or ideas to ideas, or appearances to ideas. We oppose appearances to appearances when we say “The same tower seems round from a distance but square from near by.” We oppose ideas to ideas when someone establishes the existence of providence from the orderliness of the things in the heavens and we oppose to this the frequency with which the good fare badly and the bad prosper, thereby deducing the non-existence of providence. We oppose ideas to appearances in the way in which Anaxagoras opposed to snow's being white the consideration: snow is water, and water is black, therefore snow is black too. On a different scheme, we oppose sometimes present things to present things, but sometimes present things to past and future things… (PH 1.31–5, Long & Sedley)

In constructing arguments that oppose potentially true perceptions, opinions, and theories, the Pyrrhonians are willing to cite whatever evidence might seem to serve to demonstrate uncertainty. Perceptions which seem to reveal the true nature of the world are opposed by invoking perceptions which seem to demonstrate the limits of perception; philosophical opinions are opposed by invoking competitors or general arguments against our ability to establish truth. Arguments for particular conclusions are opposed by counter arguments. And so on.

2. The Historical Context

Skeptical doubts are said to characterize times of social upheaval (a connection said to characterize, not only the ancient world, but the fourteenth century and our own era). It is difficult to judge such general claims, but it would be surprising if the foundational doubts that characterize skepticism were not more evident in times when social and intellectual turmoil invite deep questions about what is right and wrong and true and false.

Ancient skepticism's ties to other trends in ancient philosophy are more easily observed. They are particularly evident in the considerations that motivate the skeptics' decision to suspend judgment on the truth of any claim. The skeptics' conclusion that truth is uncertain is at odds with the “dogmatic” philosophies they reject, but this conclusion may still be founded on a similar focus on opposing arguments, antithesis, and conflicting points of view. One might, for example, easily compare the Pyrrhonian conviction that there are equally convincing arguments for and against any claim to the Protagorean view that one can argue equally convincingly on both sides of any question. In both cases, one finds a general commitment to the possibility of convincing arguments for opposing points of view. Despite this mutual commitment, Protagoras defended a perspective which is in some ways diametrically opposed to skepticism (at least if we judge by Plato's account of Protagoras in his Theaetetus), for it accepts rather than rejects opposing claims to truth.

Ancient skepticism has many affinities to other ancient philosophies. Greek atomism shares, for example, skepticism's interest in opposing perceptions and points of view, and can be seen as an attempt to explain this opposition by hypothesizing atoms which impact on different kinds of bodies (the bodies of different individuals, and of different species) in different kinds of ways. Opposites which include opposing points of view also played a central role in Heracleitean and Platonic epistemology. Even Aristotelean philosophy has affinities to skepticism, affinities which are in this case manifest in an Aristotelean rhetorical tradition which incorporates the rhetorical works of Theophrastus, Demetrius of Phalerum and others, and which emphasizes the power of persuasive speech rather than argument's ability to establish what is true.

In a number of cases, philosophers who have no direct ties to the skeptical schools anticipate skepticism by stressing the difficulties inherent in inquiry. Xenophanes was known for his claim that no one knows clear truth; Democritus maintained that “bastard” knowledge gained through the senses exists only by convention; Plato's dialogues contained arguments pro and contra, and cast doubt on everyday opinions; Diogenes of Sinope and other Cynics dismiss philosophical speculation; Epictetus insists that philosophers spend too much time on theory (En., 51); and so on. The philosophies that such philosophers endorsed do not incorporate a full fledged skepticism, but their influence added impetus to the skeptics' moves in this direction.

More generally, ancient skepticism flourished in an intellectual milieu which incorporated many general themes and trends conducive to skeptical conclusions. In marked contrast with modern science, ancient science could not boast the practical and theoretical successes of its modern counterpart. In part because of this, mysticism and irrationalism were powerful cultural forces in the ancient world. The possibility of conflicting views of things was reinforced by an interest in foreign cultures which drew attention to opposing customs and traditions. Opposing interests and perspectives were also manifest in debate, war, political rivalries and a religion and mythology which pitted god against god, man against man and even god against man.

Within this broader context, ancient philosophical inquiry is characterized both by a remarkable array of conflicting philosophical perspectives and by famous philosophers known for dazzling arguments for paradoxical conclusions (that motion is impossible, that nothing exists, that time is an illusion, etc.). In the midst of the conflicting views and conclusions that this implies, it is not surprising that some philosophers propound the conclusion that reason cannot establish truth, and gives us no way to choose between opposing arguments and opposing points of view.

3. Pyrrho and Equanimity

The movements that constitute ancient skepticism begin with Pyrrho (ca. 365–ca. 275 B.C.E.), though his views and perspective are obscure and open to different interpretations. In marked contrast to modern skeptics, Pyrrho seems to have proposed his philosophy as something more than an epistemological conclusion, advocating it as a basis for a life of tranquillity and contentment. In keeping with this, Pyrrho was most famous, not for his arguments, but because he is said to have used them as a basis for a life of exceptional equanimity and contentment.

Pyrrho left no writings, and many of the later comments about him seem colored by anachronisms encouraged by his later status as the figurehead for the Pyrrhonian “revival” of the 1st c. B.C.E. Sextus seems guarded about Pyrrho's own relationship to Pyrrhonism (see, e.g., PH 1.7) and many authors question the extent to which he adopted the perspective propounded by the later philosophers who came to be known as Pyrrhonians.

The most important evidence on Pyrrho's views is found in the following fragment of Aristocles, a Peripatetic of uncertain date (perhaps 1st c. B.C.E.–C.E., perhaps 2nd c. C.E.).

He [Pyrrho] himself has left nothing in writing, but this pupil Timon says that whoever wants to be happy must consider these three questions: first, how are things by nature? Secondly, what attitude should we adopt towards them? Thirdly, what will be the outcome for those who have such an attitude? According to Timon, Pyrrho declared that things are equally indifferent, unmeasurable and inarbitrable. For this reason neither our sensations nor our opinions tell us truths or falsehoods. Therefore for this reason we should not put our trust in them one bit, but should be unopinionated, uncommitted and unwavering, saying concerning each individual thing that it no more is than is not, or both is and is not, or neither is nor is not. The outcome for those who actually adopt this attitude, says Timon, will be first speechlessness [aphasia], and then freedom from disturbance; and Aenesidemus says pleasure. (Eusebius, Prep. Ev. 14.18.2–5, Long & Sedley)

The interpretation of this passage is the subject of debate (see Bett, Pyrrho). According to the interpretation most in keeping with later skepticism, Pyrrho holds that things appear with equal force to be and not to be (and to both be and not to be; and to neither be nor not to be). According to an alternative (“metaphysical”) interpretation, Pyrrho holds that this is how things actually are — i.e. that things in the world actually are and are not (and both are and are not, and neither are nor are not). If the latter interpretation is correct, it is a historical irony that Pyrrho became the most famous spokesperson for a later skepticism which rejects all claims about the true nature of the world.

According to Diogenes Laertius (9.76), Timon held that Pyrrho's formula ou mallon (“no more is than is not”) was a determination to determine nothing, which promoted both an indifference to opinions and sensations, and Pyrrho's famous peace of mind (D.L. 9.65). Judging by the Life of Pyrrho Diogenes Laertius includes in his Lives of Eminent Philosophers, Pyrrho did live a life in accord with the goal of equanimity. Putting aside incredible anecdotes which suggest that he completely ignored his senses, the picture which emerges suggests a wise man famous for self control and an even temper. Among other things, we read that Pyrrho lived like a recluse; did not “so much as frown” when treated with disinfectants, surgery and cautery; voluntarily adopted a life of piety and poverty; and performed menial tasks to show his indifference. In one anecdote, he is criticized for failing to maintain his composure when a cur rushed at him and terrified him (Pyrrho is said to have answered that it is difficult to strip oneself of one's human nature). According to Diogenes, the citizens of Pyrrho's native Elis rewarded him with honors, making him a high priest, raising a statue in his honor (Pausanias 6.24.5), on his account passing a law which exempted philosophers from taxes (D.L. 9.64).

The crux of Pyrrho's practical philosophy lies in the relationship between his skeptical conclusions and the even tempered peace of mind which his life exemplified. Sextus sheds some light on this connection in a passage in which he explains Pyrrhonism's ties to equanimity (ataraxia) by invoking an anecdote which apparently descends from Pyrrho's time in Alexander's court. It tells how Apelles, Alexander's court painter, was so frustrated by his inability to paint the froth on a horse's mouth that he threw his sponge at his painting, accidentally producing the effect he wanted. “So, too, the Skeptics were hoping to achieve ataraxia by resolving the anomaly of phenomena and noumena, and, being unable to do this, they suspended judgment. But then, by chance as it were, when they were suspending judgment the ataraxia followed, as a shadow follows the body.” (PH 1.29, Mates)

The relationship between Pyrrho's equanimity and the equanimity espoused by Sextus and later Pyrrhonians is difficult to judge, though Sextus provides an explanation of the Pyrrhonean state of mind which makes it easier to understand some of the reasons that skeptical conclusions lead to peace of mind. According to Sextus' account a number of centuries after Pyrrho, equanimity follows skepticism “like a shadow” for two reasons. First, because it eliminates the anxiety that accompanies the study of philosophy — an anxiety philosophy produces by fostering the hope that one will be able to understand what is true about reality and what is good and bad in human life. Second, because skeptical conclusions are said to promote a moderate response to the misfortunes and calamities that might otherwise disturb one's peace of mind, allegedly because these misfortunes and calamities can't, according to skepticism, be known to be bad, and so shouldn't even be held to be.

It is plausible to suppose that Pyrrho, who revered Democritus and studied under the Democritean Anaxarchus, maintained his attitude of calm composure by using the kind of thinking already evident in the following fragment of Democritus:

[In order to achieve cheerfulness]… one must keep one's mind on what is attainable, and be content with what one has, paying little heed to things envied and admired, and not dwelling on them in one's mind. Rather must you consider the lives of those in distress, reflecting on their intense sufferings, in order that your own possessions and condition may seem great and enviable, and you may, by ceasing to desire more, cease to suffer in your soul… One must… [compare] one's own life with that of those in worse cases, and must consider oneself fortunate, reflecting on their sufferings, on being so much better off than they. If you keep to this way of thinking, you will live more serenely (fr. 191, cf. fr. 3; Kirk, Raven and Schofield).

The exercises here proposed promote peace of mind by opposing the opinion that one is suffering from misfortune with comparisons that cast doubt on this opinion. A commitment to the relativity of value judgments — a natural component of skepticism — in this way provides a psychological basis for peace of mind. As the old saw goes, “I was upset about my lack of shoes until I met a man with no feet.”

Pyrrho's use of such tactics is implied by the report that he was fond of Homer's lines (Il. 21.106–7): “Ay friend, die thou; why thus thy fate deplore? Patroclus, thy better, is no more”. These lines combat the thought that one is faced with death (a thought of the sort inclined to disturb one's equanimity) with the opposing thought that one has no grounds for complaint — for one's better, the great warrior Patroclus, has suffered the same fate. Oppositions of this sort may be implied when it is said that Pyrrho “talked to himself” in order to train himself to be good (D.L. 9.64, cf. 69). Similar methods and ideals seem reflected in a famous incident in which Pyrrho's teacher Anaxarchus cures Alexander's despondency (Plutarch, Alex., 52), and in Anaxarchus' own fame as “the happy one,” which is in part founded on (or perhaps the basis for) the story that he was unflappable even when he suffered a horrible death at the hands of the tyrant Nicocreon (D.L. 9.59–60).

Flintoff locates the origins of Pyrrho's philosophy in India, where Pyrrho travelled in the court of Alexander the Great. It was on this trip that Pyrrho was exposed to Indian ascetics (the so called gymno-sophists — the “Naked Philosophers” of India) and their commitment to an enlightened state of mind. There can be no doubt that someone with Pyrrho's inclinations must have been impressed with their studied indifference, though not in a way that negates the likelihood that Pyrrho's philosophy has Greek origins.

Looked at from the point of view of earlier Greek philosophy, Pyrrho's skepticism may be an extension of aspects of Democritean thought which he would have studied with Anaxarchus, who is also notable for skeptical tendencies and whom Pyrrho followed to India. In keeping with this, Pyrrho's epistemology may be rooted in Democritus' doubts about ordinary opinions (which Democritus rejected as purely “conventional” on the grounds that they are contradictory and truth resides in atoms and the void); his formula ou mallon descends from atomism (DeLacy); his goal of equanimity reflects the Democritean practical ideals we have already noted; and Pyrrho is reported to have admired Democritus above all others (D.L. 9.67).

These affinities being noted, Pyrrho takes skeptical inclinations much further than Democritus, rejecting atomism as well ordinary opinions, in the process giving up on philosophy and on all attempts to establish what is true (D.L. 9.69,65; cf. Sextus, PH 1.28–29; AM [Adversus Mathematicos] 11.1). As Aristocles puts it, “if we are so constituted that we know nothing, then there is no need to continue enquiry into other things…. Pyrrho of Elis was … a powerful spokesman of such a position” (Eusebius, 14.18.1–2, Long & Sedley).

4. Appearances

Pyrrho's philosophy raises a number of issues which reverberate throughout the history of skepticism. Questions about the consistency of his and later skeptical perspectives are particularly significant. As Aristocles says, “in admonishing us to have no opinion, they [the skeptics] at the same time bid us to form an opinion, and in saying that men ought to make no statement they make a statement themselves: and though they require you to agree with no one, they command you to believe themselves…” (Eus. Prep. Ev. 14.18, Gifford).

Other commentators ask how Pyrrho survived the pitfalls of day to day life — much less achieved supreme contentment — if he refused to believe the truth of his impressions. According to one ancient report in Diogenes Laertius, this was a practical as well as a theoretical issue for Pyrrho, who accepted skepticism “in his actual way of life, avoiding nothing and taking no precautions, facing everything as it came, wagons, precipices, dogs, and entrusting nothing whatsoever to his sensations. But he was looked after… by his disciples, who accompanied him” (D.L. 9.62, Long & Sedley). Not much can be made of this account of Pyrrho's life, for Laertius has a penchant for fantastic stories and is willing to stretch his lives to include them. In this case, he cites as his authority “those around” Antigonus of Carystus (3rd c. B.C.E. author of a now lost Lives of Philosophers), who is not an impressive source.

As Hallie says, we might contrast the claim that Pyrrho rejected the senses with Posidonius' account (1st c. B.C.E.) of Pyrrho's actions when he was caught in a storm at sea (D.L. 9.68). Confronted with other passengers wailing and cringing with horror, Pyrrho is said to have remained calm and pointed to a small pig which was calmly eating on the deck, saying that its attitude demonstrated the unperturbed state of the wise man. Though Timon included “sensations” as well as “opinions” within the scope of Pyrrho's skepticism, this suggests that it is human fears and frailties, not ordinary impressions, which Pyrrho wanted to expunge by skeptical inquiry.

Pyrrho's follower Timon suggests that the Pyrrhonean guides himself by “appearances” (phainomena — what “appears to be the case”). This suggests that Pyrrho was committed to some kind of tentative belief in (or acceptance of) what appears to be the case. As Diogenes Laertius puts it:

…the dogmatists say that they [the skeptics] abolish life, in the sense that they throw out everything that goes to make up a life. But the skeptics say that these charges are false. For they do not abolish, say, sight, but only hold that we are ignorant of its explanation…. We do sense that fire burns, but we suspend judgement as to whether it is fire's nature to burn…. “We only object,” they say, “to the non-evident things added on to the phenomena [the appearances]…. For this reason, Timon in his Pytho says that he has not diverged from what is customary. And in his Likenesses he says, "But the apparent utterly dominates wherever it goes." And in his work On the Senses he says, “That honey is sweet I do not posit; that it appears so I concede.” (D.L. 9.104–5, Inwood & Gerson)

If one accepts that this is Pyrrho's view, then we should interpret his claims — including, perhaps, the claims that things “are” indifferent, unmeasurable and inarbitrable — as claims about appearances. This implies that one should reject the metaphysical interpretation of Pyrrho's point of view. Whether a move of this sort can save Pyrrho or other ancient skeptics from the charge of inconsistency remains a matter of debate (for influential statements of the different sides of this debate, see Barnes, Frede and Burnyeat).

5. Arcesilaus and the Academy

Pyrrho's impact on his immediate contemporaries seems quite limited. Timon is his only student of repute and ancient skepticism's next phase is not Pyrrhonian but Academic. The exact origins of skepticism in the Academy are not known, but it is plausible to suppose that it became a school of skepticism because the successive heads of the Academy from early in the 3rd c. B.C.E. chose to emphasize the skeptical aspects of Plato's dialogues. The latter include Socrates' heroic interpretation of the Delphic Oracle in the Apology (which suggests that he was wisest among mortals because he was aware of his ignorance); the principled insistence on the need for further argument and reflection in dialogues like the Crito, the Euthyphro and the Laches; the questioning of the forms in the Parmenides; a recurring pessimism about ordinary opinion; and the indeterminate nature of the dialogue form itself, which lends itself to many interpretations. In keeping with the latter, Cicero defends a version of Academic skepticism, claiming that Plato is a skeptic because he is always arguing pro and contra, states nothing positively, inquires into everything, and makes no certain statements (Ac 1.46).

The first of the Academic skeptics is Arcesilaus (316/315–242/241 B.C.E.), who served as Head of the Academy during a period of its history which Diogenes Laertius calls “the Middle Academy.” In an extant fragment, Ariston, a 3rd c. Stoic philosopher, describes Arcesilaus as a combination of “Plato in front, Pyrrho behind, Diodorus [Cronus, a dialectician of impressive skill] in the middle” (D.L. 4.33). According to Sextus, Arcesilaus' philosophy is “virtually identical” with Pyrrhonism (PH 1.232). Sextus here assumes Pyrrhonism as he himself understands it, so this need not imply a close connection to Pyrrho. The latter is difficult to judge. While there is no sign of the asceticism that we associate with Pyrrho (see, e.g., D.L. 4.37–42), it does seem that Arcesilaus held that skepticism aims at happiness (AM 7.158) and some of the anecdotes we find in Plutarch suggest that he believed that we should deal with misfortune and unhappiness by finding opposing ways of looking at trying situations (see “On Controlling Anger,” 461E and “On Tranquillity of Mind,” 470A–B).

Arcesilaus' arguments focused primarily on Stoic epistemology. According to Couissin, he had no views of his own and offers the positions and arguments ascribed to him only as a reductio ad absurdum of the Stoic point of view. It is difficult, perhaps impossible, to judge whether this is so, especially as it is never easy to distinguish cases in which philosophers intend a particular argument or position merely for the sake of argument (Caton illustrates how far one can take such suggestions when he argues that Descartes proposes the cogito only for the sake of argument).

However one interprets Arcesilaus' ultimate convictions, the crux of his attack on Stoicism is a critique of the “cataleptic” impression (the katalêptikê phantasia) the Stoics propose as a basis for their epistemology. According to the Stoics, cataleptic impressions are impressions which reveal, in virtue of their clearness and distinctness, certain truth. According to Arcesilaus, there is no good ground for believing there are such impressions, or any other impressions which can provide a guarantee of truth. This is something that he was said to demonstrate by pairing impressions which are said to be cataleptic with equally clear and distinct impressions which are presumably mistaken. In most cases, it appears that the latter were vivid and (at the moment they occur) convincing impressions which were experienced in dreams, hallucinations, and other abnormal states (Ac. 2.77; AM 7.252).

Like any skepticism, Arcesilaus' philosophy is plausible only if there is some way to reconcile it with our apparent need to accept some kind of belief (and choose between alternative beliefs) in day to day affairs. Sextus suggests that Arcesilaus tried to overcome this problem by combining his skeptical conclusions with the principle that one should accept “the reasonable” (the eulogon) as a practical criterion in day to day affairs.

… [S]ince it was necessary … to inquire into the conduct of life, which naturally cannot be directed without a criterion, upon which happiness too, that is, the goal of life depends for its reliability, Arcesilaus says that he who suspends judgment about everything regulates choices and avoidances and, generally, actions by reasonableness, and, proceeding according to this criterion, will act correctly. For happiness arises because of prudence, and prudence resides in correct actions, and a correct action is that which, having been done, has a reasonable defence. Therefore, he who adheres to reasonableness will act correctly and will be happy. (AM 7.158, Inwood & Gerson)

Commentators who see Arcesilaus as a purely negative, ad hominem dialectician suggest that Arcesilaus did not actually endorse such views, and only forwarded them as a possible alternative to the standard Stoic reliance on cataleptic impressions (an alternative which arguably follows from the Stoics' own assumptions). In favour of the view that Arcesilaus endorsed “the reasonable”, it can be said that Sextus seems convinced that this is so, and that some such commitment makes good philosophical sense (see Hankinson, 86–91), especially in a historical context in which philosophers were expected to provide a practical guide to life.

Debates about Arcesilaus' skepticism frequently revolve around the question whether it can be made consistent with an acceptance of a practical criterion like the “reasonable” or, much more fundamentally, the beliefs which daily life appears to require. It is clear that this was a heated issue already in ancient times, for Plutarch's Against Colotes (2nd c. C.E.) takes the 3rd c. B.C.E. Epicurean philosopher Colotes to task for his attack on Arcesilaus in a no longer extant book entitled On the fact that the doctrines of the other philosophers make it impossible even to live. In assessing the implications for skepticism, it is important to recognize that Colotes' book was not a specific attack on Arcesilaus, but a much broader attack on a diverse list of philosophers which includes Democritus, Aristotle, Parmenides and Socrates (indeed, virtually everyone but Colotes' mentor, Epicurus).

In defending Arcesilaus, Plutarch provides an account of his views which is said to explain how it is compatible with action. According to this account, the soul has three movements: sensation, impulse, and assent. This distinction being made, Plutarch says that Arcesilaus allows us to accept sensation and impulse so long as we stop short of assent and opinion (Mor. 1122C–D). According to Plutarch, it follows that Arcesilaus' skepticism is compatible with action and that Colotes fails to see this because the nuances of Arcesilaus' views get from him the kind of unappreciative attention “a performance on the lyre gets from an ass” (Mor. 1122B).

6. Carneades

The Heads of the Academy after Arcesilaus were, in order, Lacydes, Telecles, Evander, and Hegesinus. Little is known about their views, though it appears that they accepted some variant of Arcesilaus' skepticism. The next phase in the history of the Academy and the history of ancient skepticism is the “New Academy” which begins with Carneades' (214/213–129/128 B.C.E.) leadership. According to a fragment of the 2nd c. C.E. Platonist Numenius (preserved in the work of Eusebius, a 3rd–4th c. C.E. Christian bishop), Carneades was victorious on every issue he debated. According to Diogenes Laertius (D.L. 4.62, cf. 7.183), he became so famous attacking Stoic arguments that he mocked the Stoic school, saying “if Chrysippus had not existed neither would I” (mimicking the Stoic maxim, “if Chrysippus had not existed, neither would the Stoa”).

Sextus reports two of Carneades' central arguments against the Stoics' cataleptic impressions and any alternative “criterion” of knowledge proposed by the dogmatic philosophers (AM 7.159–165). According to the first argument, there can be no criterion which establishes certain truth because reason, the senses, and any other possible criterion sometimes misleads us. According to the second argument, the impressions (or “presentations”) that inform our judgments are not completely objective, and reflect their own nature as well as the nature of the reality they reflect — as light shows both itself and the things it illuminates. The subjectivity emphasized in the latter argument may have been underscored by an appeal to the standard Academic argument that any impression which appears true can be paired with (and opposed by) an indistinguishably similar impression which is apparently false.

Despite Carneades' arguments against all criteria of knowledge, Eusebius says that he did not suspend judgment on all matters (Prep. Ev. 14.7.15), and distinguished between those things that are “non-evident” (non-apparent) and those that are “non-apprehensible.” This suggests that Carneades held that everything is non-apprehensible but that some things are “evident” (i.e. not non-evident). It might seem tempting to compare the commitment to evident things that this alleges with the Pyrrhonian commitment to appearances, but the extant evidence suggests that Carneades propounded a more nuanced account of the apparent, distinguishing between impressions which are more and less persuasive.

In “Against the Logicians,” Sextus discusses Carneades' views in the context of his attack on the Stoic theory of cataleptic impressions. According to Sextus, Carneades adopted the pithanon (the “plausible”) as a practical criterion and distinguished between impressions which are:

(i) implausible;

(ii) plausible (i.e. appear true “to an intense degree”);

(iii) irreversible (i.e. plausible and confirmed by other impressions); and

(iv) tested (i.e. irreversible and tested by the scrutiny of surrounding circumstances).

Some have argued that this criterion is an improvement on Stoic epistemology, insofar as it suggests that we should accept impressions which are not merely “clear and distinct” but (in addition) irreversible and tested.

According to Sextus' account of Carneades' views, Carneades added further sophistication to his criterion of choice by holding that different levels of plausibility are appropriate in different kinds of circumstances. In matters of no importance, or circumstances in which the time at one's disposal is limited, for example, plausible impressions may suffice. In contrast, weighty matters require our reliance on impressions which are irreversible and tested (AM 7.184).

Sextus illustrates Carneadean plausibility with an example:

On seeing a coil of rope in an unlighted room a man jumps over it, conceiving it for the moment to be a snake [i.e. judging this to be plausible], but turning back afterwards he inquires into the truth, and on finding it motionless he is already inclined to think that it is not a snake [for this impression seems reversible], but as he reckons, all the same, that snakes too are motionless at times when numbed by winter's frost, he prods at the coiled mass with a stick, and then, after thus testing the impression received, he assents to the fact that it is false to suppose that the body presented to him is a snake. (AM 7.187–88, Bury)

If we judge by Sextus and other ancient sources, Carneades tried to make the pithanon compatible with his skepticism by emphasizing its subjectivity and not proposing it as a measure of objective probability or truth. Clitomachus thus writes that “The Academic school holds that there are dissimilarities between things of such a nature that some of them seem plausible and others the contrary; but this is not an adequate ground for saying that some things can be apprehended [or grasped as true] and others cannot, because many false objects are plausible…” (Cicero Ac. 2.103; cf. 104 and AM 7.169). This suggests that Carneadean assent to plausibility is consciously subjective and in this way more constrained than the assent implied by claims to truth. This is one way in which Carneades and his followers may have tried to render their acceptance of the plausible compatible with their skeptical conclusions.

7. Arcesilaus and Carneades as Dialecticians

In an influential article, Coussin has argued for a "dialectical" interpretation of Academic skepticism. According to this interpretation, Arcesilaus and Carneades adopted a purely negative stance and do not commit themselves to anything. All their arguments are, on this account, to be understood as attempts to show how one can argue against the views of others. Any views that they express are accepted only "for the sake of argument."

This account of Academic skepticism maintains that Arcesilaus and Carneades only constructed arguments against others points of view, and did not endorse skeptical doctrines or the positive philosophies which Sextus (a rival skeptic) attributes to them. In particular it suggests that Arcesilaus did not endorse the eulogon and Carneades did not endorse the pithanon as criteria for accepting some limited belief. When Carneades argues that we can accept and follow “plausible” impressions he is, on this account, proposing this position merely for the sake of argument — to show that alternatives to dogmatic epistemology are in principle possible (see, e.g., Striker).

On this interpretation, Arcesilaus and Carneades were dialecticians. They are “skeptics” in the sense that they refused to commit themselves to any of the premises they (or others) use, or any of the conclusions drawn from them, and were not concerned to adopt beliefs or philosophical positions on any of the matters they discuss. Their achievement is, on this account, not a positive skeptical philosophy but a negative skepticism which incorporates a dialectical ability to argue against prevailing points of view, and a disinclination to positively elaborate any positive philosophical views.

It is not easy to discern when and whether the Academics' arguments are forwarded positively or merely "for the sake of argument," especially as this dialectical practise is a part of academic skepticism. Most famously it is evident on the occasion when Carneades visited Rome and argued in favour of justice, and on the next day against it. The key question is whether this is the way the Academics always argued, or whether they sometimes assented to belief and/or forwarded arguments meant to establish some beliefs — for example, the skeptical conclusion that knowledge cannot be attained — as more likely than others.

In the Academica 2.78, Cicero reports that Philo (of Larissa, Cicero's Academic teacher) and Metrodorus (a pupil of Carneades) ascribe to Carneades a skepticism which holds that the sage cannot apprehend anything (grasp it as true) but may accept an opinion nonetheless. In answer to this interpretation, Cicero says that he prefers the view of Clitomachus, who holds that Carneades did not so much accept this view as advance it in argument. In at least this case, this suggests that the view that Carneades defended was an account of the Stoic sage derived from the premises of the Stoics and other philosophers. But this leaves open the question whether the non-sage can reasonably accept opinions, a view that Thorsrud attributes to Carneades, Cicero and Clitomachus (cf. Hankinson, 94).

In favor of the dialectical interpretation of Carneades' claims many commentators cite Academica 2.139, where Cicero says that Clitomachus used to declare that he had never been able to understand what Carneades did accept (see Striker, 55; Hankinson, 94; Inwood & Gerson, 165; Long & Sedley, Vol 1, 455). This suggests the dialectical interpretation but Cicero's report is embedded in a discussion of the good, in which Carneades is said to have defended Calliphon's view that the good is pleasure with such zeal “that he was thought actually to accept it (although Clitomachus used to declare that he had never been able to understand what Carneades did accept)”. Taken in this context, the parenthetical comment can be interpreted as the claim that Clitomachus did not understand what Carneades held in this regard, not as the claim that Carneades never commits himself to any point of view.

Sextus and Cicero clearly think that the Academics do positively endorse both skeptical conclusions and their various criteria for practical affairs. Thorsrud argues that the most significant extant account of their views — provided by Cicero — clearly suggests that all the Academics shared this point of view. He suggests that they make room for this positive skepticism by allowing an acceptance of impressions which does not contradict their rejection of assent. This acceptance implies a fallibilistic conception of belief that emphasizes its qualified and subjective nature (in a similar vein, Bett recognizes a Carneadean "approval" which he distinguishes from the "assent" that Carneades rejects). This conception is compatible with, indeed encourages, the skeptic's continued examination of all beliefs and the pursuit of inquiry to determine whether any beliefs can be determined to be true, reasonable or plausible.

To some extent, the arguments for and against the dialectical interpretation of the Academics revolve around the question how the Academics' views can be rendered most consistent. In favour of the dialectical interpretation, it saves the Academics from one of the key criticisms of the skeptical perspective: the claim that skeptics inconsistently accept particular beliefs. For someone with no positive views cannot be charged with inconsistency. Against the dialectical interpretation it can be argued that it leaves the Academics open to another standard criticism: that skepticism is inconsistent with life and philosophical inquiry (even of the skeptical sort). For arguments, actions and decisions imply some acceptance of belief.

8. Carneades and Practical Life

Whether or not he was a pure dialectician, Carneades' dexterity in argument is the most notable feature of the extant evidence about him. He was not a moralist in the way that Pyrrho was, though Cicero implies some commitment to contentment-through-antithesis when he says that Carneades criticized the way in which Chrysippus used a passage in which Euripides recounts the pain of life, saying that Chrysippus used the passage to promote pessimism instead of using it to comfort those who were badly off by reciting the misfortunes of others (Tusc. Disp. 3.59–60).

Different kinds of oppositions are used to preserve an even temper when Carneades claims that we should oppose the expected with the unexpected — health with the possibility of sickness, safety with the possibility of accident, etc. — because the unexpected may cause us grief if it catches us off guard and unprepared (Plutarch, Tranq. 474F–75A). In a famous speech Carneades provided a paradigm example of the way that opposing arguments can promote peace of mind when he argued, for Clitomachus' sake in the wake of the destruction of his native Carthage, that the wise man will not be distressed even at the loss of his own homeland (Cicero, Tusc. Disp. 3.54).

Though this suggests that the Carneadean perspective promoted some kind of equanimity, Sextus writes that its doctrine of the plausible is not consistent with (late) Pyrrhonian moral ideals, for it is not compatible with the Pyrrhonians almost ascetic (one might say “apathetic”) acceptance of appearances. As Sextus puts it, “[A]lthough both the [later] Academics and the Skeptics say that they are persuaded of certain things, here too the difference of the philosophies is very evident. For “to be persuaded” has different senses: on the one hand, it means not to resist but simply to follow without much proclivity or strong pro feeling, as the child is said to be obedient to his teacher; but sometimes it means assent to something by choice and with a kind of sympathy due to strong desire, as when a profligate man is persuaded by one who approves of living extravagantly. Since, therefore, the followers of Carneades and Clitomachus say both that they are strongly persuaded and that things are strongly persuasive [i.e. plausible, pithanon], whereas we say that we simply make a concession without any strong feeling, we would differ from them in this respect, too.” (PH 1.230, Mates). This difference highlights the much more significant role that indifference plays in Pyrrhonian — as opposed to Academic — skepticism.

9. The Arguments for Later Pyrrhonism

Carneades' successor in the Academy was Clitomachus (d. 110/9 B.C.E.). He authored voluminous exegetical writings (now lost) which reported and explained Carneades' arguments and his skepticism. Following Clitomachus, the head of the Academy was Philo of Larissa (d. 84/3 B.C.E.), who taught, on the basis of the Carneadean notion of “plausible” impressions, an epistemology which allowed an Academic to respond to disputed questions by adopting whatever position seemed most plausible after a thorough examination of the arguments on all sides. One did so on the understanding that one was not claiming to have established certain truth, or to know that any doctrine was the truth. One only held a position as rationally best-supported and, therefore, most worth believing. In this way, one held a position to be true without claiming to know that this was so. As is evident in the philosophical writings of Philo's pupil Cicero, this in practice meant the adoption (in a tentative spirit) of many Stoic points of view.

The next important ancient skeptic was Aenesidemus, who defected from Philo's Academy and revived Pyrrhonism in the early years of the first century B.C.E. “The Academics,” he said, “especially the ones now, sometimes agree with Stoic opinions and, to tell the truth, appear to be just Stoics in conflict with Stoics” (Photius, Bibl. 212, Inwood & Gerson). In response, Aenesidemus' eight books of Pyrrhonian Arguments propounded the view that “the Pyrrhonist determines nothing, not even this, that he determines nothing” (ibid.). Yet Aenesidemus himself is reported to have given up on Pyrrhonism in the end, and to have finished his career as a Heracleitean, apparently on the grounds that skeptical antithesis is a a road that leads to the realization that reality is full of opposites (PH 1.210, compare AM 7.349, 9.336–67, 10.216, and Tertullian, De Anima 9.5, 14.5).

Though Aenesidemus' books on Pyrrhonism do not survive, they are summarized by Photius (9th c. C.E.). His account suggests that they systematized Pyrrhonism by establishing standard argumentative strategies and collecting an array of arguments, puzzles and conundrums borrowed from the whole of Greek philosophy.

We know of later Pyrrhonism primarily through three surviving works of Sextus Empiricus (ca. 200 C.E.):

(i) The Outlines of Pyrrhonism;

(ii) Against the Dogmatists, which consists of “Against the Logicians” (2 books), “Against the Physicists” (2 books), and “Against the Ethicists” (1 book); and

(iii) Against the Learned (Adversus Mathematicos), which combines the five books of Against the Dogmatists with six further books that attack the epistemological pretensions of mathematicians, grammarians, etc.

The relations between these books are complex and not yet well explored (in Sextus 1997, Bett argues for a reading of Against the Ethicists which would make it propound a different skepticism than the Outlines of Pyrrhonism, which is normally taken as the standard account of Pyrrhonism).

Aenesidemus' most important arguments are the ten modes (or “tropes”) which Sextus attributes to “the older skeptics” at PH 1.35–163. These ten ways of arguing create antitheses and promote the suspension of judgment (epoche) by contrasting:

(i) the opposing perceptions and views of the world which characterize different species: “For how could one say, with regard to touch [for example], that animals are similarly affected whether their surfaces consist of shell, flesh, needles, feathers or scales? And, as regards hearing, how could one say that perceptions are alike in animals with a very narrow auditory canal and in those with a very wide one, or in those with hairy ears and those with ears that are hairless… [P]erfume seems very pleasant to human beings but intolerable to dung beetles and bees, and the application of olive oil is beneficial to human beings but kills wasps and bees.” (PH 1.50, 55, Mates)

(ii) the opposing perceptions and views of the world which characterize different individuals: thus “…the greatest indication of the vast and limitless difference in the intellect of human beings is the inconsistency of the various statements of the Dogmatists concerning what may be appropriately chosen, what avoided, and so on.” (PH 1.85–86, Mates)

(iii) the opposing perceptions and views of the world which characterize different sense organs: thus “Pictures seem to the sense of sight to have concavities and convexities,” for example, “but not to the touch,” and “Let us imagine someone who from birth has …lacked hearing and sight. He will start out believing in the existence of nothing visible or audible, but only of the three kinds of quality he can register. It is therefore a possibility that we too, having only our five senses, only register from the qualities belonging to the apple those which we are capable of registering. But it may be that there objectively exist other qualities” (PH 1.92, 96–7, Mates).

(iv) the opposing perceptions and views of the world which characterize different circumstances: “Thus, things affect us in dissimilar ways depending on whether we are in a natural or unnatural condition, as when people who are delirious or possessed by a god seem to hear spirits but we do not…. And the same water that seems to us to be lukewarm seems boiling hot when poured on an inflamed place…. Further, if someone says that an intermingling of certain humors produces, in persons who are in an unnatural condition, odd phantasiai [impressions] of the external objects, it must be replied that since healthy people, too, have intermingled humors, it is possible that the external objects are in nature such as they appear to those persons who are said to be in an unnatural state, but that these humors are making the external objects appear to the healthy in a natural people other than they are. (PH 1.101–2, Mates).

(v) the opposing perceptions and views of the world that characterize different positions and distances and places: for example, “lamplight appears dim in sunlight but bright in the dark. The same oar appears bent in water but straight when out of it” (PH 1.119, Mates).

(vi) the opposing perceptions and views of the world that characterize mixtures: thus “we deduce that since no object strikes us entirely by itself, but along with something, it may perhaps be possible to say what the mixture compounded out of the external object and the thing perceived with it is like, but we would not be able to say what the external object is like by itself… The same sound appears one way when accompanied by a rarefied atmosphere, another way when accompanied by a dense atmosphere” (PH 1.124, 125, Mates).

(vii) the opposing perceptions and views of the world due to different quantities and structures: thus “[the] individual filings of a piece of silver appear black, but when united with the whole they affect us as white… And wine, when drunk in moderation, strengthens us, but when taken in excess, disables the body…” (PH 1.129, 131, Mates).

(viii) the opposing views possible because of the relativity of all things: “…since all things are relative, we will suspend judgment about what things exist absolutely and in nature… This has two senses. One is in relation to the judging subject [different subjects perceiving differently]… The other in relation to the conceptions perceived with it…” (PH 1.135, Mates).

(ix) the opposing perceptions and views of the world due to constancy or rarity of occurrence: for “The sun is certainly a much more marvelous thing than a comet. But since we see the sun all the time but the comet only infrequently, we marvel at the comet so much as even to suppose it a divine portent, but we do nothing like that for the sun. If, however, we thought of the sun as appearing infrequently and setting infrequently, and as illuminating everything all at once and then suddenly being eclipsed, we should find much to marvel at in the matter.” (PH 1.141, Mates). And

(x) the opposing perceptions and views of what is right and wrong which characterize different ways of life, laws, myths and “dogmatic suppositions”: for “among the Persians sodomy is customary but among the Romans it is prohibited by law; and with us adultery is prohibited, but among the Massagetae it is by custom treated as a matter of indifference, as Eudoxus of Cnidos reports… and with us it is forbidden to have intercourse with one's mother, whereas with the Persians this sort of marriage is very much the custom. And among the Egyptians men marry their sisters, which for us is prohibited by law. (PH 1.152, Mates).

Later Pyrrhonian modes more clearly isolate the basic epistemological issues which are raised by the traditional ten modes. The five modes of Agrippa (whose date is unknown, though he is later than Aenesidemus) focus, as Barnes has shown, on some of the underlying epistemological concerns that motivate skeptical conclusions. Sextus presents them at PH 1.164–77, where he says that they promote the suspension of judgment by invoking:

disagreement, for among philosophers and ordinary people there is interminable disagreement;

regress ad infinitum, for the skeptic asks for a proof of a claim, a proof of the reliability of this proof, and so on ad infinitum;

relativity, for things are relative to both one's subjective nature and the concepts one employs in judging them;

hypothesis, for the skeptic does not allow us to take as our starting point something which is taken for granted;

circular reasoning, for the skeptic rejects proofs that are circular, as when sense impressions are used to establish the veracity of the senses.

The standard modes are reduced even further in a set of two basic modes propounded in the next section of the Outlines of Pyrrhonism (1.178–79). There Sextus argues that everything which is apprehended (as true) must be apprehended through itself or some other thing. But this is problematic, for the first alternative is undermined by the “controversy among philosophers” and the second by a demand for justification which entails a regress ad infinitum. The latter can be stopped only by claiming that something is apprehended as true in virtue of itself, a possibility which is undermined by the first of the two modes.

The different sets of Pyrrhonian modes (collected in Annas and Barnes) systematize skeptical arguments against dogmatic philosophical positions, but the Pyrrhonians do not restrict themselves to their formal modes. Judging by Sextus, the modes are usually backed, and very frequently supplanted, by a lengthy catalogue of other, specific arguments which can be used to argue for epoche on whatever topic happens to be at hand (space, time, the good, the gods, fate, the meaningfulness of standard conceptions of human nature, and so on and so forth). No encyclopedia article can fully convey the endless assortment of claims and counter claims that Sextus seems ready to marshal on any topic.

10. The Practical Criterion

The bulk of Sextus' work is a concatenation of opposing arguments used to promote the suspension of judgment. In the midst of this attack on the views of the dogmatist philosophers, it is easy to forget that Sextus and the Pyrrhoneans, like Pyrrho before them, proposed skepticism, not only as (in some way) an epistemological conclusion, but also as a way of life (an agôgê).

According to Sextus, the merits of the Pyrrhonian way of living include its rejection of the useless speculation which he attributes to dogmatist philosophy. Like Hume, the Pyrrhoneans in this way claimed that their philosophy replaced abstruse and unhelpful philosophical speculation with mundane matters of practical concern. The practical spirit this implies is reflected at PH 2.241–44, where Sextus condemns the convoluted arguments and conundrums of ancient dialectic:

As regards sophisms the exposure of which is useful, the dialectician will not have a word to say, but will propound such arguments as these — “If it is not so that you both have fair horns and have horns, you have horns; but it is not so that you have fair horns and have horns, therefore you have horns.” “If a thing moves, it moves either in the spot where it is or where it is not; but it neither moves in the spot where it is (for it is at rest) nor in that where it is not (for how could a thing be active in a spot where it does not so much as exist?); therefore nothing moves.” “Either the existent becomes or the non-existent; now the existent does not become (for it exists); nor yet does the non-existent (for the becoming is passive but the non-existent is not passive); therefore nothing becomes.” “Snow is frozen water; but water is black; therefore snow is black.”

And when he has made a collection of such trash he draws his eyebrows together, and expounds Dialectic and endeavours very solemnly to establish for us by syllogistic proofs that a thing becomes, a thing moves, snow is white, and we do not have horns, although it is probably sufficient to confront the trash with the plain facts, smashing up their positive affirmation by means of equally weighty contradictory evidence derived from the appearances. (PH 2.241–44, Bury, revised, cf. Timon's attitude reported in D.L. 9.111, 2.107)

Appealing to a precedent set, according to their account, by Pyrrho, the Pyrrhoneans proposed that we replace philosophical attempts to establish what is true with a willingness to accept appearances. It is this willingness which is said to provide the Pyrrhonean with the foundation that was needed for ordinary actions and skeptical assertions. As Diogenes Laertius writes:

Aenesidemus too in the first book of his Pyrrhonian Arguments says that Pyrrho determines nothing dogmatically because of the existence of contradictory arguments, but rather follows appearances. He says the same thing in Against Wisdom and On Investigation. And Zeuxis, an associate of Aenesidemus, in On Twofold Arguments and Antiochus of Laodicea and Apellas in his Agrippa posit the phenomena alone. Therefore, according to the skeptics, the appearance is a criterion, as Aenesidemus too says. (D.L. 9.106, Inwood & Gerson)

According to Sextus, “when we question whether the external object is such as it appears, we grant that it does appear, and we are not raising a question about the appearance but rather about what is said about the appearance; this is different from raising a question about the appearance itself. For example, the honey appears to us to be sweet. This we grant, for we sense the sweetness… And even when we do present arguments in oppostion to the appearances, we do not put these forward with the intention of denying the appearances but by way of pointing out the precipitancy of the Dogmatists…” (PH 1.19, Mates).

The Pyrrhoneans' commitment to appearances is consolidated in a “Practical Criterion” which was advocated as a “standard of action” which allowed the Pyrrhonian to “perform some actions and abstain from others.”

Holding to the appearances, then, we live without beliefs but in accord with the ordinary regimen of life, since we cannot be wholly inactive. And this regimen of life seems to be fourfold: one part has to do with the guidance of nature (physis), another with the compulsion of the pathê [feelings, affections of the soul], another with the handing down of laws and customs, and a fourth with instruction in arts and crafts (technê). Nature's guidance is that by which we are naturally capable of sensation and thought; compulsion of the pathê is that by which hunger drives us to food and thirst makes us drink; the handing down of customs and laws is that by which we accept that piety in the conduct of life is good and impiety bad; and instruction in arts and crafts is that by which we are not inactive in whichever of these we acquire. (PH 1.23–4, Mates)

Like Pyrrho's follower Timon, the Pyrrhoneans claimed that skeptical arguments and the Pyrrhonian acceptance of appearances could provide the basis for a life characterized by peace of mind. As Diogenes Laertius puts it, “The skeptics say the goal is suspension of judgement, upon which freedom from anxiety follows like a shadow, as Timon and Aenesidemus and their followers put it.” (D.L. 9.107, Inwood & Gerson, cf. PH 1.29). According to Sextus, the telos of skepticism is tranquillity of mind (ataraxia) and “moderate” feeling “in respect of things unavoidable.” (PH 1.26)

We do not… take Sceptics to be undisturbed in every way — we say that they are disturbed by things which are forced upon them; for we agree that at times they shiver and are thirsty and have other feelings of this kind. But in these cases ordinary people are afflicted by two sets of circumstances: by the feelings themselves, and no less by believing that these circumstances are bad by nature. Sceptics, who shed the additional opinion that each of these things is bad in its nature, come off more moderately even in these cases. (PH 1.29–30, Annas & Barnes)

Mates has criticized this aspect of Pyrrhonism, writing that “It is hard to find much plausibility in the general claim that the person who, on a given occasion, thinks “this appears to me to be very, very bad” will be any less upset than if he thought “this is very, very bad” (63). The Pyrrhonean might answer that their acceptance of appearances is more powerful than this suggests, for it takes place within the context of equally convincing arguments for and against the view that things are as they appear. When faced with the thought that “This is very, very bad,” the Pyrrhonean will, therefore, combat this thought by trying to develop a set of compelling arguments for the conclusion that “This appears bad, but I have equally convincing reasons for thinking it may not be so.” In such a context, it is the compelling arguments which the Pyrrhonean produces that are supposed to provide a psychological basis for the detached and distant “following” of appearances which characterizes Pyrrhonian equanimity (isostheneia). The equal force of opposing arguments is thus the key to Pyrrhonian ataraxia).

Given the practical goals of Pyrrhonism, one might argue that the psychological force of Pyrrhonian arguments was as important as their logical force, for it was designed to constrain a Pyrrhonean's attachment to appearances. The psychological implications highlight one of the fundamental differences that separates ancient and modern arguments for skepticism, for the ancient skeptics (and especially the Pyrrhonians) used skeptical arguments as psychological tools designed to break down their own and others' psychological attachment to belief. It is in this way that their arguments were meant to foster ataraxia.

In explaining why the skeptic's collection of arguments includes some which are weak, Sextus therefore says that the skeptic uses arguments of different strengths “just as doctors have remedies of different strengths for bodily ailments and for those suffering excessively employ the strong ones and for those suffering mildly the mild ones” (PH 3.280, Inwood & Gerson).

11. The Logic of Ancient Skepticism

11.1 How radical is ancient skepticism?

Sextus makes much of the skeptic's open-minded attitude to the possibility of apprehending truth, but the arguments that he and other ancient skeptics offer raise deep questions about any claim to truth. It is difficult to see how any considerations could convince a philosopher like Sextus that skepticism is mistaken, for he himself says that the skeptic will not assent even if he can find no fault with a proposed position. “When someone propounds to us a theory which we are unable to refute, we say to him in reply ‘Just as, before the birth of the founder of the School to which you belong, the theory it holds was not as yet apparent as a sound theory… so likewise it is possible that the opposite theory to that which you now propound is… not yet apparent to us, so that we ought not as yet yield assent to this theory which at the moment seems to be valid.’” (PH 1.33–34, Bury)

The broad application of the arguments for ancient skepticism are evident in the Pyrrhonian modes, which are universally applicable and can be used to question any and all belief. Within its ancient context, skepticism is able to raise more radical doubts than those that characterize modern skepticism because ancient philosophers did not hesitate to countenance extreme points of view. An example which Sextus favours is Gorgias' argument for the conclusion that nothing exists (and that if it did we could not know so, and that we could not communicate it even if we knew). Elsewhere we find Sextus citing the opinion of Xeniades of Corinth, who is said to have maintained that every impression and opinion is false (AM 7.53, cf. 48) — a disconcerting view but arguably no more so than its opposite, which appears to be the Protagorean claim that every impression and opinion is true. Sextus has a pronounced interest in radical positions of this sort, for they can be exploited for skeptical ends, both because they contradict other philosophical opinions, and because they raise radical doubts about all things.

Mates underscores the radical nature of the questions that the ancient skeptics, emphasizing that Sextus will not even grant that we have coherent concepts of the external world, soul, body, sense impressions, etc. As he puts it in discussing the Sextus' attitude to the external world, “His own deep skepticism leaves him in a state of epochê, not only as to whether there are any such things as ‘external objects', but even as to whether these terms of the Dogmatists have any intelligible meaning at all.” (55)

11.2 How relevant is ancient skepticism?

The radical nature of ancient skepticism does not itself show that skepticism is a perspective relevant to contemporary philosophy. During much of the history of Western philosophy, ancient skepticism has been dismissed on the grounds that it is too radical to be taken seriously. Certainly it must be said that many of the arguments of the skeptics are of marginal interest to philosophy today. But it is equally clear that ancient skepticism raises fundamental questions which continue to be of fundamental interest. A whole series of commentators have demonstrated ancient skepticism's relevance to the rise of modern epistemology (see, e.g., Fosl, Groarke, Jardine, Popkin, Schmitt), and there can be little doubt that the skeptics understood and contended with the key epistemological issues that arise when one attempts to build a rational basis for belief (issues encapsulated in the problem of the criterion and the later modes). In the realm of value, Laursen has argued that ancient skepticism already contains within it the seeds of modern liberalism.

The relevance of the ancient skeptics' response to the issues they raise is more difficult to judge. The contemporary discussion of skepticism, belief, and knowledge is in this regard more distant from its ancient cousin. In at least one case, there does seem to be a contemporary answer to skepticism which has no ancient antecedent and does not, therefore, figure in ancient discussions for and against skepticism. It is the suggestion that skeptical inquiry can in some way be linguistically dissolved. Such a view is evident in the work of Wittgenstein, Putnam and others who argue that skeptical claims in some way violate the norms that govern meaningful language (and can, therefore, be rejected as nonsensical). In ancient times, Aristocles wrote that skepticism is inconsistent with the assumption that the skeptic understands language (Eus., Prep. Ev. 14.18) but it is difficult to find an ancient answer to skepticism which can be considered a close analogue to this linguistic turn. One's attitude to this omission inevitably depends on one's assessment of the strength of this attempt to undermine skeptical considerations (for a negative assessment, see Mates, 68–85).

11.3 Is ancient skepticism consistent?

The radical nature of the skeptical perspective raises the question whether ancient skepticism is inherently nconsistent. How, the skeptics' critics ask, is the suspension of judgment on all questions compatible with the claim that there are equal arguments for and against any position; with the professed conclusion that knowledge is unattainable; or with the beliefs that skeptics seem to embrace in the course of their daily lives? The skeptics answer that their views are not inconsistent, for they accept skepticism in some “undogmatic” way which does not contradict their rejection of claims to truth (see Frede).

The Pyrrhonean version of this response is their claim that they accept appearances without committing themselves to belief. Johnsen has tried to show how it may be possible to consistently achieve this goal. When one judges ancient skepticism from this point of view, it is important to remember that its attack on truth assumes a particular conception of truth. Burnyeat emphasizes that this conception is a “realist” one which suggests that a claim is true if it corresponds to a real objective world that is not subjective (but exists, as we might put it, from “a god's eye point of view”). As Burnyeat writes:

In the controversy between the skeptic and the dogmatists over whether any truth exists at all, the issue is whether any proposition of a class of propositions can be accepted as true of a real objective world as distinct from mere appearance. For “true” in these discussions means “true of a real objective world”; the true, if there is such a thing is what conforms with the real, an association traditional to the word alêthês since the earliest period of Greek philosophy (cf. AM 11. 221).

Now clearly, if truth is restricted to matters pertaining to real existence, as contrasted with appearance, the same will apply [to related skeptical conceptions]… The notions involved, consistency and conflict, undecidability, isostheneia, epochê, ataraxia, since they are defined in terms of truth, will all relate, via truth to real existence rather than appearance. (Burnyeat, “Can the Sceptic Live His Scepticism,” p. 121)

Burnyeat's point is key, for it implies that ancient skepticism is an attack on realist truth which has affinities to modern and contemporary anti-realism. In the context of questions about consistency, it provides a possible answer to the charge that the skeptics were inconsistent, for contemporary philosophy accepts conceptions of belief that do not mean accepting something “as true in the realist sense.” One might therefore argue that the ancient skeptic's decision to suspend judgment on claims to (realist) truth in principle leaves room for anti-realist forms of belief and assent (cf. Groarke). Rather than eschew all belief (i.e. belief in our sense), this suggests that the ancient skeptic rejects a particular kind of belief to which contemporary epistemology offers a variety of alternatives (founded on coherence accounts of truth, etc.). Unlike the contemporary anti-realist, the ancient skeptics retained a realist conception of “truth” and “belief” and, therefore, expressed their position as the rejection of belief and the adoption of a weaker following of appearances, subjective impressions, and so on. This is an important difference, but the move away from realist conceptions of belief is similar in both cases.

The extent to which ancient skepticism can be compared to contemporary anti-realism is open to debate. But it suggests that skepticism may not be fatally inconsistent (for it rejects realist truth in favour of an anti-realist conception of belief) and that the positive accounts of belief that the ancient skeptics propose are, like many of their arguments against claims to truth and knowledge, relevant to modern and contemporary philosophical concerns.


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Carneades | moral skepticism | perception: epistemological problems of | Plato | Pyrrho | skepticism | Socrates | Stoicism | Timon of Phlius