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Epigenesis and Preformationism

First published Tue Oct 11, 2005

Epigenesis and Preformation are two persistent ways of describing and seeking to explain the development of individual organic form. Does every individual start from material that is unformed, and the form emerges only gradually, over time? Or does the individual start in some already preformed, or predelineated, or predetermined way? The questions are part metaphysical: what is it that exists — form or also the unformed that becomes the formed? And they are partly epistemological: how do we know — through observation or inference? The debate has persisted since ancient times, and today plays out as genetic determinists appeal to the already “formed” through genetic inheritance, while others insist on the efficacy of environmental plasticity. Nature or nurture, epigenesis or preformation, genetic determinism or developmental free will, or is some version of a middle ground possible? These are the terms of this perennial discussion, and the underlying assumptions shape debates about when life begins and have profound bioethical and policy implications.

1. The Problem

The core question underlying the existence of these two competing philosophical traditions is the extent to which something is considered as being formed or organized from the “beginning” or whether organization and form arise only over time. 19th century uses of the term “evolution” included a sense of unfolding of preexisting form, or a sort of preformationism in contrast to the epigenesis of the day. Discussions of “evolution” and “epigenesis” can therefore be misleading in retrospect since evolution has assumed a meaning more nearly like the old epigenesis [Bowler 1975]. Making things even more complicated, by the late 19th century “preformationism” really was less about the preexistence of form as such than about various versions of predetermination or predelineation. In the background lie debates about the relative significance of predestination and free will, for persons, for organic beings, or even for the inorganic. Furthermore some authors saw epigenesis or preformation as entirely internally directed, while others in each case allowed responses to the environment. In each case, it is important to keep in mind what the particular writer was saying and the arguments presented. Thus, discussions of epigenesis and preformation often bring in other ancillary questions and are difficult to separate from their contexts. This essay is an effort to extract what is centrally at issue and to focus on key contributions to the discussion.

Solar systems can “evolve” and could develop epigenetically, at least in theory. Yet they are not thought of as doing so, typically, and so the terms apply primarily to the organic world. Species can evolve or develop more or less gradually, with more or less form already physically existing or programmed in from the beginning. Yet typically discussions of epigenesis and preformation have focused on individual organisms and their development rather than on species. The emphasis is on different interpretations of the actual developmental process as it plays out in time, rather than on the underlying cause of development per se.

Therefore, this essay focuses on individual organisms and understandings of their development processes. Even more specifically, this means looking at the development of their form and to a lesser extent also function. Epigenesis and preformation offer two competing interpretations of what is involved, with a range of alternatives in between. The two approaches draw on different metaphysical and different epistemological sets of assumptions. We can get at the central issues by looking most closely at a series of focused episodes.

2. Aristotle and Aristotelianism

Aristotle was a keen observer of many things, including embryos. Looking at chicks, for example, and drawing on his interpretations developed earlier for the physical science, he saw material, final, formal, and efficient causes at work in developing individual organisms. The early egg was not formed. It was not already a little chick (or whatever the species). Instead, it gradually acquired form, only gradually acquired a heart that began beating, only gradually acquired the other parts that make it a chick. The material may be there from the beginning in the case of chicks, for example, but the formal cause only gradually plays out along with the efficient cause of embryonic development.

Thus, Aristotle could fit his observations of embryos perfectly well within his larger theoretical interpretations of the world. With sexually reproducing species, individual organisms begin when the fluids (or “semen”) from the mother and the father come together. This combines the essential causes and initiates the developmental process. Gradually, over time, form begins to emerge from the unformed. The maternal contribution is the material cause, which resides in the menstrual blood. After “the discharge is over and most of it has passed off, then what remains begins to take shape as a fetus” [Aristotle 1979]. Yet the female semen or menstrual blood is only “that out of which it generates” and must be acted upon by the male semen which is “that which generates.” Together, consistent with the essential nature of the species and telos (or final cause) in question, the formal cause and efficient causal process act to bring a formed individual organism from potential into actual being. The male and female parents serve as the “principles of generation,” and each individual organism begins anew.

For Aristotle, the causes lie internal to the combined fluids rather than outside. An individual life begins when the male and female semen are brought together. This is an external action and it starts the individual developmental process in motion. From that point on, the process is internal and driven by internal causes. The process then leads to development of form of the individual's type, since “once a thing has been formed, it must of necessity grow” [Aristotle 1979, pp. 151-153, 157]. (See Lennox 2001 for discussion of Aristotle's predecessors on these points; see Vinci and Robert 2005, on Aristotle's development.)

An individual organic life requires a “soul” which must be there from the outset and that resides within the material body. This soul guides the gradual epigenetic process of development. This is the Aristotelian and not the Christian soul. Soul consists of the vegetative (for all organisms), locomotory (for those organisms that move, namely animals), and rational (for those organisms that think, namely man). This soul resides in the combination of male and female semen. The living differs from the dead because of the action of the soul. Therefore, it is the teleological drive of the potential that actualizes the individual and its form and function, epigenetically, gradually, and internally.

Aristotelians followed Aristotle and without much further study of embryos interpreted development, including human development, as gradual and epigenetic. Tradtional Catholicism agreed. St. Augustine and St. Thomas Aquinas both held that hominization, or the coming into being of the human, occurs only gradually. Quickening was thought to occur around 40 days, and to be the point at which the merely animal mix of material fluids was ensouled. Until 1859, when Pope Pius IX decreed that life begins at “conception,” the Church was epigenetic along with the Aristotelians [see Maienschein 2003].

3. 18th Century Debates

Shirley Roe's discussion of the 18th century debates provides the best understanding of the context. Enthusiasm for scientific study of natural phenomena of all sorts was combined with particular interest in natural history and changes over time and with newly available microscopic methods to stimulate interest in development [Roe 1971]. Aristotelian epigenesis still provided the background assumptions about individual development as the 18th century began, and researchers sought to observe the gradual emergence of form from non-form. Yet Aristotelian accounts called for the efficacy of the causes, acting through the process of ensoulment. In effect, this interpretation of epigenesis depended on a life force within the organism driving its emergence of form. Those who accepted epigenesis also accepted a form of vitalism.

Matter in motion, by itself, would not seem to have the capacity to produce these results. How could matter become formed when it was not? How could the emerging form acquire the capacity to function without some vital force or factor that was not strictly material? This was the problem for materialists. And as Roe explains quite nicely, the 18th century brought those who would be materialists. Those who began with a materialist metaphysic, assuming that all that can exist is matter in motion, could not see how gradual epigenetic emergence of form could occur. The 18th century brought debates between those who started from metaphysical assumptions of materialism and those who started from epistemological assumptions that empirical observation should provide the basis for scientific knowledge.

One popular representation of the alternative, preformationist view was with the homunculus. Whether initially intended seriously or as a way to capture alternative ideas, the idea of a tiny preformed little person did capture attention. Nicolaas von Hartsoeker gave us the image in 1694 of a tiny man in the sperm, which became the starting point for spermists. Others, ovists, accepted the idea of a preformed form but placed it in the egg. This was preformationism taken quite literally. The form that the individual adult organism would assume was, physically and materially, preformed from the earliest stages of development. From that point it just grew up.

Not all preformationists took their preformationism quite so literally or graphically, but it did present a competing alternative to Aristotelian epigenesis by the 18th century [see Pinto-Correia 1997; Bowler 1971]. As Iris Fry has argued in her study of origins of life debates, only with preformation could a materialistic mechanist be a good Christian in the 18th century [Fry 2000, p. 26, citing Farley 1977 p. 29]. This debate played out, for example, in the work of Caspar Friedrich Wolff and Charles Bonnet, both looking at chick development. They looked at the same thing and even fundamentally agreed about what they saw, but their conclusions were quite different. This story can be seen as a debate about scientific theory. Wolff was an epigenesist, maintaining that form emerges only gradually; Bonnet was a preformationist, insisting that form exists from the beginning of each individual organism and only experiences growth over time. In addition to these theoretical and epistemological issues, there is also a story about metaphysics. This story has been told in detail elsewhere, and I need not repeat that exposition here. The central point for our purposes is that the 18th century brought debates between metaphysical materialists who were forced into preformationism, and epistemological epigenesists who observed from emerging only gradually and who were willing to accept vitalism as the only apparent causal explanation for the emergence of form from the not-formed [Roe 1981, Maienschein 2000].

4. Evolution and Embryos: A New Preformationism

In 1859, Darwin focused on embryos and their usefulness for understanding evolutionary relationships. Ernst Haeckel brought the study of embryos to popular attention. And histologists and embryologists, especially in Germany and the United States, used rapidly improving microscopic techniques to observe far more than had been possible before. These observations, in the context of evolutionary interpretations, raised new questions and provoked new answers. The understanding of both epigenesis and preformation underwent transformation so that the debates brought new questions along with the traditional differences.

Darwin pointed to embryology as fundamental for interpreting historical relationships. In Chapter 13 of the Origin he asked “How, then, can we explain these several facts in embryology, namely the very general, but not universal difference in structure between the embryo and the adult; of parts in the same individual embryo, which ultimately become very unlike and serve for diverse purposes, being at this early period of growth alike; of embryos of different species within the same class, generally, but not universally, resembling each other; of the structure of the embryo not being closely related to its conditions of existence, except when the embryo becomes at any period of life active and has to provide for itself; of the embryo apparently having sometimes a higher organization than the mature animal, into which it is developed.” But we know that this was rhetorical question, and sure enough he concluded that “I believe that all these facts can be explained, as follows, on the view of descent with modification.” And that furthermore, “the leading facts in embryology, which are second in importance to none in natural history, are explained on the principle of slight modifications not appearing, in the many descendants from some one ancient progenitor, at a very period of the life of each, though perhaps caused at the earliest, and being inherited at a corresponding not early period. Embryology rises greatly in interest, when we thus look at the embryo as a picture, more or less obscured, of the common parent-form of each great class of animals” [Darwin 1858, chapter 13].

Haeckel saw “Ontogeny as the brief and rapid recapitulation of phylogeny” and saw each individual's development as following the sequence of, and indeed caused by, the evolutionary history of that individual organism's species. In his highly popular books that were widely translated and widely read, Haeckel offered pictures of comparative embryology. “See,” he seemed to suggest, “the human form emerges following the evolutionary development and adaptations of its ancestors.” Form comes from form of the ancestors, and unfolds following pre-scripted stages [Haeckel 1867].

Darwin was not an embryologist, and he did not contribute to our understanding of embryogenesis as such. Nor, really, did Haeckel. But while Darwin's use of the embryo in supporting evolutionary theory and in helping to interpret evolutionary relationships was consistent with various versions of either epigenetic or preformationist development, Haeckel's view was decidedly preformationist. Here, then, was a preformationist interpretation based not on additional embryological observations but on adherence to Haeckel's own metaphysical adherence to both his monistic materialism and to his desire to provide evidence for evolution. The Haeckelian approach reflected the context in which those studying cells and embryos worked at the end of the 19th century.

5. Late 19th Century Debates: Weismann and Hertwig

In 1899, American biologist William Morton Wheeler suggested that there are just two different kinds of thinkers. Some see change and process, while others see stability. Heraclitus, Aristotle, physiology, and epigenesis characterize one way of looking at the world, while Parmenides, Plato, morphology, and preformationism characterizes another. These are, Wheeler felt, stable and persistent classes, with just the nature and details of their differences have changed over time. Yet by the end of the 19th century, he argued, neither a strict preformationist nor a strict epigeneticist who ignored new evidence and new reasoning should prevail. Rather he called for a middle ground, for: “The pronounced ‘epigenecist’ of to-day who postulates little or no pre-determination in the germ must gird himself to perform Herculean labors in explaining how the complex heterogeneity of the adult organism can arise from chemical enzymes, while the pronounced ‘preformationist’ of to-day is bound to elucidate the elaborate morphological structure which he insists must be present in the germ.” Furthermore, it is not to philosophy but science that we must look to resolve the relative contributions of each, for “Both tendencies will find their correctives in investigation” [Wheeler 1899, p. 284].

Wheeler was stimulated by recent late 19th century debates, themselves provoked by a flood of new discoveries. August Weismann and Oscar Hertwig provided particularly strong and contrasting positions. Weismann had begun from an epigenetic viewpoint and initially rejected the idea that individual form emerges through the unfolding, or evolution, of pre-existent form in the inherited germ. But by the time his Das Keimplasm appeared in 1892 (translated into English in 1893), Weismann had changed his mind. As Weismann wrote:

My doubts as to the validity of Darwin's theory were for a long time not confined to this point alone: the assumption of the existence of preformed constituents of all parts of the body seemed to me far too easy a solution of the difficult, besides entailing an impossibility in the shape of an absolutely inconceivable aggregation of primary constituents. I therefore endeavoured to see if it were not possible to imagine that the germ-plasm, though of complex structure, was not composed of such an immense number of particles, and that its further complication arose subsequently in the course of development. In other words, what I sought was a substance from which the whole organism might arise by epigenesis, and not by evolution. After repeated attempts in which I more than once imagined myself successful, but all of which broke down when further tested by facts. I finally became convinced that an epigenetic development is an impossibility. Moreover, I found an actual proof of the reality of evolution, which … is so simple that I can scarcely understand how it was possible that it should have escaped my notice so long. [Weismann 1893, pp. xiii-xiv]

His “proof” provided an account of how, within the context of cell theory and given that the entire body begins in one fertilized cell, all the diverse body parts can become so diversely differentiated. The key is in the special material of the germ cells, Weismann decided. Within these cells lies all the determinants necessary to direct development. Inheritance, that is, causes development and differentiation.

Weismann's theory postulated the existence of several levels of hypothetical units. By the 1890s, it was agreed that individuals begin as cells, those cells contain nuclei, and that nuclei contain chromosomes. The chromosomes are the material of heredity, Weismann postulated, and they consist of a string of determinants, correlated with characters in the organism. Each determinant consisted of a number of material particles called biophores, inherited from both parents. These biophores compete with each other and some prevail, which then determines the character of the determinant, which in turn determines the character of the organism. During each cell division, the original whole chromosomal material is divided up, so that the effect is like a mosaic. Each cell becomes the right type just because of the action of the determinants distributed to it. As Weismann put it, “Ontogeny, or the development of the individual, depends therefore on a series of gradual qualitative changes in the nuclear substance of the egg-cell.” Cells are self-differentiating “that is to say, the fate of the cells is determined by forces situated within them, and not by external influences” [Weismann 1893, pp. 32, 134]. Conditions external to the cell itself cannot guide development, but rather the causes lie within. And cell differentiations that make up complex organisms are predetermined.

Oscar Hertwig disagreed. He felt that Weismann made too many assumptions and that he actually provided no real explanation of development and differentiation at all. In his work of 1894, Präformation oder Epigenese, Hertwig complained that Weismann's theory:

merely transfers to an invisible region the solution of a problem that we are trying to solve, at least partially, by investigation of visible characters; and in the invisible region it is impossible to apply the methods of science. So, by its very nature, it is barren to investigation, as there is no means by which investigation may be put to the proof. In this respect it is like its predecessor, the theory of preformation of the eighteenth century. [Hertwig 1900, p. 140]

In contrast to Weismann's preformationism, Hertwig pointed to the interactions of cells and to the differences among cells for the source of differentiation. The complexity is not built in from the beginning, but emerges over time, dynamically, and interactively. A cytologist himself, Hertwig saw the intricate structures already part of the unfertilized egg, and the changes that occur with fertilization. The egg is not a completely unstructured blob, but rather a complex of different materials that can respond to influences both within the egg and from the external environment. Cells behave like small organisms, and it is the interactions of these separate organisms that makes the whole. As Hertwig put it: “I shall explain the gradual, progressive organization of the whole organism as due to the influences upon each other of these numerous elementary organisms in each stage of the development. I cannot regard the development of any creature as a mosaic work. I hold that all the parts develop in connection with each other, the development of each part always being dependent upon the development of the whole.” Furthermore, “during the course of development, there are forces external to the cells that bid them assume the individual characters appropriate to their individual relations to the whole; the determining forces are not within the cells, as the doctrine of determinants supposed” [Hertwig 1900, pp. 105-106, 138].

Hertwig and Weismann continued to argue both about the metaphysical nature of the organism as well as about the epistemological demands for gaining knowledge about it, as did others, with no generally accepted way to resolve the issues. Given the information at hand, it seemed that Wheeler was right. There were just two different types of people, drawing on two different sets of values and emphases. Both relied on assumptions, and only more evidence could help move the discussion forward.

6. Late 19th Century Debates: Roux and Driesch

Wilhelm Roux adopted much the same approach as Weismann's and so, at first, did Hans Driesch. Yet their experiments ultimately led to new approaches and revised interpretations of what was at issue with epigenesist and preformationist accounts of development. In 1888, Roux published results of his experiments on frog eggs. Working on the assumption of a mosaic type preformationism, Roux was persuaded that starting from the very first cell division, each cell would be different because it was already predetermined to be different.

Roux proposed an experiment, a simple and elegant experiment on the face of it. He proposed to take a developing frog egg, after the first cell division, and to separate the two cells. Finding it impossible to separate the two cells, however, he simply killed one by inserting a hot needle. That cell just hung there like a blob of material and no longer differentiated. The other half organism, or single cell proceeded to develop, in Roux's interpretation, as it normally would have developed [Roux 1888]. The half became a half, just as it should if it were already preformed or predetermined as to its fate in the organism. Roux had, it seemed, confirmed the mosaic hypothesis.

A few years later, Driesch was working at Naples and had access to sea urchin eggs. Fortunately, because of Oscar and his brother Richard Hertwig's study of these eggs, Driesch knew that if he shook the two cells they would separate completely. Driesch reported agreeing with Roux and intending to confirm Roux's results. But since the sea urchin eggs could actually be separated, he felt that his results would be even more convincing. Imagine his surprise when he looked the next morning after separating the eggs and found not two half embryos but two smaller sized urchin larvae. As he noted, “I must confess that the idea of a free-swimming hemisphere or a half gastrula open lengthwise seemed rather extraordinary. I thought the formations would probably die.” Not so. “Instead, the next morning I found in their respective dishes typical, actively swimming blastulae of half size” [Driesch 1892]. In later experiments they developed even further, into apparently perfectly normal pluteus larvae, and even the four cell stage could do the same.

Driesch concluded with an epigenetic account, but an epigenesis relying strictly on materialistic factors (at least that was his initial response; Driesch did turn later to a version of vitalism). The early embryo retains its totipotency, he concluded. The fertilized egg clearly has the capacity to become a whole organism and so, apparently, do the cells after the early cell divisions. Not a mosaic of cells already predetermined by their inherited determinants in the nucleus, the early embryonic stages are instead a population of separate totipotent organisms, each capable of becoming a whole. It is only the interactions among them under normal conditions that lead to a complex, organized, integrated differentiated organism.

It might seem that Roux would have to acknowledge the superiority of Driesch's approach, since he had actually separated the cells. But no. Instead Roux countered with an additional hypothesis. The nucleus retains the capacity to adapt, especially in simpler organisms. They need the capacity to regenerate when injured, and therefore the mosaic determination simply has not occurred yet. Each cell retains a “reserve idioplasm,” he argued, and this provides the necessary backup determination needed to form a whole organism [see Churchill 1966, 1973].

It seems that Wheeler was right. Roux, Weismann, and others had decided that development must be guided by predetermined mosaic differences. Preformation, stability, and predictability stood on one side, with epigenesis, dynamic process, and change on the other. And, as Wheeler noted, by 1899 the way forward lay between the extremes of strict preformation or epigenesis. Wheeler's dissertation director Charles Otis Whitman agreed. Whitman felt that what biology needed was a clear statement of the alternative views, and then movement to a new standpoint examining how much depends on the organism's developmental response to external conditions drawing on preformation, rather than on programmed internal unfolding alone.

Whitman, Edmund Beecher Wilson, and others at the Marine Biological Laboratory in Woods Hole, Massachusetts, dedicated considerable energy to discovering the nature of each cell and its internal organization and relationships, in an attempt to discover the relative contributions of preformation and epigenetic development to a materialistic explanation of development. By the early 20th century, they had moved toward an understanding that included a fertilized egg that was to some extent preorganized and differentiated, including in the nuclear chromosomes, and also a capacity of the individual organism to respond to changes in its environment or to self-regulate. This was an epigenetic view that allowed some minimal predeterminism.

7. 20th Century Genetics: A New Predeterminism

The epigenetic embryologists emphasized the individual's development, but an alternative new form of preformationism soon arose in the form of genetics. This pointed to the nuclear chromosomes as the locus for the causes of differentiation. Yet unlike Weismann and Roux, the new geneticists saw the genetic material not as divided up into a mosaic as an explanation of difference. Rather, the inherited nuclear material was the same in every cell, but it acted differently according to an internal program. The interpretation appealed to some for metaphysical reasons, since it focused on the material units of heredity and apparently of causation. Epistemologically, it was more difficult to point to the evidence that inherited genes explain development.

This is not the place for a history of genetics, which has been offered many times elsewhere. The important point here is that genetics brought a new form of preformationism. Instead of a dynamically acting organism taking its cues from the environmental conditions and from the way that cells interact with each cell division, the 20th century brought a dominant and popular view that has often emphasized genes as programmed to carry the information of heredity, which was also the information necessary to construct an individual. Of course, there have been calls for alternatives or interactionist models where heredity and development, epigenesist and preformation, work together, but these have often been offered as alternatives than as central interpretations. [See, for example, Oyama 2000; Robert 2004.]

In the beginning of the 20th century, at first Thomas Hunt Morgan resisted the Mendelian-chromosome theory of inheritance that saw inherited units of heredity carried on chromosomes as determinants of developed characters. If all the cells contain the same chromosomes, then how can their inheritance explain anything, he asked. Instead, he insisted that “We have two factors determining characters: heredity and the modification during development” [Morgan 1910a, p. 477]. Morgan wrote to a friend that “my field is experimental embryology”and not the genetics with which he became associated [Morgan 1908]. Like his Woods Hole colleagues, Morgan did not see how inherited chromosomes could explain development of form from non-form. He had rejected Weismann's interpretations, and continued to reject the idea of inherited determinants.

Also in 1910, however, he was studying many different kinds of organisms in pursuit of explanations of heredity as well as differentiation. A white eyed male Drosophila fly famously caught his attention, and led him to the conclusion that some inherited factors must, indeed, cause expression in the emerging organism [Morgan 1910b]. It is not that Morgan changed his mind about how to do science, but rather that the evidence carried him in new directions [Maienschein 1991].

The fertilized egg cell contains a nucleus made up of chromosomes inherited from both parents. Along these chromosomes are lined up units of heredity that serve like Weismann's determinants and that were called genes. These genes correlate with some characters in the resulting organism, and therefore in some sense the resulting form was predetermined in the egg. Yet it was not already formed. And, indeed, the mere correlation of genes and characters tells us virtually nothing about how the differentiation occurs nor about how form becomes formed (or the problem of morphogenesis). Therefore, yes, genetics brings a sort of new preformation or more accurately predeterminism. But that in itself brings a description and a correlation but no explanation. Or so Morgan initially felt, as did his embryologist colleagues.

By mid 20th century, and especially after the discovery of DNA's structure (which apparently also explained its function), researchers began to forget or at least to ignore questions about morphogenesis and epigenesis. [See, for example, Olby 1974, Judson 1979.] How, actually, did genes give rise to differentiated form? Somehow that works, seemed to be the answer. Genetics predominated over what C.H. Waddington referred to as the epigenetics of development [Waddington 1942]. Of course not everyone ignored development, but it became a seriously neglected field and even professional societies and journals that had focused on “embryology” shifted to “developmental genetics” [Oppenheimer 1967]. When Robert Briggs and Thomas King cloned frogs in the 1950s and John Gurdon extended the research in the 1960s, it seemed that nuclear transfer could come from only early stages of development. Furthermore the resulting clones were like their donors from whom the nuclei came rather than like the mothers from whom the eggs came [Briggs and King 1952, Gurdon and Colman 1999, McLaren 2000]. Apparently development brings differentiation that is unidirectional. Preformationist/ predeterminist thinking prevailed. Epigenetic development and regulatory response to environmental conditions seemed to have strict limits for those adopting the mid 20th century predeterminist emphasis.

8. 21st Century and a New Epigenesis

The end of the 20th century brought discoveries that have challenged the most the prevailing geneticism, and have also begun to replace the extreme forms of either preformationism or epigenesist with the sorts of interactionist models that were only offered as outlying alternatives in earlier decades. A modified form of epigenesis, in which the organism is seen as beginning from an inherited egg and sperm that do include genes, seems to be on the rise again. Ian Wilmut's team's success in cloning Dolly, reported in 1997, and Gearhart and Thomson's successes with developing human stem cell lines, both reported in 1998, challenged prevailing assumptions [Wilmut 2000, Thomson 1998, Shamblott et al. 1998, Gearhart 1998]. Both suggested that development is a good deal more flexible, plastic, and interactive than preformationist interpretations allow.

Stem cell research is exciting precisely because the fate of cells turns out to be not determined by the genes. At the early stages of development when embryonic stem cells are most plentiful, in the blastocyst stage just before implantation, the stem cells can be harvested and cultured to become a large number of different kinds of cells. In theory, they have the capacity to become any kind of differentiated cell, but it is impossible to prove that conclusively. Normally, each cell does become one kind of cell rather than all kinds. Position in the organism and with respect to other cells seems to be decisive in directing differentiation. Yes, genetics provides information about the range of possibilities. But clearly, regulation of the genetic expression involves interpretation. And this is epigenetic. It seems that those were right who called for a middle ground, with some predetermination that interacts with some form of epigenetic development. Perhaps it is as Thomas Hunt Morgan suggested, “a process of pure epigenetic development, as generally understood nowadays, may also be predetermined in the egg” [Morgan 1901, p. 968]. The nowadays of the 21st century may take us back to some of the understanding and insights of the early 20th, a time when a balance of epigenesis and preformation seemed likely, a time for a bit of predeterminism and a bit of cellular free will.


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