Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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The Biological Notion of Self and Non-self

First published Tue May 21, 2002; substantive revision Tue May 19, 2009

Fundamental to biology are (1) defining the characteristics of identity, which distinguish individual organisms from those of similar kind, and (2) describing the mechanisms that defend organisms from their predators. Immunology is the science devoted to these problems. A progeny of late 19th-century pathology and microbiology, and the clinical discipline of infectious diseases, immunology did not attain a formal theoretical construction until after World War II, when “the self” was introduced to provide a ready and convenient metaphor for deciphering immune reactivity. In the original formulation, normally, host constituents are ignored by the immune system, while “the other” — pathogens, foreign substances, altered host elements—are processed and destroyed. By the late 1970s, “the self” became the foundation of immune theorizing, and immunology dubbed itself the science of “self/non-self discrimination.” But this dominant model has recently been challenged, for the self is polymorphous and ill-defined. Contemporary transplantation biology and autoimmunity have demonstrated phenomena that fail to allow strict adherence to such a dichotomy of self/non-self, and as new models are emerging, “the self” has been left exposed as a metaphor, whose grounding — philosophically and scientifically — is unsteady and thus increasingly elusive as the putative nexus of immunology's doctrines.

1. Introduction

At an important nexus of pathology, clinical medicine, and basic biology, immunology has served several research agendas and thus defies a single, unifying experimental framework. Rather it is (and has been) characterized by multiple, even competing thought-styles (Crist and Tauber 1997), each requiring a different methodological apparatus to order its experimental program. But underlying each branch of immunology, the concept of an identified and protected “self,” a theoretical construction and fecund metaphor, has served as the central theme which integrates this diverse discipline. Indeed, the fate of “the self” in immunology offers a historical understanding of how the science has evolved.

Immunology during the first half of the twentieth century was preoccupied with the more focused chemical questions of immune specificity, and the broader biological questions concerning immune identity remained unformulated. But after World War II, transplantation and autoimmunity became increasingly relevant both to basic immunologists and clinicians. These later concerns required a theoretical apparatus that explicitly addressed the question of biological identity and individuality. It was at this juncture that Sir Frank Macfarlane Burnet introduced the “self” into the immunological lexicon (Burnet and Fenner 1949), and upon that metaphor erected a theory of immunological tolerance that still dominates the field.

“Tolerance” refers to the immune system's “silence” when faced with potential targets of destruction, thus allowing host constituents and some foreign elements an adopted co-equal status within the organism. Tolerance and autoimmunity are two sides of the proverbial coin: In one instance, the immune system is seen to ignore the host, and even foreign components, while in the other modality, the immune system attacks what is regarded by the outside observer as “self.” These findings challenged the notion of a “one-directional” schema of immune reactivity, for tolerance was shown to be more than a passive silence of immune function, but required a more complex balance of responses. By the 1990s, immunologists increasingly appreciated that an immune self, representing a fortress from which attacking lymphocytes might sally forth to destroy invaders, offered a naive depiction of what was, in fact, a dynamic equilibrium in which “attacked” and “tolerated” were not easily predicated.

The simple model of immunity as committed to discerning those mechanisms by which the “self” discriminates host elements from the foreign requires revision. No longer is the identity of the host organism given or assumed, and, indeed, immune selfhood embraces diverse definitions: (1) “organismal self”—the epistemological functional category immunologists typically employ; (2) the “immunological self”—an ontological construction which draws from molecular definitions and builds upon Burnet's theory of tolerance; and (3) the “immune self”—a metaphysical formulation of the system-as-a-whole (Ulvestad 2007, pp. 88 ff.). This last designation, elusive and ill-defined, serves as a powerful metaphor that attempts to capture the immune system's total activity (Tauber 1994, p. 295), and, as discussed below, which formulation should serve as the focus of the newly developed field of systems biology research remains contested. On my view, with new methods to characterize the immune system, neat boundaries of “self” and “other” are likely to be replaced by a spectrum of divisions based on a gradation of immune responses.

The designation “self” and the “other” ignores how neat divisions or boundaries were adopted, or at best, were drawn with a certainty that remained problematic. In fact, early discrepancies accompanying the full embrace of a self/non-self discriminatory mode to explain immune function remain vexing. So, while in Burnet's original formulation, the host organism, perceiving an invasion by microbial pathogens, mounts a defensive response, contemporary immunology has broadened this agenda to include surveillance of the body for malignant, effete, damaged, or dead host constituents (altered “normal” cells), as well as autoimmune processes directed against undamaged elements—some of which may be part of ordinary physiological economy, while others are pathological. The challenge of defining a basis for immune identity, within the coupled ambiguities of autoimmunity and tolerance, has consequently generated debate about selfhood as an organizing concept for the discipline.

So when immunology is summarily defined as the science of self/non-self discrimination, and Burnet's theory by which selfhood is currently understood, “with only slight modification…has passed from the status of theory to that of paradigm” (Golub and Green 1991, p. 15) and “no longer a theory but a fact” (Klein 1990, p. 335), a vast body of experimental data and explanation is ignored. Despite such dogma, the immune self, an implicit entity in the late 19th century (Tauber and Chernyak 1991; Mazumdar 1995), has became a topic of debate (Langman 2000), and offers a rich philosophical discourse, both in terms of its epistemological standing, as well as its metaphysical foundations (Tauber 1994; 1999).

This article will outline, in a historical analysis, the two principle theories governing immunology's research program — the theory of immune identity, and a more recent one that challenges the very notion of selfhood. (Critics of this reading [Cohn 1998a; 1998b; Howes 1998] have been answered elsewhere [Tauber 1998a;b; 1999; 2000]). In those theoretical constructions are reflected the prevailing attempts to define the concept of organism. Note, while the immune self is rooted historically in the problematics of biological individuality (Loeb 1945; Buss 1987), its philosophical attention is distinct from those concerns (Wilson 1999).

2. Historical Antecedents

The first medical use of the term “ immunity” (originally a legal designation conferring exemption and distinction) appears in 1775, when Van Sweiten, a Dutch physician, used “ immunitas” to describe the effects induced by an early attempt at variolization (Moulin 1991, p. 24). But the concept was not developed until the mid-19th century, when Claude Bernard set the theoretical stage for the autonomous organism (E. Cohen 2001). In contradistinction to an animal in humoral balance with a pervasive environment, Bernard postulated the primacy of the organism's essential independence. Physiology became the mode of inquiry for medical experimentation, one that instantiated a reductive strategy based on positivist principles. Later, biochemistry and genetics pursued this methodological and theoretical approach, thereby providing medicine with its modern experimental basis.

Bernard furnished biology with a new concept of the organism, one that would have wider ramifications than the establishment of a scientific method. Obviously, interchange with the environment was a necessary requirement for life, but Bernard emphasized how boundaries provided the crucial metabolic limits required for normal physiological function. With his concept of the milieu interieur, the body was envisioned as a demarcated, inter-dependent yet autonomous entity (“corporeal atomism” [E. Cohen 2001, p. 190]), thereby establishing the theoretical grounding that became the sine qua non for the development of the models for infectious diseases, genetics, neurosciences, and immunology in all of its various guises. He thus introduced a revolutionary approach to the study of the organism, and immunology became one of its defining sciences, indeed, immunity was alien to the older humoral view.

Given the inclusive and fluid metaphoric system underlying pre-modern medicine, to speak of “immunity” with respect to embodied states would not only be improper but nonsensical. If disease signified a relation among elemental qualities and humors that were materially constitutive of both the living organism and its life context, then “exemption from” on the model of juridico-political immunity would be a non sequitur at best. (E. Cohen 2001, p. 183)

By radically changing the inside/outside topology so that the organism's interior becomes the determining context of function, Bernard effectively isolated the organism from its environment, and joined a complex cultural movement of redefining the body more generally.

Bernard's notion of the body as independent of the environment complemented Malthusian economics, liberal political philosophy, and Comtian sociology. From these and other disparate sources, the autonomous body as a political, social, economic and medical entity was redefined in the 19th century (a subject explored in various dimensions by Foucault 1973 and Agamben 1998), and Bernard played a central role in providing a theoretical biological foundation for its critical use in various discourses. Notwithstanding that “independence” is a political term, and neither fairly represents the dialectical relationships of the organism and its environment (Levins and Lewontin 1985), nor the evolutionary peculiarities of individuality itself (Buss 1987), the formulation has served as the touchstone for various cultural constructions of identity. Indeed, culture critics have seized on immunology as paradigmatic for the modern notions of identity, where boundaries are contested and the body becomes the localized site of battle between self and other (Haraway 1989, Martin 1994). The warfare metaphors — “attack,” “defense,” “invaders” — so prevalent in immunology's lexicon, dramatically illustrate this construction, both in terms of the self/other dichotomy, as well as the privileged regard of individuality over community.

3. Origins of the Immune Self

Immunology's history is generally regarded as intimately tied to those discoveries leading to the elucidation of the bacterial etiology of infectious diseases, which draws together twin disciplines — microbiology, the study of the offenders, and immunology, the examination of host defense. Thus, in this pathological context, immunology began as the study of how a host animal reacts to pathogenic injury and defends itself against the deleterious effects from such microbial insult. This is the typical historical account of immunology as a clinical science, a tool of medicine, and as such it focused almost exclusively on the role of immunity as a defender of the infected. The paradigmatic host is the patient, an infected “self,” which is the critical element for the power of this view. The clinical orientation, which assumes a given entity — the self — is obviously a dominant organizing perspective, but another perspective turns this assumption into a question or a problem: Rather than the science that seeks to discern the basis of self/non-self discrimination, immunology may also be regarded as more fundamentally concerned with the establishment of organismal identity.

This latter point of view was offered by Elie Metchnikoff, who came to the nascent field of immunology from an unexpected theoretical and methodological perspective — an embryologist, who sought to discover genealogical relationships in the context of Darwinism (Tauber and Chernyak 1991; Gourko, Williamson, and Tauber 2000). Intrigued with the problem of how divergent cell lineages were integrated into a coherent, functioning organism, Metchnikoff was thus preoccupied with the problems of development as process, which he regarded as analogous to Darwinian inter-species struggle: Cell lineages were inherently in conflict to establish their own hegemony, but unlike nature writ large he hypothesized that a regulatory system was required to impose order, or what he called “harmony” on the disharmonious elements of the animal. He found such an agent in the phagocyte, which retained its ancient phylogenetic eating function, to devour effete, dead, or injured cells that violated the phagocyte's sense of organismal identity. When pathogenic microbes were discovered in the 1870s, Metchnikoff soon applied to the phagocyte the new role of defending the organism against invaders. Indeed, on this view, the phagocyte became an exemplar combatant of Darwinian struggle, now occurring within the organism.

In Metchnikoff's theory, immunity was a particular case of physiological inflammation, a normal process of animal economy. But there was a more subtle message: (1) immunity was an active process with the phagocyte's response seemingly mounted with a sense of independent arbitration, and (2) organismal identity was a problem bequeathed from a Darwinian perspective that placed all life in an evolutionary context. In short, Metchnikoff combined a Darwinian sensibility to a Bernardian conceptualization of autonomy.

Metchnikoff's overall representation constituted the phagocyte as an agent (Crist and Tauber 2001), an actor that is the cause of its own action — as a matter of endogenously generated and directed behaviors. The portrayal of the phagocyte as autonomous is largely derivative from the linked features of its capacity to sense its environment and move freely within it, and the various degrees of unpredictability and meaningfulness that characterize this behavior. The play of these features assemble an entity that is irreducibly the center of its own actions, one seen as analogous to the more complex organism with multiple functions: sensibility, locomotion, engulfment, ingestion, digestion, and excretion. Indeed, the phagocyte, as an agent, becomes a metaphorical “self,” a primordial microcosmic expression of what later immunologists would extend into an epistemology of biological identity. But while placing the identity function at the core of immunology's concerns, Metchnikoff failed to provide the necessary pre-conditions for those who would seek to demonstrate those reactions that conferred protection of such an entity. Much of the subsequent history of immunology may be traced to the attempts of establishing a definition of organismal identity and providing an experimental basis that would describe identity-making functions. These were scientific aspirations 19th-century biology could not fulfill.

4. Twentieth Century Constructions of the Immune Self

The first half of 20th-century immunology was devoted to establishing the chemical basis of immunity, leaving the parameters of selfhood tacit and assumed (Silverstein 1989). This chemical perspective dominated immunology until shortly after World War II, when transplantation and autoimmunity became increasingly relevant both to basic immunologists and clinicians. It was at this juncture that Sir Frank Macfarlane Burnet formally introduced the “self” into the immunological lexicon, and upon that metaphor erected a theory of immunological tolerance that was to henceforth dominate the field (Burnet and Fenner 1949; Tauber 1994). From this perspective, the foreign is destroyed by immune cells and their products, whereas the normal constituents of the animal are ignored (“tolerated”). In other words, the host organism was a given identity within the Bernardian construct, one with implicit boundaries as defined by immune reactivity. What was “attacked” was “other;” that which was regarded by immune silence became “the self.”

Immunologists have been preoccupied with lymphocyte biology, whose so-called mechanisms of “acquired immunity” are characterized by the ability to (1) mount an increasingly robust immune reaction once appropriate lymphocytes “learn” of pathogen insult, and (2) “remember” such insult so that upon repeated invasion, the lymphocyte-antibody response is both quickened and augmented. This was the immunology that intrigued Burnet, who was intent on explaining how immune reactivity develops in three stages — recognition, amplification, and memory — and more fundamentally, how self and non-self were discerned by this system. He invoked “tolerance” to explain how auto-destructive immune reactivity was controlled, or more specifically, he proposed a hypothesis that might explain how the immune system ignores host constituents. He thereby provided immunology with a theory of the self: Tolerance, the negative image of the self (or that which is absent in the space of immune recognition), became the central motif of understanding immune reactivity.

Unlike Metchnikoff, Burnet sought a firm definition of the immune self. Burnet's theory proposed that the animal, during prenatal development, exercised a purging function of self-reactive lymphocytes (the cells responsible for synthesizing reactive antibodies and mediating so-called cellular reactions) so that all antigens (substances that initiate immune responses) encountered during this period would attain a neutrality status. Thus lymphocytes with reactivity against host constituents are putatively destroyed during development, and only those “tolerant” lymphocytes that are non-reactive are left to engage the antigens of the foreign universe. Accordingly, potentially deleterious substances would select lymphocytes with high affinity for them, and through clonal amplification a population of lymphocytes differentiates and expands to combat the offending agents. The hypothesis (first presented in 1949 and later developed into the “clonal selection theory” (CST [Burnet 1959]) contained two key challenges which dominated contemporary immunology: (1) How was tolerance induced and auto-immunity controlled? and (2) What was the mechanism that accounted for antibody and lymphocyte diversity? The latter issue was solved by molecular biologists by the mid-1980s (Podolsky and Tauber 1997); the former question, involving systems analysis, apparently requires a comprehensive model of the immune system as a whole and while theories of immune tolerance abound, the issue remains unresolved. (See below)

Aside from incomplete accounts of tolerance, there were early discrepancies arising from a continuum of auto-immune reactions, ranging from normal physiological and inflammatory processes to uncontrolled disease initiated by an immune reaction gone awry.

During this century, the evolution of concepts on autoimmunity could be summarized by “never, sometimes, always.” Thus from the early “horror autotoxicus” [Ehrlich] to the 1960s, immune autoreactivity was simply not considered…. With the first identification of autoreactive antibodies in patients and the subsequent conceptual association with autoaggressive immune behaviors, the “sometimes” phase was entered, necessarily equated with disease. By this time, immunology had laid its foundation on the clonal selection theory, which forbids autoreactive clones in normal individuals. Immunologists thereafter devoted 30 years discovering ways by which autoreactive lymphocyte clones can be deleted and why they fail to be deleted in autoimmune patients…. In the 1970s at least three sets of observations and ideas began to alter this course of events and to herald the “always” period. (Coutinho and Kazatchkine 1994, pp. 1–2)

Bountiful evidence in recent years has shown that autoimmunity is also a normal, active process, and in these newer views, such functions are regarded as integrated within a more complex normal physiology (Schwartz and Cohen 2000; Horn et al. 2001; Coutinho 2005; see section 5). Thus, immune reactivity, rather than functioning only in an “other-directed” mode is in fact bidirectional. This position contrasts with the “one-way” definition of selfhood, where there is a genetic self, whose constitutive agents see the foreign, and immune reactivity arises from this polarization with attack directed only against non-self (Tauber 1998a; 1998b). Not unexpectedly, in this turn inwards, the immune self becomes increasingly difficult to define, unable to accommodate these new appraisals easily. There are at least half a dozen different conceptions of what constitutes the immune self (Matzinger 1994, p.993): (1) everything encoded by the genome; (2) everything under the skin including/excluding immune “privileged” sites; 3) the set of peptides complexed with T-lymphocyte antigen-presenting complexes of which various sub-sets vie for inclusion; 4) cell surface and soluble molecules of B-lymphocytes; 5) a set of bodily proteins that exist above a certain concentration; 6) the immune network itself, variously conceived (detailed below). While these versions may be situated along a continuum between a severe genetic reductionism and complex organismal constructions (Tauber 1999), each shares an unsettled relationship to Burnet's original dichotomous model of self and other (Langman 2000).

5. The Autonomous Immune System

Well before the current debate about the immune self, Niels Jerne attempted to dispel the many ad hoc caveats and paradoxes encumbering it by deconstructing the self concept altogether. He went beyond the current notion of the immune network composed of lymphocyte subsets, secreting immuno-stimulatory and inhibitory substances (essentially a simple mechanical model with interlaced, first order feedback loops) to propose a novel conception of immune regulation (Jerne 1974). His network theory was, from its very inception, a complex amalgam of fitting the pieces of the regulation puzzle in place, with an overriding desire of understanding the immune system as a cognitive enterprise, one that spawned different formulations (e.g., Varela et al 1988; Atlan and Cohen 1989; Stewart 1994a). In introducing this metaphoric construction of the immune system as analogous to the nervous system as early as 1960, Jerne set the stage for understanding newer immune metaphors — recognition, memory, learning — which built on that parallel with human cognition.

For Jerne, instead of the “immune system” conceived as a composite of lymphocyte subsets, secreting immuno-stimulatory and inhibitory substances, he proposed a network forming a complex interwoven lattice (Jerne 1974). (In this context, “network” is now largely associated with Jerne's hypothesis, and “system” holds the more generic understanding of linked components working together in some functional sense.) Referring to each other, Jerne argued that antibodies comprised an immune system that self-regulated by inter-locking interactions. In this schema, antibody not only recognizes foreign antigen, it is also capable of recognizing self constituents as antigens (idiotopes). Accordingly, no essential difference exists between the “recognized” and the “recognizer,” since any given antibody might serve either, or both, functions. In other words, immune regulation in this theory is based on the reactivity of antibodies (and later lymphocytes) with their own repertoire to form a set of self-reactive, self-reflective, self-defining immune activities.

Strikingly, there is no explicit mechanism for self/non-self discrimination in Jerne's network hypothesis, and this apparent lacuna served as the nexus of critiques (reviewed in Podolsky and Tauber 1997; Tauber 1999; 2000; 2001). For Jerne, the need to define the “self” as distinct from the “other” receded from his primary theoretical concerns, and this posture was to have important repercussions. When the immune system is regarded as essentially self-reactive and interconnected, the “meaning” of immunogenicity, that is reactivity, must be sought within some larger framework. Antigenicity then is only a question of degree, where “self” evokes one kind of response, and the “foreign” another, based not on its intrinsic foreignness, but rather because the immune system sees that foreign antigen in the context of invasion or degeneracy. There is no foreignness per se, because if a substance is truly foreign, it would not be recognized, i.e., there would be no image by which the immune system might engage it. So in the Jernian network, “foreign” is defined as perturbation of the system above a certain threshold. Only as outside observers do we designate “self” and “non-self.” From the immune system's perspective, it only “knows” itself (Varela et al 1988). Accordingly, the immune system both disqualifies and abdicates any responsibility for discriminating “self” and “other.” Indeed, for Jerne, if one required a self, it was the immune system itself.

Jerne's theory initially promoted great excitement only to suffer the ignominy of almost universal neglect today, primarily because his hypothesis failed to satisfy the basic criterion of differentiating self from non-self. As Antonio Coutinho observed, the theory's failure was due to a misunderstanding of the network's character and how it should be studied:

Immunologists have preferred to use anti-idiotypes as surrogates of antigens, instead of exploring what the idea can contribute beyond clonal selection: systemic organization. Practically all of the thousands of papers published on idiotypes and “networks” address clonal immune responses and their regulation, precisely the part of our problems that clonal selection had already satisfactorily solved. In contrast, essential network properties — structure (connectivity) and dynamics, let alone metadynamics (Varela et al 1988) — have been given little or no attention. (Coutinho 1989, p. 64; emphasis in original)

Indeed, the relative importance of Jerne's network fell behind the dominant model of immune regulation proposed by Burnet's CST model, which built upon the fundamental distinction of self and non-self (Burnet and Fenner 1949; Burnet 1959; Tauber 1994; Podolsky and Tauber 1997). Yet, just as CST triumphed, a growing ambiguity of the self's status in immunology appeared as autoimmunity and tolerance became increasingly paradoxical problems.

As already noted, “tolerance” refers to the immune system's “silence” to potential targets of destruction, thus allowing host constituents and certain foreign elements a co-equal status within the organism. The vast majority of foreign encounters occur in the gut, where “oral tolerance” becomes the sine qua non of nutrition (Vaz et al 1997). In one instance, the immune system is seen to ignore the host, and even foreign substances, while in the other modality (autoimmune disease), the immune system attacks what is regarded by the outside observer as “self.” These findings challenged the notion of a “one-directional” schema of immune reactivity (Tauber 1998a; 1998b), for tolerance was shown to be more than a passive silence of immune function, but required a more complex balance of responses (Coutinho 2005). Another theoretical construction beckoned.

Joining Jerne's theoretical re-orientation, and arising from an entirely different set of clinical problems and observations, autoimmunity came to be recognized as a normal physiological function of immune reactivity. “Natural autoantibodies” were characterized and quantified in both normal and disease states (Avrameas 1991; Coutinho, Kazatchkine and Avrameas 1995) and found to serve a key role in normal immunological physiology (Huetz et al 1988). A case suggesting that central precepts of CST were vulnerable to alternative modeling then gained momentum (I. Cohen 1989; 1992; Coutinho 1995; Vaz et al 2006).

Irun Cohen proposed the “immune homunculus” as a model of how autoimmunity targets certain host constituents for surveillance and normal physiological processing, a construct that has vied with the dominant CST understanding of immune regulation (I. Cohen 1989; 1992; 2000). (In support of the homunculus hypothesis, a pattern of genetically programmed network of antibodies connected through their respective V-regions is evident in newborn animals, well before immune responses have been evoked to exogenous insult [Nobrega et al 1993].) Such monitoring of bodily functions (e.g., auto-digestion of senile cells and their debris) requires baseline immune reactions, which have recently been assessed by novel methodologies. In contrast to measurement of discrete immune-specific reactions, techniques were developed to assess global patterns of collective, low-titer antibody reactivities. Such system-wide antibody patterns have been assessed by research groups led by Cohen and Coutinho employing different methodologies: Western blot of auto-antibodies to undefined self-antigens in tissue extracts, by antibodies bound to identified antigens in microtiter ELISA plates, and most recently by microarray technology with embedded antigen chips that allow identifying antibody reactions to hundreds of identified antigens (Tauber 2009).

These new methods — employing large panels of antigens, automatic data processing, and the application of multi-parametric statistics — were devised in order to assess the system in its “active-resting” state (Coutinho 1995; I. Cohen 2000). Such studies reveal common antibody patterns in both normal and disease states, which represent on-going active “background” immune activities. These autonomous, self-referential activities of immunity (Coutinho et al 1984), have also been referred to as the “conservative physiology” of the immune system (Vaz et al 2006) or the body's “interlocutor” (Cohen 1992). Whatever this surveillance immune activity might be called, each proponent of its centrality seeks to discern the structure and function of the immune system as a whole. Note, instead of measuring elicited responses, each study seeks to capture dynamics of on-going (normal) “auto-immune” reactions, which possess “structural” features to specific host markers and thereby offer a “snap-shot” image of the immune system as a whole, in which antibody profiles depict immune reactivity over a wide array of antibody specificities.

This autoimmune sensing is an important part of the body's normal processing of senile cells, repair of damaged tissues, and immune destruction of malignancies. Such self-surveillance may well be the original function of the immune system, and so some have suggested that the primordial role of the immune system was to serve perceptive and communicative functions of the body's own physiology to establish and then maintain host identity (Stewart 1992; 1994b; Tauber 2003; Ramos, Vaz, and Saalfeld 2006). Given the striking correlations of shared receptors and mediators, intimate anatomic relationships, and ontogenetic origins, that earlier phylogenetic function might descend from a common neuro-endocrine communicative function (Rabin, 1999; Ader 2007). Accordingly, under pathogenic pressure, the immune system may have developed specialized capacities as a defensive system, which largely explains the evolutionary forces that have molded the immune system in higher vertebrates. However, if we are to understand the immune system's basic function (and ultimately its organization and regulation) this cognitive characteristic must be further elucidated.

How might the immune system be modeled given the two-phase character of immune responsiveness — to account for responses to invading pathogens and to explain on-going baseline physiological activity? Or put another way, how might a theory be devised to reconcile the respective claims of an autonomous (“autoimmune”) network and the pathogen-driven responsive (other-directed) CST? One approach devised by Coutinho, Francisco Varela, and colleagues (the so-called Paris School) employs a two-tier schema (described as “second generation immune networks”), in which a “central” and a “peripheral” immune system operate in parallel (Huetz et al 1988; Coutinho 1989; Varela and Coutinho 1991). Accordingly, two networks of lymphocytes co-exist with differing characteristics and functions: (1) The central network concerns itself with itself, recruiting auto-reactive lymphocytes and connected cells that are not deleted and serve as a host-monitoring system (Varela et al 1991), and (2) a set of (Burnetian) disconnected peripheral clones, purged of auto-reactive cells, stand ready for activation by foreign antigen. So, in this postulated parallel immune universe, two lymphocyte systems co-exist with distinct functions.

The Paris School formulation suffers from several major defects: (1) the “glue” that holds the systems together has not been effectively measured. Indeed, the key to understanding the regulatory principles governing each system resides in measuring the connectivity of the various elements, which has been recognized as a key theoretical and experimental challenge since Jerne's original proposal (Stewart and Varela 1989; Pereira et al 1989). (2) The parameters by which the central and peripheral systems interact have not been established, and, indeed, their origins and differentiating mechanisms have yet to be discerned. This issue relates to the more fundamental question as to how the immune system evolved, a question that remains enigmatic beyond some vague notions of “recognition” proteins forming a class that differentiated into various functional systems (nervous and immune). (3) The self-regulatory mechanisms, while obviously appreciated as critical for understanding the control of each system, have not been adequately elucidated. The major caveat to this assessment has been the growing appreciation of how regulatory (suppressor) T cells function (Jiang 2008), especially in the context of self-tolerance (Coutinho 2005). The first T cells to be positively selected and activated in the thymus are self-reactive CD4 T cells that thus become “regulatory.” This repertoire then is postulated to build the “central system” (Modigliani, Bandeira, and Coutinho 1996). Alternatively, Cohen dispenses with this parallel immune structure and posits nodal points that construct an immune image of the host, and these antibodies simply reside as “background” activity of the same system that mounts an external antigen-driven clonal response (I. Cohen 1989; 1992; 2000).

The organization of the immune system's architecture requires sustained theoretical and experimental investigations, and given the minority position of interest in the autonomous activity of the immune system it seems obvious that support for this orientation lags far behind the vast amount of data available to CST advocates. Nevertheless, the results of the well-established autonomous network research tradition seem self-evident: Overviews of multiple immune reactivities have provided a portrait of the immune system as a system. This is systems biology at work, which originated in a hypothetical network structure and matured into a fecund research program derived from methodological advances developed over the past three decades. The relevance of these experimental developments to the application of systems biology to immunology (discussed below) seems self-evident.

6. Expanding the Borders

Following the trope of an “immune dialogue,” where the immune system continuously exchanges molecular signals with its interlocutor, the body (I. Cohen 1992; 1994; 2000), a so-called “ecoimmunity” has been proposed, in which the immune system and host tissues are viewed as two sides of a continuously active and co-evolving predator-prey system (Nevo and Hauben 2007; Hauben et al 2007). Not to gainsay that approach, why not extend the immune dialogue beyond the host to include its environment (Ulvestad 2007; Tauber 2008a; 2008b)? On this view, although much remains to elucidate the inner workings of the immune system, another horizon also beckons: Conceiving the immune system as a system unto itself is a truncated formulation, for the functional autonomy (or “internal activity” [Coutinho 1991]) of immunity fails to recognize the full context in which the immune system functions. Such a fully contextualist sensibility builds from the dialectical interchange the immune system has within the host (however its boundaries are drawn) and with the external world (Levins and Lewontin 1985). This means, simply, that immune reactivity is determined by context (Cohen 1994; Podolsky and Tauber 1997; Grossman and Paul 2000; Cahalan and Gutman 2006 ), where agent and object play upon each other.

Powerful molecular support for this contextual (or in another sense, ecological) orientation has been gathered. Consider the dominant model concerning lymphocyte activation, where it is generally appreciated that specific recognition of antigen by a lymphocyte receptor is not sufficient for activation, and that additional signals determine whether a cellular response or cell inactivation follows (Germain 2001). Beyond the composition of the inflammatory soup in which activation occurs, the local environment (the “niche” in which the immunocyte lodges) also influences cell stimulation (Cahalan and Gutman 2006) . Accordingly, an antigen is neither self nor non-self except as it attains its physiological meaning within a broader construct. Orthodox immune theory encompasses this idea in the so-called “two-signal model,” which does not require any of Jerne's hypotheses to fulfill its agenda. But there are more radical readings of the contextualist setting by which antigens are sensed, and debate concerning what constitutes the milieu of meaning of antigenicity and ensuing reaction have spawned certain provocative, and potentially important models of immune regulation (reviewed in Podolsky and Tauber 1997; Tauber 2000).

No longer content with only defining the elements of the immune system and the local interactions of those components, we might well consider how the system is integrated within larger wholes and how adjustments are made in relation to these other systems. After all, immunity is an important parameter of overall adaptation both of the individual and the species-as-a-whole. Characterized by population dynamics, the competitive context is traditionally assessed by predator relations, cooperative behaviors, food sources, environmental effects, and so on. How microbe and host relationships maintain stability, and perhaps just as important, how equilibria are disrupted, provides a key measure by which individuals and species competition are defined in the medical, economic, and agricultural disciplines (Tauber 2008a; 2008b).

Because the immune system resides at the interface between the organism and its environment, it serves as a first line of defense, but more broadly as an information processor for the host organism. Cognitive functions are fundamentally open, and thus immune theory should describe how immune system design permits, and then responds to, open information flow as a primary function. So, if immunologists are to decipher the complexities of the immune system's organization, then immunity must be characterized with this open, more holistic consideration of immune regulation that includes environmental inputs, the processing of information, and the regulation arising from responses to this larger context.

Unavoidably, notions of selfhood will be adjusted as a result of attempts to define borders in these new contexts of study. After all, when the immune system is understood as a complex communicative-cognitive system (Vaz and Varela 1978; Varela et al 1988; Tauber 1997), its protective functions assume their full expression only when the total environment has been considered (Tauber 2008a; 2008b). Moreover, in terms of the organism per se, the internal ecology of the host itself is an ever-evolving identity, whose intercourse with the external environment requires dynamic and dialectical responses (e.g., Hooper and Gordon 2001). So when one refers to the greater ecology of the immune system — the larger context that includes both internal and external universes sensed and acted upon — the borders must remain open to allow free exchange between the host and its environment. On this understanding, the immune system is endowed with a high degree of communicative abilities for sensing both the environment (in the form of pathogens, allergens, toxins, etc.), but also, and just as importantly, allowing the free exchange of even a larger universe of substances and organisms to be engaged for the organism's benefit. In short, the immune system possesses cognitive functions, whose defensive properties are only part of the on-going negotiation of various interactions between the host and its environment (Ulvestad 2007). To remain restricted within an analysis that already assumes a defensive posture limits understanding how animals live in exchange with others. Accordingly, by describing that economy, immunology would assume a fundamental role among the ecological sciences.

This expanded ecological perspective seeks to account for how the individual organism not only lives at risk in a hostile environment, but also how it participates in a community of others that contribute to its welfare (Agrawal 2001; Hooper and Gordon 2001; Dale and Moran 2006). How the immune system regulates such interactions requires systemic analysis, which would account for the particular contexts in which the organism adjusts its immune attention. Those responses may be repulsive or tolerant — classified along a continuum of behaviors in the organism's adaptation to new challenges. Responses consequently are based not on intrinsic foreignness, but rather on how the immune system sees an “alien” or “domestic” antigen in the larger context of the body's economy.

In sum, to adequately address the larger dynamics that must account for the co-existence of interacting species, a comprehensive systems approach must assess the behaviors of the immune system — both of individuals and that of the population's collective immunity (discussed in section 7). Such a study presents the language of a dialogue between individual organisms and their environments in response to the challenges received from diverse encounters (Pulendran, Palucka, and Banchereau, 2001). Thus the “ecological orientation” commits immunologists to examine not only the internal systems of immunity as traditionally conceived, but also to address the conceptual challenge of defining the immune system in the context of its environment (Tauber 2008a; 2008b). This requires integrating the diverse vantage of (1) a cognitive system, one responsible for perceiving the environment, and, (2) enacting appropriate responses to that environment. By first regarding immunity as perception, regulation becomes a process arising from both internal equilibrium mechanics and stimulation from external sources. Given these general concerns, immunology already has the conceptual infrastructure to assume a fuller ecological consciousness — placing immune reactivity (its regulation) within an environment of inputs.

7. New Systematic Approaches

The cognitive metaphors describing immune functions suggest attention to the character of information upon which mind-like functions operate. For instance, how does latent information become active (i.e., meaningful or significant)? What is stored information and how is it processed in the context of new information? What are the respective currencies of such information? How is information distributed? etc. Certainly, Shannon-like definitions of information transfer are insufficient for such insight, and thus a more comprehensive understanding is required (ben Jacob, Shapira, and Tauber 2005). Considering the demands for a comprehensive formulation of information processing for virtually all of the biosciences, it seems likely that immunology might well serve as an important contributor to such research. By directly tapping into the general problem of information processing, immunology is joining an approach to systems analysis that heralds a shift in research interests and strategies with wide ramifications.

Perhaps the most direct initiative on biological information processing is currently pursued by those advocating “systems biology.” Systems biology (also referred to as multidisciplinary biology, postgenomic biology, comprehensive biology) captures the various attempts to supplement an older reductionist analysis of complex biological phenomena with an integrative strategy that would combine the various elements into a coherent, dynamic whole. Conceptually, the agenda is clear: This approach aims at a “system-level understanding of biological systems,” which includes the identification of a system's structure, behavior, control, and design (Kitano 2001, pp. 2–4). Presumably this includes establishing, for various biological systems — cellular (metabolic, genetic), physiological (e.g. immune, neuro-endocrine), and ecological — their large-scale organization, regulation, and integration with other systems. Each of these problems is grounded in information processing. Information has had deep metaphorical appeal since the beginnings of molecular biology (Kay 2000) as scientists refer to (genetic) codes, with letters (nucleotides) and words (genes) pregnant with meaning defined by the syntax of molecular biology. When brought to higher levels of organization, systems biology has been defined as the effort of placing the various levels of semantic elements into a syntax of organization (Aebersold 2005). (The metaphorical character of information and how the concept is used has been the comment of recent critiques by philosophers of science, e.g., Sarkar 1996; Jablonka 2002.)

The dominant systems strategy requires high-output, comprehensive data from simultaneous measurements of multiple features. For example, to obtain a complete understanding of gene regulatory networks, various simulations and analyses must be performed in order to assess binding constants; rates of transcription and translation; kinetics of chemical reactions, degradation, and diffusion; speed of active transport, and so on. Thus simultaneous studies at several different levels of cellular organization are required. Drawing strong analogies from engineering, admittedly a big assumption (Kitano 2001, p. 18; Hood 2002 in Other Internet Resources below), proponents argue that biological systems achieve robustness and stability through the same principles with which machines are built, namely using system controls (e.g. feedback), redundancy (e.g., gene duplication, alternative metabolic pathways), modular design (to minimize damage to local units), and structural stability. From such analyses, the argument goes, elucidation of what appears as emergent phenomena of complex systems will have a material basis (Kitano 2001; Hood 2002; Alm and Arkin 2003). Those seeking a New Biology might well herald systems biology as an antidote to “molecular biology's obsession with metaphysical reductionism” (Woese 2004, p. 179), and some immunologists seeking the elucidation of complex regulatory mechanisms have joined this new effort.

The first textbook devoted to immunological bioinformatics states that the “long-term goal of the research is to establish an in silico immune system” (Lund et al. 2005, ix). The strategy offered is a stepwise approach, where models of discrete immune phenomena (e.g., diseases, immune reactions, vaccines) or perhaps more modestly, function of various cell types, might be combined into larger models. This multi-disciplinary approach includes bioinformatics; genomics; proteomics; cellular, molecular, and clinical immunology modeling; and ultimately, mathematical descriptions and computer simulations to reframe the immune system in computational terms (Flower 2007; Flower and Timmis 2007; I. Cohen 2007).

The beginnings of this program have focused upon protein-protein and protein-peptide interactions (Lund et al. 2005). These are key to the recognition process and the overall functionality of the immune response, and thus proteome-wide knowledge of such interactions is essential. Due to novel high-throughput techniques, interaction data are quickly developing and the databases have already provided new initiatives for modeling and systems analysis. Once protein-protein interaction networks are better established, these may then be integrated with more sophisticated organizational models of cell-cell interactions and the cytokine network that regulates them. However, as the system is studied at finer and finer levels of resolution, predictability in the behavior of any particular unit of function (e.g., a gene, a cell) decreases (Germain 2001). How the ensemble maintains the dual requirements of sensitivity and global reliability despite variations and contextual difference of concentration, initial state, local behavior, and the number of components measured, remains a daunting challenge.

In this context, research is now directed at discerning how small initial signals are amplified to generate responses of sufficient magnitude to deal with reproducing pathogens; how discrimination between noise and useful information occurs; and how the regulatory mechanisms required to both diversify and prevent deleterious responses function. Quantitative modeling is thus based on an analysis at several levels — comparative genomics and proteomics, co-evolution with pathogens, tissue-specific processes, regulation networks, population dynamics and cell turnover kinetics.

Early studies of inter-cellular dynamics using simulation computer graphics have been used to produce and direct an animation of T lymphocytes and other cells moving, interacting, multiplying, differentiating or dying in the course of development in the thymus (Efroni, Harel, and Cohen 2003). The simulation allows analysis of individual cells and their component molecules as well as the ability to view thousands of cells interacting in the formation of the thymus. More than merely descriptive, the technique allows experimentation with the animated system in silico to reveal the emergence of unpredicted properties in T-cell development.

Despite these promising developments, detractors regard these putative novel pursuits as a simple continuation of old reductionist strategies by complementing the classical biology of cataloging parts and drawing connections. The reductionist argument is well known and still dominant (Schaffner 1993; Waters 1994; Sarkar 1998). Indeed, reductionists deny the claims of a deep conceptual re-orientation and maintain that the integration of different levels of information (from genes to physiological pathways) by current methods is unlikely to display the emergent properties of dynamic systems, and more, the strategies employed are not substantively different from what reductionists might suggest. So while the goals of analysis are hardly disputed, the promise of a fundamentally new conceptual construction remains contentious. Note, however, the cynics offer no viable alternative research strategy to fulfill their own holistic aspirations.

Acknowledging reasonable skepticism, the systems biology movement has, at the very least, reversed the fixation on reductive analysis, and, instead, has turned to the task of synthesizing vast amounts of data. By shifting research from defining elements to integrating them, concomitant with the technology to achieve these ends, biology is self-consciously moving towards realizing concepts already evident with Aristotle. Indeed, from De Anima to 20th century physiology, holism has held its position in biology, albeit subordinate to the reductionist strategy dominant for the past century. Now, with the multitudinous generation of data emerging from genetics and cell biology, biologists must seek new means of analyzing their findings. The field of bioinformatics was born to address this issue, and with it, systems biology. Whether the new methodologies herald a new biology remains to be determined. One need not pre-judge the effort. Success or failure awaits those engaged, and, in the meantime, an agnostic attitude seems judicious, for at the very least, the need to integrate organizational levels more satisfactorily beckons.

Jerne's intuition, bare of experimental evidence, has matured, perhaps metamorphosed, in directions he could hardly have imagined. But to what extent has the basic question he addressed been answered by these new developments? Will a more robust systems approach obviate the self/non-self configuration? The proponents of the Burnetian paradigm maintain that irrespective of the level of analysis, some over-arching construct must be operative, and the self/non-self motif will continue to guide immunological understanding. Those following in Jerne's tradition argue that the systems biology approach, because of its very character, will reveal how the immune system is functionally integrated within the organism as a whole, and that immune reactivity is controlled by this larger context. From this perspective, perturbation of the dynamics — dependent on diverse and multiple causes, coupled to complex controls — result in altered network activities. Self/non-self distinction would thereby recede as a useful construction, because the terms of regulation and organization assume a complexity that cannot be simply divided between self and other. Accordingly, the on/off switch has been changed to a rheostat. And so the debate persists.

8. The Immune Self, Theory or Metaphor?

If we look at the “big picture,” immunology is adjusting to the twin demands of increasing molecular elucidation, on the one hand, and an ecological sensibility, on the other. In both contexts, the “self” has slipped into an archaic formulation: From the molecularists' perspective, atomic delineations have outstripped explanations of immune regulation so that no molecular signature of selfhood suffices to explain the complex interactions of immunocytes, their regulatory products, and the targets of their actions. Reactivity has become the functional definition of immune identity. But when non-reactivity occurs, this may be because of active or implicit tolerance, which in turn is determined by many factors beyond Burnet's original formulation. Indeed, another metaphor, “danger,” has been introduced to account for the integration of the immune system into the body as a whole, so that immune reactivity is regarded as determined not by a police function arbitrating self and non-self, but rather as a response to repair damage and defend against further deleterious agents of any kind — microbial, chemical, mechanical, etc. (Matzinger 1994). The “danger” theorists maintain that activating second signals must arise from such non-specifying sources so that the self concept essentially deconstructs, while the defenders of immune selfhood argue that the immune system only requires a broadening of its scope to integrate such non-discriminatory signals into a more discriminating system. In either case, a new theoretical formulation seems required to either bypass the immune self or expand its notion beyond the original formulation.

When perceived as an attack on the centrality of self/non-self discrimination, much controversy has ensued (e.g., Langman 2000). While some detractors have generously called for a pluralistic approach (Vance 2000), and others have regarded the crisis over the self as overblown (e.g., Silverstein and Rose 2000), most would agree, at the very least, that immune selfhood is increasingly a polymorphous and ill-defined construct. Contemporary transplantation biology and autoimmunity studies have demonstrated phenomena that fail to allow faithful adherence to a strict dichotomy of self/non-self discrimination (Horn et al. 2001), and as new models are emerging, the immune self's grounding appears unsteady and thus increasingly elusive as the putative nexus of immunology's doctrines.

Accordingly, self/non-self discrimination recedes as a governing principle when immunity is appreciated as both outer-directed against the deleterious, and inner-directed in an on-going communicative system of internal homeostasis. From this dual perspective, immune function falls on a continuum of reactivity, where the character of the immune object is determined by the context in which it appears, not by its character as “foreign” per se. (For review of contending theories see Anderson and Matzinger 2000a; 2000b.)

These developments continue a trajectory of two major theoretical developments: Originally, Metchnikoff regarded immunology as effecting dual functions: first, establishing the organism's identity, and then protecting its integrity. His immunochemical contemporaries and their direct heirs followed the second agenda to the exclusion of the first. The primacy of the identity issue was re-introduced by Burnet, and his program defined immunology for the latter half of the 20th century. The second theoretical advance was made by Jerne, who moved past the identity issue altogether. No longer in service to a “self,” on his view the immune system functioned within a greater whole as a cognitive faculty, perceiving only what it might know — itself. Jerne thus introduced, perhaps ironically, a revision of the self metaphor, not its final elimination. For him, patterns, context, and interlocution become organizing principles, so that the immune self, assuming a Jernian perspective, is eclipsed by another catch-all metaphor, cognition. Note, cognition is a direct descendant of the self concept, which itself readily lends to the scientific dictionary a host of meanings borrowed from other human experience (Tauber 1994; 1997; 1999). Without pursuing the ramifications of the cognitive approach to immunity, it is still evident that this turn in the language — “perception,” “memory,” “learning” — are in service to a more elusive “knowing entity.” Indeed, hidden within new cognitive formulations, the self still resides. Its continued presence reflects a deep struggle over the character of biology, one that has its roots in Bernard's original understanding of autonomy, and now linked to our own more complex ecological views of agency and determinism.


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biology: notion of individual | biology: philosophy of | feminist (topics): perspectives on the self