Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Equality of Opportunity

First published Tue Oct 8, 2002

Equality of opportunity is a political ideal that is opposed to caste hierarchy but not to hierarchy per se. The background assumption is that a society contains a hierarchy of more and less desirable, superior and inferior positions. Or there may be several such hierarchies. In a caste society, the assignment of individuals to places in the social hierarchy is fixed by birth. The child acquires the social status of his or her parents at least if their union is socially sanctioned. Social mobility may be possible in a caste society, but the process whereby one is admitted to a different level of the hierarchy is open only to some individuals depending on their initial ascriptive social status. In contrast, when equality of opportunity prevails, the assignment of individuals to places in the social hierarchy is determined by some form of competitive process, and all members of society are eligible to compete on equal terms. Different conceptions of equality of opportunity construe this idea of competing on equal terms variously.

1. Formal Equality of Opportunity

Formal equality of opportunity requires that positions and posts that confer superior advantages should be open to all applicants.  Applications are assessed on their merits, and the applicant deemed most qualified according to appropriate criteria is offered the position. Alternatively, applicants are winnowed by fair competition, and the winner or winners get the superior advantages.

Formal equality of opportunity might obtain in a variety of social settings. As defined here, this ideal does not presuppose that the production and distribution of goods and services are organized through a market economy with private ownership. For example, an autocratic society, in which economic life is organized by the commands of the autocrat, could satisfy equality of opportunity to this extent: the post of autocrat is open to all applicants, and selection is determined by the fitness of applicants for autocratic performance as indicated by the comparative merits of their applications. Moreover, the autocrat might organize economic life and distribute economic rewards by fair competitions. A communist society, in which political, social, and economic privileges accrue to communist party members, might conceivably be run in such a way that communist party membership is determined by competitive examination. If the examination were set so that the person who earns a top score is the best qualified for the post of party membership, and that person is offered party membership, formal equality of opportunity would be satisfied.

The ideal of formal equality of opportunity is associated with the liberation of economic practices and institutions from guild privileges and restrictions and with the development of competitive market economies. The slogan "careers open to talents" expresses the aspiration to establish a world where government posts go to the most qualified and economic opportunities may be seized by anyone independently of whether or not one’s parents are of noble blood or cronies of the king. The ideal is opposed to nepotism, the distribution of what should be public offices to one’s relatives and friends just because they are near and dear to the distributor and quite independently of their fitness for the post.

A market economy conforms to formal equality of opportunity only if jobs offered by business firms are publicized in advance, so that anyone who might want to apply has a reasonable opportunity to do so. In this setting formal equality of opportunity also requires that applications from anyone are accepted, applications are judged on their merits, and the most qualified according to criteria that are relevant to job performance are offered positions. (A variant practice in which only current employees of a firm are eligible to apply to higher-level jobs is deemed to satisfy equal opportunity provided entry-level jobs in the firm are open to all applicants.)  In addition, equal opportunity in a market setting requires that the lending of money for investment purposes by banks should proceed by accepting applications from any interested party and deciding who should get loans according to the expected profit of lending to one rather than another of the various applicants. Equality of opportunity also requires that the access of economic firms to investment and operating capital by borrowing money through sales of bonds and through sales of shares in the ownership of the enterprise (stocks) should occur through processes that give all firms and economic agents the same opportunities for gain. More generally, equality of opportunity in the market setting requires that firms and individuals deal with one another impartially as opportunities for gain. When formal equality of opportunity is satisfied in a market setting, each participant regards all others as potential partners for interaction, and selects partners for a deal or a venture according to the extent to which interaction with those particular individuals promises to further one’s morally innocent economic goals. An alternative formulation would have it that when a market economy satisfies formal equality of opportunity, each market agent selects partners for interaction according to the extent to which interaction with those particular individuals would further one's legally permitted goals.

The ideal of formal equality of opportunity has limited scope. Its sphere of application is public life, not private life. Where to draw this line between public and private for this purpose is itself an unsettled and controversial issue. Certainly decisions about whom to invite to be a dinner guest, whom to regard as a potential date or marriage partner, whom to cultivate with a view to forming a personal friendship are not decisions that fall within the sphere of equality of opportunity. This is not to deny that such decisions can be made in a way that reflects wrongful prejudice. This surely happens, and is morally criticizable. But equality of opportunity is a norm that regulates a political and civil society, a common life in which all members participate, rather than every aspect of the conduct of individual lives.

The idea of equality of opportunity tends also to be limited in scope along another dimension. Its domains are political societies or nation-states taken one at a time. If all Austrian universities are open to all Austrian youth and all Chinese universities are open to all Chinese youth, it is not ordinarily thought to be objectionable if Austrian universities are not open to Chinese and Chinese universities are not open to the Austrians. Thus limited in scope, formal equality of opportunity would be compatible with far greater educational opportunity being available to Austrian than to Chinese youth. However, nothing prevents broadening the scope of application of equality of opportunity. For example, one might uphold the ideal of a global marketplace, in which all transactions conform to formal equality of opportunity applied world-wide.

It should be noted that formal equality of opportunity so understood puts moral constraints on market decisions. It violates equality of opportunity if investors decline to invest in a company just because its CEO is a black, or a woman, and they are prejudiced against blacks and women. If one operates a business and provides a product or service to the public for sale, formal equality of opportunity is violated if one refuses to sell to some class of potential customers on grounds that are whimsical (no sales to people with brown hair, or wearing black shoes) or prejudiced (no sales to people of some disfavored race, religion, or skin color). By the same token, to refuse to purchase a product on the ground that its manufacture employed the labor of women in skilled jobs violates formal equality of opportunity.

Suppose the owner of a small business hires her family members or friends instead of advertising job openings and picking among the applicants according to the merits of their applications. This might be deemed a private matter, and for this reason, not a violation of formal equality of opportunity. However, if this same small business, a restaurant, serves whites only and refuses to accept blacks, Hispanics, and others as customers, this decision might well be deemed to lie in the public sphere and to constitute a violation of formal equality of opportunity. A perhaps controversial case of a type of decision that might be thought to lie in the public or in the private sphere with respect to the application of equality of opportunity would be decisions of business-oriented social clubs that are traditionally exclusively male or white in their membership to continue to deny membership to nonwhites and nonmales who might seek admission. Since valuable business contacts are made at these private social clubs, and business deals are sometimes made on the premises, the exclusion of women and minorities from membership in them might be deemed wrongfully discriminatory and a violation of equality of opportunity.

Notice that selection among applicants for a job by a random procedure that gives all applicants an identical chance of getting the job actually violates formal equality of opportunity as here interpreted (on equal opportunity as a lottery procedure, see Rae 1981). At least, if there are relevant standards of merit that could be applied to the applicants and that would predict successful job performance, a lottery to select who gets the job would not qualify as selection according to merit. Only if all applicants are equally qualified or there is no feasible and cost-effective way to distinguish among the applicants according to their merit would a lottery satisfy the ideal of equality of opportunity.

1.1 Discrimination and Formal Equality of Opportunity

Although whimsical hiring violates formal equality of opportunity just as much as discrimination against some applicants done because the applicant is a member of a socially disfavored group, the latter is evidently a more serious violation of formal equality of opportunity. Whereas being the object of discrimination because one is a group that has been targeted for oppressive treatment in the past is likely to be a wound to one’s sense of dignity and self-respect, being the victim of whimsical or idiosyncratic hiring practices is less likely to inflict a significant psychic wound over and above the loss of the job itself. Also, since whimsical discrimination is idiosyncratic, it will not lead to cumulative harm by causing anyone to be the object of economic discrimination time after time (unless whimsical hiring were common and one were extremely unlucky). Also, in the context of a competitive market, there is the pressure of market competition that punishes whimsical economic decisions that lead to subpar economic performance, so one expects whimsy to be a marginal economic phenomenon.

Discrimination on the basis of group membership might under certain conditions be rational behavior on the part of economic agents and might lead to efficient outcomes. Market competition would not tend to drive out such discrimination. Consider stereotypes, rough generalizations about traits of groups. If a stereotype is "sufficiently" accurate, it can make sense to treat all group members the same for some purpose without investing resources in determining the actual traits possessed by individual group members. For example, if an employer seeking factory workers values steady attendance at work, and absenteeism is known to be somewhat higher among African-American youths than other youth, the employer might simply set aside all applications from African-American youth and choose workers among the remainder of the applicant pool. Discrimination that is cost-effective in this way and that does not involve any misuse of available information is sometimes called statistical discrimination. The results for people who become the objects of statistical discrimination can obviously be bad. But this does not mean that statistical discrimination violates formal equality of opportunity. Does it?

As so far specified, formal equality of opportunity requires that applicants be assessed by appropriate criteria relevant to performance on the post and that the most qualified candidate be offered the post. But it would be excessively demanding to require that no expense be spared to discover, so far as is possible, which candidate is really most qualified. If the general idea of formal equality of opportunity in a market setting is that all agents must be treated equally as potential means of gain, then those means of selecting candidates should be required that maximize the hiring firm's prospects for gain. Seen this way, statistical discrimination would not violate formal equality of opportunity.

In some societies, the law of equal opportunity forbids statistical discrimination when the basis of the discrimination is race or sex. The employer must base hiring and promotion decisions on facts about the individual applicants other than their being black or white, male or female, or the like (even if this is the most cost-effective way to proceed). The rationale for this legal policy might be to ensure that historically invidious forms of discrimination are not continued by prohibiting forms of discrimination that are superficially similar and reminiscent of past evils. Formal equality of opportunity as characterized in this entry would not rationalize this legal policy.

Discrimination against members of a group might be based on aversion to the group, which might exist quite independently of the actual characteristics of actual group members. For example, an employer might simply dislike Catholics or Jews or women, and be averse to hiring them, or to hiring them for other than unskilled low-paid jobs. One might suppose that if one has a taste for discrimination of this sort, one must incur costs if one acts on it (Becker). If one refuses to hire Catholics or Jews or women even when they are most qualified, the product one offers for sale will be more costly to produce as a result, and if the market for this product is competitive, one cannot raise the price at which one sells it but must accept lesser profit than one would have obtained had one’s hiring decisions been unprejudiced. On this basis one might speculate that competitive markets will tend to drive out such discrimination. However, if large numbers of people share a discriminatory social norm, one can see that the market will reward compliance with the norm and punish noncompliance, so there will in that case be no tendency for the market to squeeze out discriminatory behavior. For example, if consumers will not purchase widgets that are manufactured with the skilled labor of Catholics, Jews, or women, and if skilled Protestant male workers employed in the widget industry will not cooperate with Catholics, Jews, or women if they are hired as skilled co-workers, the widget manufacturer who simply wishes to maximize her profits will be led to comply with the social norm against the employment of the targeted groups in skilled jobs (Akerlof 1976 and 1980).

2. Substantive Equality of Opportunity

The problem with formal equality of opportunity is that it is merely formal. Imagine a society ruled by a hereditary warrior class (as in Williams 1962). Reformers bring about a change. From now on, membership in the warrior class will not be drawn exclusively from the wealthy stratum of the society. Warriors will instead be selected on the basis of a competitive examination in military prowess administered to any young adult member of society who seeks admission into this elite class. However, it turns out that only scions of the wealthy stratum pass the exam and become warriors. Everyone in society except the wealthy is poorly nourished, and being well nourished is a prerequisite for developing the military skills needed to succeed on the competitive examination. In this setting advocates for the nonwealthy strata of society might object that none but members of the traditional wealthy elite have a chance to satisfy the eligibility requirements for admission to the warrior class.

Even if all are eligible to apply for a superior position and applications are judged fairly on their merits, one might hold that genuine or substantive equality of opportunity requires that all have a genuine opportunity to become qualified. In the example just sketched, this would mean that all members of society have the opportunity to develop the needed military skills. One can imagine the society taking a variety of steps to provide opportunities to all. Nutrition supplements are made available to those whose diet is inadequate. Scholarships to military academies can be won by poor children. Warrior skills coaches are dispatched to every village. As more is done to provide opportunities that enable ambitious and talented youth from any social group to acquire proficiency at warrior skills, at some point the complaint that none but the wealthy have a chance to enter the warrior class begins to sound hollow. At some point it might be held that sufficient or good enough opportunities to become qualified have been provided to all. The idea would be that substantive equality of opportunity prevails with respect to some desirable position or ranked order of positions just in case all members of society are eligible to apply for the position, applications are fairly judged on their merits and the most meritorious are selected, and sufficient opportunity to develop the qualifications needed for successful application is available to all.

Further development of this proposal would give an account of what level of opportunity provision is "good enough."  Evidently the level would be set by balancing the costs and benefits of greater provision of opportunities versus the costs and benefits measured in terms of other values with which opportunity provision conflicts.  But wherever the "good enough" level of provision is set, it could be that members of society still have unequal opportunities to become qualified for formal equality of opportunity contests.  Scholarships are provided for some poor children, but wealthy parents can hire private fencing and jousting tutors. Some families own horses and can impart horse riding skills to their children, which gives them a competitive advantage over others. And so on.

Pursuing to the limit the idea of reducing the competitive advantages that favorable circumstances confer on some individuals, one arrives at the ideal that John Rawls has called "equality of fair opportunity" (Rawls 1999, section 12, and Rawls 2001, section 13). Equality of fair opportunity (EFO) is satisfied in a society just in case any individuals who have the same native talent and the same ambition will have the same prospects of success in competitions that determine who gets positions that generate superior benefits for their occupants. In other words, if Smith and Jones have the same native talent, and Smith is born of wealthy, educated parents of a socially favored ethnicity and Jones is born of poor, uneducated parents of a socially disfavored ethnicity, then if they develop the same ambition to become scientists or Wall Street lawyers, they will have the same prospects of becoming scientists or Wall Street lawyers if EFO prevails. (It should be noted that the specification of EFO just given departs from the specification in Rawls 2001. There Rawls defines EFO so it requires only that the socio-economic status into which one is born has no impact on one's competitive prospects. In the remainder of this entry, EFO refers to the broader ideal.)

EFO articulates the ideal of a classless society of a sort. If the mark of a class society is that positions in the social hierarchy are passed along from generation to generation, then the society that satisfies the EFO ideal is classless in so far as parents can pass along advantages to their children only by genetic inheritance and by socialization that instills ambition. (Notice that EFO so understood is violated if some individuals gain significant advantages by gift or inheritance. One could amend EFO so that it permits gift and inheritance, deemed private transactions, and imposes constraints only on public sphere competitions.) Otherwise the advantages that well-off parents can confer on their children by providing better education and socialization than others receive or by providing access to a social network of well-off individuals are entirely eliminated or offset in the EFO society. If wealthy parents provide high-quality day care and nursery school and private tutoring for their children, society arranges public education practices so that children of nonwealthy parents get the same or equivalent advantages. In the same spirit, if some parents, rich or poor, are more strongly motivated than others to help their children get ahead in life, these efforts are somehow exactly offset, so having the good luck to have especially concerned parents does not affect one's comparative life prospects. The end result is that one can try to give one’s own children a leg up in social competition, but whatever boost one provides will be met by a similar boost provided for other children whose native talent is the same as that of one’s own children.

EFO might be adopted in conjunction with formal equality of opportunity or by itself as a freestanding moral requirement. The difference between EFO alone and EFO paired with formal equality of opportunity emerges when one pictures a society that satisfies EFO but not formal equality of opportunity. A society might be composed equally of members of two hostile groups, who discriminate against each other at every opportunity. If the groups command the same amount of economic resources, it could happen that formal equality of opportunity is always violated, because in every context of interaction people favor members of their own group regardless of their qualifications. If men discriminate against women, and women against men, these effects might counterbalance so that EFO is still satisfied. The discussion of EFO to come interprets it as an inclusive doctrine containing formal equality of opportunity.

Equality of fair opportunity can seem an inspiring ideal or a nightmarish vision reminiscent of George Orwell’s 1984.  The ideal of a classless society that has shed all trace of caste hierarchy is inspiring to many. But any scheme to implement EFO would apparently require extensive meddling by government or some other agent of society in family life, and such meddling can appear nightmarish (Fishkin, 1983). The negative response to the prospect of implementation of EFO might not reflect rejection of the principle itself but merely a sense that this ideal should not be pursued wholeheartedly whatever the cost to other values. Equality of opportunity is typically advanced as a justice value, and the mark of justice norms is that they take priority over others. Even so, equality of opportunity might be one among several justice norms, and not the top-rated.

One might also question the assumption that the pursuit of EFO could not proceed to a significant extent without invasive interference in family life. For example, society could resolve to devote far greater resources to the education of children of poor and uneducated parents than to the education of other children. This would be done knowing that educated and wealthy parents will be inclined by affection for their children to give them special socialization and education advantages and that these will roughly counterbalance the special state expenditures on disadvantaged children. Policies of this sort could be pursued without sending out state inspectors to monitor the degree to which middle-class parents provide extra educational resources or informal props to self-efficacy and self-esteem that other children are not getting. Also, if the members of a society were committed to the ideal of EFO, they would not find reasonable and cost-effective measures to achieve it to be onerous. The issue becomes, how great a value is EFO, and to what extent does its pursuit warrant sacrifices in other values.

Although EFO carries the idea of offsetting the advantages of being well-born to its logical limit, it should be noted that by allowing differential ambition legitimately to affect individuals’ life chances, EFO may not go far enough toward defining an ideal of genuine equal opportunity. The simple elimination of ambition from the EFO formula would be implausible. Let us stipulate that two individuals are equally ambitious with respect to some goal when they desire it with equal fervor and are disposed to work equally hard to achieve it. If Sally desires to go to a selective college and works hard at her high school classes whereas equally talented Samantha does not have the same strong desire and avoids doing her high school classwork, no reasonable conception of substantive equality of opportunity is violated when Sally gains admission to an elite college and Samantha does not. The EFO ideal embodies a division of responsibility between individual and society, with ambition falling on the side of individual not social responsibility.

But other cases are different and call in question this division of responsibility. Suppose that EFO obtains in a society but overwhelmingly boys develop the ambition to pursue challenging and lucrative careers and girls overwhelmingly do not. The explanation is that boys and girls alike are subjected to a rigid form of socialization which instills ambition in boys and quashes it in girls. In this case one might say that even though EFO is not violated when Sam and Ben become lawyers and doctors and Sally and Samantha, equally talented as Ben and Sam but far less ambitious, become homemakers and check-out clerks in convenience stores, genuine substantive equality of opportunity has not yet been achieved. In the society with rigid sex-stereotyped socialization, Sally and Samantha have not had a fair opportunity to develop the ambition that Ben and Sam have developed because only the latter benefited from the good luck of receiving favorable socialization. One might modify EFO so that if two people have the same native talent, but one ends up with lesser prospects of success in competitions for positions of advantage because her ambition has been reduced by prejudicial or discriminatory socialization, then EFO is violated.

The idea of one person having the same native talent as another, invoked in the statement of EFO, is unclear. Consider a simple example. Suppose we could install just one of two educational programs in a two-person society consisting of Smith and Jones. One provides more intensive education, the other a more relaxed schooling. Under the intensive regime, Jones ends up with higher earnings prospects, and under the relaxed regime, Smith ends up with higher earnings prospects. Which to choose?  Equality of fair opportunity does not say. Or taken strictly, with the construal that the capacity to respond to schooling is a talent, EFO requires only that persons with identical dispositions to develop exactly the same skill level in any schooling and socialization regime qualify as having the same talent, and the proposal is silent about choices that would produce different results for different individuals with different talents in this strict sense. Since in practice we only discover what talents people have by subjecting them to one or another schooling regime, EFO, which had looked severely strict, now looks to be lax and undemanding. What must be added to EFO to respond to this difficulty is some sensible continuity requirement, so that if two individuals’ capacities to develop skills through schooling are "close," the developed skills they acquire (and ultimately their competitive success) should not be "too dissimilar."

2.1 Democratic Equality of Fair Opportunity

Equality of opportunity ideals apply to the process that selects political rulers and political decisions. Consider two conceptions of democratic equality. Formal democratic equality requires that all long-term residents of a political society be eligible to become citizens and that all citizens are eligible to vote and stand for office in free and fair elections that pick law-makers for the society. In addition, formal democratic equality requires that influential officials charged with executing the law should either be (1) elected in fair and free elections or (2) appointed by the law-makers or (3) appointed through some process that selects applicants according to their qualifications. As sketched, formal democratic equality could be satisfied in a society in which only wealthy individuals are in practice able to run for political office and only graduates of certain elite schools are able to have any influence at all on the policy decisions and laws enacted by the government. One might then espouse a substantive ideal of democratic equality, which would be satisfied in a formally democratic society just in case any individuals with the same political talent and the same ambition to influence public policy have the same prospect of influencing public policy choice (Rawls 1999 and 2001, Christiano 1996).

Substantive democratic equality is Rawlsian equality of fair opportunity in the sphere of politics. One can view recent political controversies regarding initiatives to limit the impact of lobbyists and wealthy political donors on the democratic political process through the lens of this ideal. A society might institute public funding of political campaigns and restrictions on private donations to political campaigns in order to make progress toward approximating the democratic equality ideal.

Implementing the substantive ideal of democratic equality might conflict with other justice norms (Estlund, 2000). Suppose that restrictions on campaign financing and lobbying by interest groups reduce the influence of the wealthy on political policy choices, so that democratic equality is more nearly fulfilled. It might be the case that the now prohibited extra contributions of the wealthy would have enhanced the quality of political deliberation and produced better informed and substantively more just political decisions and hence more just laws and public policies. If it was discovered that a trade-off of this sort exists, one might believe that the pursuit of substantive democratic equality should be curtailed and that an optimal balance among the conflicting justice values should be defined. Some might hold that the point of democratic politics is to produce just laws and policies and substantively just outcomes generally and that substantive democratic equality should have no weight against this fundamental aim and should be pursued just to the extent it is a means to substantive justice.

2.2 Other Conceptions of Substantive Equality of Opportunity

Equality of fair opportunity is a severe doctrine. Its requirements extend far beyond  the injunction to eschew public-sphere discrimination. How stringent the policy implications of EFO become depends on the relative priority assigned to this principle as against other fundamental moral requirements.

The question arises whether there is some plausible intermediate position that renders equality of opportunity more demanding than formal equality of opportunity but less demanding than EFO. One such intermediate position already described combines formal equality of opportunity with the additional requirement that society provide good enough opportunities for all its members to develop their native talents so as to become qualified for competitive positions. The idea here would be that there is some threshold level of opportunity to develop one’s native talents into skills to which all are entitled. The challenge for one attracted to this position would be to develop a theory of the "good enough."

Another possible intermediate position combines formal equality of opportunity with the requirement that present effects of past wrongful violations of formal equality of opportunity should be fully offset. According to this conception of equal opportunity, if Catholics suffered violations of formal equality of opportunity for many years in a nation in which Protestantism was the officially privileged state-established religion, and these wrongful violations reduced the wealth of Catholics and their descendants,  ceasing now to impose any further violations of formal equality of opportunity on Catholics does not establish a regime of genuine equality of opportunity, since some continue to benefit, others to suffer, from past wrongs. But once recompense is made for past wrongful discrimination, formal equality of opportunity suffices. An extension of this view would hold that the effects of all unjust policies and practices insofar as they affect people’s present opportunities to become qualified for competitions regulated by formal equality of opportunity should be undone (Buchanan 2000, chapter 3).

A third possible intermediate position combines formal equality of opportunity with the requirement that state action should treat all citizens equally and not confer arbitrary advantages on some along with arbitrary disadvantages on others. On this view, even the substantive aspect of equality of opportunity is a deontological requirement, a moral constraint on permissible action, not a specification of a goal that morally ought to be achieved. Call this position the deontological requirement interpretation of equality of opportunity. Unlike EFO, the deontological requirement does not hold that substantive equality of opportunity is violated if some parents provide better educational opportunities for their children than other parents. The deontological requirement does not specify that a society must establish a system of state-funded education. But if the state does operate schools or provides funds to defray the costs of some children’s education, the state violates the deontological requirement if its schools or disbursements of funds to parents earmarked for children do not operate in an evenhanded manner but instead arbitrarily confer advantages on some over others. Operating schools for Roman Catholics only or paying for the school tuition only of children who attend Roman Catholic schools would be clear cases of violation of the deontological interpretation. A perhaps more controversial example would be the operation by the state of public schools funded by general tax revenues that are formally open to all resident children but are physically accessible only to children who can walk normally or set at a level such that some severely retarded or otherwise cognitively impaired children can gain no benefit from the instruction that is provided. According to the deontological requirement of equal treatment, these policies would be violations of equality of opportunity if and only if they arbitrarily advantage some children and disadvantage others.

The equal treatment norm, strictly interpreted, is a significant constraint on policy choice. Suppose equal treatment is interpreted as requiring that a government service that is provided to some citizens shall be provided to all without discrimination against any group of citizens. Next imagine that the government proposes to provide health care coverage to all citizens and to ration coverage so as to maximize the number of quality-adjusted years of life (QUALYs) secured by health care. Any scheme of this sort will recommend discrimination against disabled citizens, in the sense that the scheme will tend to recommend provision of treatment to an otherwise able person afflicted with some illness while recommending against treatment of a disabled person afflicted with a comparable case of the same illness (this recommendation occurs whenever this course of action is QUALY-maximizing) (Brock, 2000). Virtually any distributive norm that recommends raising or lowering the level of benefits to be provided for individuals depending on a comparison of costs of provision to well-being gains achieved for the recipient will conflict with equal treatment interpreted as requiring no discrimination among citizens on such a basis.

A problematic but illuminating case is age discrimination (Daniels 1986, McKerlie 1989 and 1999, Temkin 1993, chapter 8). A society might establish a state policy that mandates transfers of resources from older to younger citizens, by using public funds to operate schools for the education of children. A society might also follow a health care policy that rations life-preserving care made available to the very old in order to reduce the extent to which expensive medical technology extends the lifespans of very old people with reduced quality of life. In the same spirit, the society might tilt health care policies toward saving the lives of very young people threatened with premature death. In short, the society enacts coercive state policies that favor the young over the old. Such a policy counts as denial of equal treatment if the units to be treated equally are persons (of any age) at a given time. The policy is arguably consistent with equal treatment if the units to be treated equally are individuals over their whole lives. At least, this would be so if all individuals lived through youth to the same old age. In the world in which everyone lived to old age, discrimination against the old would be unlike discrimination in favor of Catholics and against Protestants, or in favor of men and against women, or in favor of whites and against Hispanics. The exception to all these cases, discrimination against the old would be consistent with equal treatment of each individual over the course of her life. If the unrealistic assumption that all live to the same old age is dropped, then equal treatment with the units to be treated equally being individuals over the course of their lives would seem to forbid any expenditure at all on the health care of the old who have already received more than those who died at a young age.

The example of age discrimination either discredits the equal treatment norm or indicates that it cries out for further interpretation. Surely some denials of literal equal treatment do not violate any plausible equal opportunity norm. If the state provides health care coverage to all citizens, the sick will get treatment and the well will get no treatment, but this is not an invidious inequality. One might say all equally are eligible for health care if they need it. But in general, many seemingly morally acceptable state policies will have different effects on different groups of citizens. If a law is passed instituting policies to preserve the environment for future generations, some present citizens will benefit, and some, such as loggers who have been working on old-growth redwoods, will lose. One might interpret the equal treatment norm as requiring that in the aggregate over the long haul, coercive state policies should benefit roughly all citizens to an equal extent. (But why must benefits in the long run be equal for all?)  On this view, society acting through the state is not required to do anything to offset inequalities it has not caused (included in this set of inequalities are many that would be eliminated under a Rawlsian EFO policy). But if the state acts in a way that affects people’s life prospects, it should act in an evenhanded way that boosts everyone’s life prospects to roughly the same extent. Notice that the equal treatment norm would be unproblematically satisfied by a state that did nothing for its citizens. Also, if children of wealthy parents will receive excellent education whatever the state does and will have fine life prospects that can be boosted only by a little bit by state provision of education, then equal treatment would seem to require the state to provide only small amounts of state-provided or state-funded education with benefits spread so none get a significantly bigger boost than the children of the wealthy get from state aid. (But see Pogge 1989, pp. 44-46.)

2.3 Affirmative Action

The variety of conceptions of equality of opportunity suggests the complexity of the task of assessing what are called "affirmative action" programs in societies that are marred by a history of caste hierarchy and systematic discrimination that excludes some groups in the population from any significant access to the fruits of social cooperation.

Consider a stylized example. Suppose that in the U.S., whites have enjoyed superior social status, enforced by law and social custom, for decades, going back to times in which blacks were enslaved. Now whites on the average have greater wealth and education and blacks have less. Suppose that formal equality of opportunity is now proclaimed as the law of the land and embraced by popular morality. Still, most superior positions in society continue to go to whites. In this context a variety of measures might be adopted with the aim of increasing the effective opportunities enjoyed by blacks. Special educational resources might be channeled to them. For a time, to unsettle the status quo in which whites enjoy the lion’s share of social privileges, quotas might be imposed by law or social custom. The quota requires that special preference be given to blacks when employment decisions are made until blacks and whites share in the superior positions and posts of society in proportion to their numbers.

Affirmative action programs of this sort might be justified on the ground that in a world where discrimination persists, coercive imposition of quotas helps here and now to bring about greater fulfillment of formal equality of opportunity. The quota might exert an effect that roughly counter-balances the opposite effect of continuing unacknowledged discrimination. Alternatively, such programs might be justified by appealing to the moral desirability of achieving some substantive equality of opportunity ideal such as EFO. Affirmative action might be viewed as likely to increase the extent to which EFO is fulfilled in the long run. Here the idea presumably would be that the existence of quotas would unsettle expectations and lead to changes in socialization and belief formation. The factual claims on which these justifications rest might be disputed. But disputes might also pit one conception of equality of opportunity against another. Formal equality of opportunity might be regarded by some as a strict deontological requirement ("Don’t discriminate on the basis of race, sex, creed, or color!") which one should never violate even to seek to achieve some morally desirable goal--even the extent to which formal equality of opportunity is fulfilled over the long run in the society as a whole. To settle such disputes would require a definitive assessment of the conceptions of equality of opportunity and an authoritative determination of the weight that equality of opportunity on its various construals should have against other justice values.

3. The Scope of Equality of Opportunity

There is a dimension of equality of opportunity not yet mentioned. Imagine a warrior society in which only martial prowess and accomplishment confer status and reward. The society might perfectly conform both to formal and substantive equality of opportunity. Any adult member of society is encouraged to apply for any warrior post that becomes open and all applications are assessed fairly on their merits. The most qualified candidate is offered the post, if she turns down the offer, the second-most-qualified receives an offer, and so on. Moreover, educational arrangements bring it about that any two persons in the society with the same ambition and native abilities will have the same prospects of success in competition for warrior posts. Despite fulfilling formal and substantive equality of opportunity, the society just sketched is deficient from the standard of equality of opportunity. To see this, consider that no talents and accomplishments except those of warriors are encouraged, developed, and rewarded. Those who have the ability to be artists, farmers, singers, story-tellers, rock musicians, or anything else, are just out of luck. These people have a complaint that their abilities have no scope for expression.

The example suggests that equality of opportunity prevails in a society only when all worthy human capacities are encouraged, developed, and rewarded. The wider the range of worthy capacities and abilities that a society fosters, other things being equal, the greater the extent to which it achieves equality of opportunity. The more this condition is met in a society, the wider the scope it provides for equality of opportunity (see Schar 1967 and Galston 1986).

The wide-scope condition on an equality of opportunity ideal admits of stronger and weaker versions. On the strong version, all worthy human capacities must be equally encouraged, developed, and rewarded. On the weakest version, each of these worthy human capacities must be encouraged, developed, and rewarded to some extent. One could concoct requirements of intermediate strength. The strong version seems demanding to a bizarre extreme, and illustrates the point that an equality of opportunity ideal only seems uncontroversial when left vague and unspecified. An alternative view of scope requirements would hold that certain social processes that restrict the scope of opportunity are unacceptable, but no particular extent of scope is mandatory for a society.

4. The Level Playing Field Conception

The conceptions of equality of opportunity canvassed so far are intended to be components of a theory of justice, but not all of it or even the central core of it. The general idea is that on some unspecified basis, a social hierarchy with superior and inferior positions is justified. The question then arises, on what basis should individuals gain access to superior positions (and be relegated to inferior positions)?  Equality of opportunity is proposed as an answer or partial answer to that question. Equality of opportunity for access to superior positions might also be advanced as a condition that must be satisfied (among others) if the social hierarchy itself is to be morally acceptable.

Equality of opportunity of a sort has also been proposed as an answer to a quite different question. In this role equality of opportunity is conceived to be playing the central core role in a theory of distributive justice. The central question of distributive justice might be formulated in this way: Under what conditions is the distribution of liberties, opportunities, and goods that society makes available to persons just or morally fair?  The equality-of-opportunity distributive justice theorist answers that the distribution is just only if it satisfies the norm of equality of opportunity, which requires that unchosen inequalities should be eliminated and that inequalities that arise from the choices of individuals given equal initial conditions and a fair framework for interaction should not be eliminated or reduced. (This condition might be claimed to be sufficient for just distribution as well as necessary.) This conception of equal opportunity proposed as the central element of distributive justice has been called the level playing field ideal (hereafter: LPF) (Roemer 1995 and 1998, and for criticism, Anderson 1999, Pogge 2000, Buchanan et al 2000).  The idea is that justice requires levelling the playing field by rendering everyone’s opportunities equal in an appropriate sense, and then letting individual choices and their effects dictate further outcomes.

LPF equal opportunity theorists start by distinguishing unchosen circumstances and individual choices. The former are matters imposed on an individual in ways that she could not have influenced or controlled; these matters are just given. It makes no sense to hold the individual responsible for anything that falls in the category of circumstances. Prominent circumstances include the socialization and early environment provided by one’s parents or other guardians, one’s genetic makeup, and the features of the world in which one finds oneself prior to any opportunity for responsible choice. People face very unequal circumstances, but this inequality, due to unchosen good or bad luck, should be eliminated: People’s initial circumstances should be made equal. But once individuals make choices to lead their lives in one or another way starting from initial equality, justice does not demand further compensation if risks taken happen to turn out badly and in fact justice demands that further compensation should not occur. At least this is so if people are making choices under conditions of interaction that are fair and no sheer good or bad luck beyond anyone’s power to foresee or control intervenes. "Fair conditions for interaction" may be taken to be an environment in which individuals are free to make deals on mutually agreeable terms and contracts are enforced, individuals are prohibited from deliberately harming each other by physical assault, extortion, coercion, fraud, theft of property and the like. Also, individuals are either prevented from imposing the costs of their activities on others who do not consent to be so involved or they are required to pay appropriate compensation for harm done that is tortious in this way. Fair conditions of interaction also include an initial equality of  circumstances. Different LPF equality of opportunity theorists propose different conceptions of how to draw the line between circumstances to be equalized and choices for which individuals themselves are properly held responsible. They also propose different conceptions of how to assess circumstances for purposes of distributive justice and how to measure them so one can determine when one individual’s circumstances overall are equal or unequal to another’s.

The most prominent and explicit LPF conception of distributive justice is that advanced by Ronald Dworkin in two essays published in 1981 (reprinted along with other essays in Dworkin 2000; see also Arneson 1989, Cohen 1989, and Sen 1992).

For further discussion of LPF conceptions of distributive justice, see the entries on affirmative action, egalitarianism, equality, and distributive justice in this Encyclopedia.

An important complication to be noted is that the LPF conception of equality of opportunity can be deployed not as the core of a theory of distributive justice but as a rival to substantive equality of opportunity (Roemer 1995 and 1998). So once again one distinguishes the major issue, what justifies social hierarchy and what is the morally acceptable shape of social hierarchy, from the supplementary issue, what conditions must be satisfied if the process that assigns individuals to positions in the social hierarchy is to be morally acceptable. Equality of opportunity is again proposed to answer that supplementary question. But the answer now proposed is that we should level the playing field on which competition for superior positions in the social hierarchy will eventually take place. The playing field is levelled when unchosen circumstances of individuals are equalized, so that individuals can reasonably be held responsible for their choices that determine their eventual places in the social hierarchy. One might picture LPF equality of opportunity as operating in the sphere of education and socialization and health care to prepare young people for adult status when responsible agency in a field of social competitions will be expressed. Opportunities are equalized when unchosen circumstances including native talents are counterbalanced so that nothing but the quality of people’s choices (to the degree they can reasonably be held responsible for them) and their foreseeable effects determines their fate in social competitions. The effects of unchosen luck are to be eliminated.

Consider educational policy from the standpoint of the LPF conception of equal opportunity. The aim of educational policy in this perspective would be to bring it about that individuals have equal opportunity for labor market and entrepreneurial success. If some individuals enter school with greater potential for market success due to favorable genetic makeup and early childhood socialization, then extra educational resources should be expended on the unlucky so that so far as is possible, when all individuals leave school, all who exhibit equal ambition and perseverance in working toward chosen goals will have the same prospects of lifetime economic success. Or perhaps we had better say that educational resources are deployed so that anyone who works as hard as can reasonably be expected in school will leave school with the benchmark equal prospect of market success.

One could consider health care policy from the same perspective. The object of the LPF equal opportunity advocate would be to design a health care policy that compensates individuals for bad luck in unchosen health care circumstances, offsetting adverse unchosen health conditions so that lifetime health prospects for all who behave equally responsibly are the same.

One difficulty this approach faces is to clarify the basis for holding people responsible for their choices and the extent to which people will be held responsible for the effects of their choices that fall on themselves. John Roemer has developed a framework for addressing this difficulty. His idea is one that societies with different notions of how much responsibility for choice to assign to individuals could use to determine what equal opportunity would require given their favored notion of individual responsibility (Roemer 2002 and 2003; for criticism, see Risse 2002).

Roemer proposes that the population be divided into types on the basis of characteristics for which society deems individuals not reasonably to be held responsible. One then examines the distribution of a good such as education or health care or labor market success. For each such good, there is assumed to be a single measure of effort for which individuals are to be held responsible. This might be years of persevering in school, for example. If there are many individuals in each type, one takes the effort distribution for the type as a feature of the type and hence something for which the individual should not be held responsible. What the individual is deemed accountable for is the amount of effort she puts forth by comparison with the effort put forth by others of her type. The Roemerian equality of opportunity norm regards those who are at the same centile of effort for their type to have exercised a comparable degree of responsibility. Ideally society should equalize outcomes for each centile of every type, but in general this will not be possible, so one seeks a logically feasible approximation to this ideal and identifies this as equality of opportunity. Roemer offers his account as an ecumenical proposal that a society could employ whatever its own collective opinion as to what characteristics of individuals should be deemed to be effectively beyond their power to control and hence to identify relevant types for purposes of defining the requirements of equality of opportunity.

Since Roemer does not offer a full theory of justice within which his LPF version of equality of opportunity would be included, one cannot say what sort of social hierarchy he envisions, fair access to which is to be regulated by this level playing field conception of equality of opportunity. But a difficulty he himself notes raises a worry about the attractiveness of the approach (Roemer, 1998, chapter 12). If society needs excellent basketball players, ballet dancers, bankers, medical researchers, nuclear scientists, and so on, then society needs to train the best individuals for those social roles, and if the social roles are valuable, no doubt special advantages and rewards should be attached to them. To say that "society needs" such elite education is to speculate that all members of society can be made better off than they would be under elite education than if elite education is foregone. But this means that many social justice principles will imply that the LPF conception of equal opportunity should not be pursued because giving special advantages to people on the basis of unchosen circumstances such as their native possession of specially valued talents works to everyone’s advantage including especially the advantage of the worse off fraction of society.

5. Equality of Opportunity and Meritocracy

As characterized here, formal and substantive equality of opportunity ideals regulate the procedures by which individuals come to acquire especially advantageous positions. The scope of equality of opportunity is broader, the wider the range of worthy capacities and abilities that are fostered and rewarded in the society that satisfies equal opportunity ideals. The level-the-playing-field conception is a rival to substantive equality of opportunity.

None of these principles attempts to address the issue, what extent of inequality across the individuals in society and across the social positions that social arrangements establish or engender is morally acceptable. Equality of opportunity would have no application if all social positions were equally advantageous and desirable. But equality of opportunity does not say whether the gap between the top rung of society and the bottom rung should be large or small. Equality of opportunity principles assert that if there is to be inequality in the rewards and remuneration and status dispensed by social arrangements, all members of society should have equal opportunity suitably defined to gain the superior positions.

The term "meritocracy" is sometimes used to refer to a society that fulfills formal and substantive equality of opportunity norms. It should be noted that the term sometimes names a broader ideal. A meritocracy in this broader sense is a society in which (a) equality of opportunity obtains and (b) rewards and remuneration gained by individuals are proportional to their individual desert. The difference between narrow and broad meritocratic norms is that the latter assert a standard for assessing social arrangements in so far as they attach rewards and remunerations to positions and fix the extent of social inequality. These arrangements should give individuals what they deserve, and what they deserve is at least partly fixed independently of existing social arrangements and so can serve as a standard for criticizing them (see Sher 1987, Scheffler 1992 and 2000, and Miller 1999, chapters 7-9).

According to the broad meritocracy ideal, a justification for equality of opportunity is that its fulfillment is necessary if it is to be the case that individuals genuinely get what they deserve. If equality of opportunity is violated, then either the less qualified are selected over the more qualified or not all individuals have equal chance to become qualified. Equality of opportunity is then either a means to meritocracy or partly constitutive of it.

It should be noted that broad meritocracy might be upheld either as a complete view of social justice or as one justice value to be balanced against others.

Theories of desert are various. Principles of desert can be comparative or noncomparative. A comparative desert principle specifies what makes people more or less deserving relative to one another. A noncomparative desert principle associates a proper amount of recognition, remuneration, or reward with an individual's particular level of deservingness. For example, the claim that medical doctors and business executives are paid too much compared to what manual workers get is a claim of comparative desert. The claim that no one deserves to starve is a claim of noncomparative desert. An individual is rightly regarded as deserving only on the basis of some personal characteristic such as her traits or doings.

Some hold that what makes any person fundamentally deserving of good or bad fortune is her level of virtue or moral merit. Other theorists hold that there are plural bases of desert that in different settings establish what people deserve and what treatment society should accord them (Sher, 1987). On this view, desert comes in different flavors. For example, deserving athletes should be cheered, deserving poets should be appreciated for their insight and aesthetic merit. This view provides a critical standard. If a society jeers at its good athletes and poets, it is deficient, and its practices should be reformed so that the deserving are rewarded in due proportion.

If economic desert or merit is regarded as measurable and the desert theorist holds that in a just political economy, individuals are remunerated and rewarded in proportion to their level of desert, justice as deservingness becomes a candidate theory of justice. In principle, the view fixes what inequalities in people's conditions of life are morally acceptable. Whereas the libertarian holds that social justice is achieved when Lockean rights are respected, and the Rawlsian holds that justice in general requires that society be arranged to maximize the primary social goods holdings of the least advantaged, the desert theorist asserts that justice is meritocracy. In a meritocracy, each individual has good fortune in proportion to her deservingness (Rawls, 1999, Nozick 1974, Miller 1999).

The idea that individuals become economically deserving in so far as they are economically productive as measured by what people are willing to pay for their goods and services comes under pressure from two directions. On the one side, a well-functioning competitive market is responsive to supply and demand, which vary capriciously in ways that confront economic agents as sheer luck. Any notion of economic deservingness that allows economic performances to be equally deserving but to attract unequal rewards due to luck will end up holding that efficient markets should be made to operate differently than they now do. But from the other side, if one asks, why should markets be reformed so they reward the deserving, the notion of desert in play here looks under scrutiny to be too insubstantial to justify the demanded changes. The thought that people deserve in proportion to their meritorious doings runs against the fact that all such accomplishments depend to an indeterminate extent on native talent and favorable early socialization, sources of meritorious agency that are entirely beyond the individual's power to control. What the market tends to reward does not look to correspond to any plausible conception of what persons genuinely deserve. But any conception of desert that tracks even very roughly what the market tends to reward makes desert vary arbitrarily (Rawls 1999, sections 47 and 48, but see Miller 1999, chapters 7-9).

6. Justifications of Equality of Opportunity

The ideal of a society in which people do not suffer disadvantage from discrimination on grounds of supposed race, ethnicity, religion, sex, sexual orientation is widely upheld as desirable in itself. For many, the ideal is more compelling than any argument that might be offered to support it.

However, what is objectionable is wrongful discrimination. Distinguishing wrongful from innocent discrimination is tricky (Alexander, 1992). Statistical discrimination is not per se wrong. A black man may take black skin to be roughly correlated with traits such as common experiences and outlook that he values in friends, and prefer blacks as friends on this basis. This is surely not morally wrong. Nor would it be wrong to desire on the same basis to be employed in a firm that employs mainly blacks. It might well be the case, however, that acting on such a desire in concert with others might have significant negative consequences for others. Heterosexuals flocking together in the workplace might tend sharply to limit employment opportunities available to nonheterosexuals. On grounds of equal opportunity, then, law and social custom might be framed to restrict or prohibit acting on the desire to club together with others whom one identifies as like oneself in certain salient ways, even though this sort of discrimination is not deemed per se wrong.

Formal and substantive equality of opportunity ideals require more than avoidance of discrimination. These broader ideals might be regarded as morally valuable per se and unconditionally. They might also be justified on instrumental grounds. For example, when women are excluded from the labor force, markets function less efficiently, and the ensemble of people’s desires can in many settings be satisfied more fully if equal opportunity for men and women is secured.

A conception of equality of opportunity, deemed to be morally valuable per se, might be deemed so either as a deontological requirement or as a valuable state of affairs to be promoted. A deontological requirement specifies ways in which each agent should always treat other people. An absolute deontological requirement demands to be obeyed come what may, a less than absolute requirement may be overridden if conformity to it produces an excessively bad outcome or conflicts with other deontological requirements that taken together have greater moral weight.

7. Critiques

7.1 The Libertarian Critique: Robert Nozick’s Version.

According to the Lockean libertarian, justice is done when each person respects every other person’s Lockean rights (see Nozick 1974, Paul 1977). One’s Lockean rights roughly amount to the right to do whatever one chooses with whatever one legitimately owns so long as one does not thereby harm others in certain ways that either violate or infringe their rights. The "certain ways" of harming are specified by a list: no theft, fraud, breach of contract, extortion, coercion or forcing, assault, infliction of physical damage on persons or their property. Violations of rights are forbidden infringements. One must not violate anyone’s rights, come what may. Infringements of rights include violations and mere infringements. The latter may permissibly be done provided compensation is paid to any victim who suffers harm as a result of having one’s rights infringed. Each adult person is the full rightful owner of herself, unless she has forfeited this right of dominion by grave misconduct or signed it away by exchange or free gift or waiver. The Lockean libertarian holds that a self-owning person may appropriate unowned land and moveable parts of the earth and thereby become their full rightful owner; these rights may then be transferred to others by gift or exchange or forfeited under certain circumstances.

The bearing of these claims on the moral validity of equal opportunity norms is supposed to arise from the consideration that if one legitimately owns property, one is not morally bound to use it in ways that satisfy equality of opportunity. If one owns a factory, one may let it sit unused and allow no one to trespass on the premises, or one may invite anyone one chooses to enter the premises and work in the factory one owns on any mutually agreeable terms. One’s Lockean rights fill  the moral space that conceptions of equal opportunity are thought to occupy and as it were leave no room for them. Just as one may choose to become friends with anyone on any mutually agreeable terms, rather than offer one’s friendship to all who might wish it and to choose among applicants according to the merits of the applications, one may do the same with any property one owns.  Lockean property rights preclude its being the case that anyone is morally entitled to be treated according to equality of opportunity norms or that anyone is morally obligated to treat anyone according to such norms (unless one has signed a contract or promised to do so).

The Lockean critique or rather counter-assertion of libertarian rights in the face of contrary claims that people have rights to equal opportunity applies to formal as well as to substantive equal opportunity ideals. According to the Lockean libertarian, a white male landowner who wishes to hire laborers to work his fields may refuse to hire people of any religion, ethnicity, sex, sexual orientation, or the like that he chooses to regard as a bar to employability. Or he can decide to hire blacks and women and Hindus only for low-skill jobs and whites and men and Christians exclusively for skilled and managerial jobs. These decisions might be subject to appropriate moral criticism. What one has a moral right to do may nonetheless be morally wrong. The claim that one has a moral right to do X implies that others should not coercively interfere with one’s doing X or violate any of one’s rights to prevent one from doing X. The libertarian denies that anyone has a moral right in this sense to be treated in accordance with equal opportunity norms. This stricture applies to formal equality of opportunity and a fortiori to substantive equal opportunity and level-the-playing-field conceptions as well.

The Lockean libertarian can also be viewed as proposing a minimalist conception of equal opportunity that should supersede the more expansive notions of equal opportunity. The libertarian view is that people’s opportunities are equal in the relevant sense when each person equally faces other possible interaction partners in a regime in which everyone’s Lockean rights are respected. This requires that no state or government prohibit persons from transacting with others on any mutually agreeable terms (that do not impose harms of certain sorts on nonconsenting others). Laws that coercively enforce Jim Crow racial exclusion (no blacks are legally permitted to work at skilled jobs or enter learned professions or form certain sorts of entrepreneurial business partnerships and so on) would violate libertarian equal opportunity so conceived.

7.2 The Libertarian Critique: Richard Epstein’s Version

The Lockean libertarian proposes that everyone’s Lockean rights should be respected by everyone as inherently just and fair. Respecting Lockean rights is deemed morally valuable for its own sake, not merely for the sake of good consequences it might bring about.

One can also regard Lockean rights as instruments, morally valuable not in themselves but for the consequences compliance with them brings about. On this approach, to the extent that rigid adherence by individuals or the government to Lockean rights would not produce the best consequences, adherence should be selectively abandoned.

Richard Epstein recommends something rather close to a regime of Lockean libertarian rights on the ground that compliance with this regime of rights maximizes aggregate utility (well-being of persons) over the long run (Epstein 1995, chapter 1). The Epstein regime of rights is only a rough approximation of a strict Lockean libertarian regime, for the former approves utility-promoting curtailment of individual rights. For example, in an Epstein but not a strict Lockean regime, a hiker caught in a blizzard in the mountains who stumbles upon a privately owned cabin may trespass and use the cabin without prior permission of the owner provided compensation is paid for any damage done to the cabin and its provisions. But Epstein holds that enforcement of nondiscrimination norms and equality of opportunity would tend to lessen not promote people’s long-run utility. As this formulation suggests, Epstein is concerned with the question, what rules and norms should be enforced by force of law. As against the simple rule that permits all and only deals that elicit the voluntary consent of the participants, the rule forbidding discrimination is costly to administer and enforce, charges of discrimination being easy to make and difficult to prove. According to Epstein, competitive markets pressure people to do what is cost-effective, which generally means hiring the most qualified applicant and selling to any willing customer who is able to pay. (The conjecture here is that over time competitive markets tend in a rough and ready way to come close enough to satisfying formal equality of opportunity, but of course one would expect no corresponding tendency to approximate EFO.) In short, according to Epstein, by facilitating mutually profitable interactions among strangers, the competitive market promotes a cultural atmosphere of tolerance more effectively than governmental regulation would do.

7.3 Genetics and the Relevance of Equality of Opportunity

One might object to the substantive and level playing field conceptions of equality of opportunity canvassed so far in this entry on the ground that they all presuppose a world of individuals of given genetic makeup. Given a population of individuals each with a particular genetic makeup that fixes for that individual a profile of native talent, the question for the equal opportunity theorist is what  must be done to or for such individuals if they are to be rightly regarded as enjoying equal opportunity. This framework of discussion takes for granted that native talent differentials are an unalterable natural fact. The objection is that what this framework presupposes may not be so or may eventually not be so. Advances in biological knowledge suggest that at some time in the future people can by deliberate choice alter the genetic makeup of their children or the children born in their society in order to eliminate unwanted traits and augment desired traits. The genetic influences on human traits will become subject to human control. This might occur by using genetic knowledge either to alter the genetic constitution of individuals yet to be born or to provide therapeutic interventions on already existing individuals to alter their genetic makeup. Along this line some argue that advances in genetic knowledge unsettle current moral conceptions including conceptions of equal opportunity by falsifying their factual presuppositions (Buchanan 2000, chapters 3 and 7).

Of course affecting the genetic makeup of children by deliberate choice is not new. Assortative mating done with the hope that by selection of a mate with desirable traits one will affect the likelihood that one’s children will have similar desirable traits is a means of influencing the genetic makeup of individuals that does not require advanced genetic knowledge. What is new is the possible scope for deliberate choice in the world of advanced genetic knowledge that is just now being glimpsed.

At least, a question becomes more salient as genetic knowledge increases: What does fairness require by way of care and due regard in the design of individuals? What kinds of persons should be brought into existence?  Call the answers justice in conception.  Although this question is of undoubted importance, it does not in any obvious way render equality of opportunity in its various guises a consideration of no importance. In the future world with greater genetic knowledge and techniques of control of human reproduction, a population of individuals will emerge, whether in ways that conform to justice in conception or in ways that offend it. Either way, the institutions and practices into which this population is born might bring about a caste hierarchy or a different sort of hierarchy that satisfies equality of opportunity norms. Nothing said so far suggests the difference between caste hierarchy and the society that eliminates caste hierarchy is not morally significant.

Recall that Equality of fair Opportunity (EFO) requires social arrangements that bring it about that any persons with the same native talent and the same ambition will have roughly equivalent competitive prospects. Suppose there is enhanced technological capacity to alter people's genetic makeup, and hence their native talents, now or in the future. This change might be thought to put pressure on the advocate of EFO to revise her principle to require equalization of native talents so that all individuals with the same ambition will enjoy roughly equivalent prospects for competitive success(and why not consider the proclivity to be ambitious a trait like another that might be altered by social engineering in the service of a strong equal opportunity principle?). The issue here turns on what the fundamental underlying rationale for EFO is thought to be, or should be thought to be.

7.4 The Morality of Inclusion

The problems posed by the existence of individuals with severe disabilities might suggest an objection against formal and substantive conceptions of equality of opportunity or at least raise doubts about their ethical importance. Consider a society in which formal equality of opportunity and Rawlsian EFO are perfectly achieved. All posts and positions that confer superior advantages and benefits go to individuals selected by fair competitions that satisfy both formal equality of opportunity and EFO. All of this is compatible with the existence of a class of individuals who lack qualifications for any positions whatsoever. These individuals are effectively excluded from participation in society. The jobs and positions that confer superior rewards might require complex cognitive skills, and some cognitively deficient individuals are incapable of performing these complex tasks. Jobs might also require complex physical dexterity, which some physically impaired individuals are incapable of developing. Despite perfectly conforming to demanding equality of opportunity norms, the society as so far described might appear to be unjust by too stingy provision of opportunity to its least qualified members.

Unease on this score is increased with the reflection that what qualifies a person as able or disabled (or for that matter as talented or untalented) is not simply a function of her natural attributes but is rather a function of the mesh between her natural attributes and the traits that are valued by people given the organization of society (Buchanan, 2000, chapter 3 and 7, Wikler 1979). In a complex technological society, individuals are excluded from participation in its main activities who would be included in a different form of society. A person who could manage an ox cart might be unable to drive a car and hence significantly handicapped in a social order that relies on transportation by car. A person who could carry out valuable tasks in a hunter-gatherer society might be incapable of sophisticated mathematical and literacy skills required in a complex modern economy. The question then arises, to what extent must society be organized so that all of its members are able to participate as full members in the activities that constitute a decent life in the society?

For many, this question will trigger a belief that even a society that perfectly implements equality of opportunity and in which superior positions always go to those who most merit them could not be a substitute for a more complete theory of justice that addresses the issue, what sorts of social hierarchy are morally acceptable. Equality of opportunity is not the full story about social justice. It might also turn out that reflection on the morality of inclusion might yield the result that equality of opportunity is only  a rather thin chapter in the story of social justice. A decent society might tolerate in the name of justice significant deviations from perfect equality of opportunity in order to achieve other justice values.

It might be useful to compare the concern about the morality of inclusion discussed in this section with the concern about the scope of equality of opportunity discussed in section 3. A society provides too little scope of opportunity if it provides insufficient ways for a wide range of worthy human talents to be recognized, developed, and exercised. A society fails to be sufficiently inclusive if in order to shape institutions and practices in order to increase the satisfactions they offer (or to achieve some other goal) it sets educational and occupational and related standards so high that some individuals are unfairly prevented from participating in any meaningful way in the activities and practices valued by the society. A society could satisfy appropriate scope demands but fail to be sufficiently inclusive, or it could be sufficiently inclusive but fail to satisfy appropriate scope demands.

7.5 The Fairness-to-the-Worse-Off Critique

Since equality of opportunity is proposed as a component of a moral theory of justified social inequality, the full justification of any candidate conception of equality of opportunity must be sought by way of examining the justification of the full theory of justice in which the candidate conception is to play a  part. In much the same way, one examines a component of a car, a candidate design for a carburetor for instance, by seeing how the component would function in the car and how well the car with that component in place would perform.

The fact that both formal and substantive conceptions of equality of opportunity and the rival level playing field conception as well are proposed as ancillary requirements or supplements to a theory of justified social hierarchy poses a general issue concerning their justification. The setting in which equal opportunity is proposed is one in which a theory of justified hierarchy is on hand. Equal opportunity asserts that the desirable positions in the social hierarchy should be accessible to all members of society according to the equality of opportunity norm. But the social hierarchy itself is justified on some independent basis. Let us suppose that in general the theory of justice holds that a social hierarchy is desirable to the extent that it produces morally desirable consequences. The theory of justice identifies the morally desirable consequences that institutions and practices are to be arranged to promote. For example, in John Rawls’s theory of justice, it is asserted that institutions and practices should be arranged so that the worst off are as well off over the long run as possible. More specifically, Rawls proposes that inequalities in social and economic benefits (other than basic civil liberties that are regulated by another principle) are just or fair if they satisfy two conditions--they are attached to positions and offices open to all under fair equality of opportunity and they work to the maximal advantage of the worst off members of society. There are two possibilities here: Either any inequalities that would maximize the advantage level of the worst off would also satisfy fair equality of opportunity or some possible inequalities that would boost the advantage level of the worst off would violate fair equality of opportunity.

Suppose that the inequalities that would maximize the advantage level of the worst off would also as a matter of fact also satisfy fair equality of opportunity. Still, one might ask if fair equality of opportunity is justified as a free-standing moral requirement or as instrumental to the achievement of other justice goals. To investigate the issue, one must look at possible cases in which the fair equality of opportunity norm constrains the pursuit of other justice values (Arneson, 1999).

For concreteness, suppose that the advantages for the worst off members of society could be maximized by a regime that combines libertarian labor markets with high taxation of incomes and redistribution that enhances the quality of life of the worst off. But under libertarian labor markets, neither formal nor substantive equality of opportunity is required. Instead contract at will prevails. In this society, if markets come to operate more as networks of trade among people who know and trust one another than as textbook exchange among strangers, networks might follow lines of family, clan, and ethnicity, so that even formal equality of opportunity is violated. In this setting, consider a white woman who is denied a promotion in her firm just because she is white and a woman. She suffers a disadvantage, the denial of the promotion, merely because of features of herself that are either unalterable or that she should not be expected to alter in order to gain fair access to economic opportunity. But if the society that tolerates these violations of equality of opportunity thereby maximizes the advantage level enjoyed by the worst off, then there is no way to alter social laws and practices so as to render this woman and people who suffer similar disadvantage better off by enforcing careers open to talents without thereby making someone worse off than she and they are who is also disadvantaged by features of herself that are beyond her power to control. The person with small talent who finds herself in the worst off class in a properly functioning society that rewards talent in order to stimulate economic productivity and ultimately the benefit level of the worst off might well regard herself as having a stronger claim to consideration than the better off person with significant talent who finds herself disadvantaged by the failure of society to enforce equality of opportunity when equal opportunity norms are not effective means to boost the long-run advantage of the least advantaged.

Faced with this example, many will insist that equality of opportunity norms should prevail, or at least have some weight against other justice values. But one wonders if the underlying rationale for this insistence is not the residual shadow of a meritocratic belief that the person with superior native talent has a strong entitlement to gain any superior rewards that society dispenses if society does not insist on strict equality of benefits for all. Why else adopt norms that in the example above favor the talented woman disadvantaged through no fault of her own (because she is white and a woman) over the worse off untalented person also disadvantaged through no fault of her own (because she had the bad luck of being born untalented)?

8. Conclusion

The slogan "equality of opportunity" commands wide allegiance among the members of contemporary societies. Under scrutiny, equality of opportunity divides into several different ideals, some of them being opposed rivals. It is controversial which of these ideals, if any, are morally acceptable, and which, if any, should be coercively enforced as requirements of justice. (For a moderately skeptical overview, see Cavanagh 2002.) Debates about the seemingly banal norm of equality of opportunity reveal profound disagreements as to the nature of fair terms of cooperation in the modern world.


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affirmative action | egalitarianism | equality | justice: distributive | luck: justice and bad luck