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Deontological Ethics

First published Wed Nov 21, 2007

The word deontology derives from the Greek words for duty (deon) and science (or study) of (logos). In contemporary moral philosophy, deontology is one of those kinds of normative theories regarding which choices are morally required, forbidden, or permitted. In other words, deontology falls within the domain of moral theories that guide and assess our choices of what we ought to do (deontic theories), in contrast to (aretaic [virtue] theories) that — fundamentally, at least — guide and assess what kind of person (in terms of character traits) we are and should be. And within that domain, deontologists — those who subscribe to deontological theories of morality — stand in opposition to consequentialists.

1. Deontology's Foil: Consequentialism

Because deontological theories are best understood in contrast to consequentialist ones, a brief look at consequentialism and a survey of the problems with it that motivate its deontological opponents provides a helpful prelude to taking up deontological theories themselves. Consequentialists hold that choices — acts and/or intentions — are to be morally assessed solely by the states of affairs they bring about. Consequentialists thus must specify initially the states of affairs that are intrinsically valuable — the Good. They then are in a position to assert that whatever choices increase the Good, that is, bring about more of it, are the choices that it is morally right to make and to execute. (The Good in that sense is said to be prior to the Right.)

Consequentialists can and do differ widely in terms of specifying the Good. Some consequentialists are monists about the Good and identify it with pleasure, happiness, desire satisfaction, or “welfare” in some other sense. Others are pluralists regarding the Good. And many believe that how the Good is distributed among persons (or all sentient beings) is itself partly constitutive of the Good. (That is, some consequentialists are egalitarians, maximiners, or prioritarians rather than conventional utilitarians who merely add each person's share of the Good to achieve the Good's maximization.)

However much consequentialists differ about what the Good consists in, they all agree that the morally right choices are those that increase the Good. Moreover, consequentialists generally agree that the Good is “agent-neutral.” (Parfit 1984; Nagel 1986) That is, valuable states of affairs are states of affairs that all agents have reason to achieve.

Before examining deontological theories and their points of difference from consequentialist theories, it is important to note that there is some dissent from some of the points just made within consequentialism. For example, some consequentialists hold that some aspects of the Good — some valuable states of affairs — are agent-relative rather than agent-neutral (Sen 1982). In other words, some aspects of Ann's Good, although they are part of the overall societal Good, may be achievable only by Ann herself and thus give other agents no reason (or a lesser reason) to achieve them.

Moreover, there are some consequentialists who hold that the doing of certain kinds of acts contribute to or detract from the Good not solely in terms of their consequences but also as intrinsically valuable states of affairs in themselves. An example of this is the positing of rights not being violated, or duties being kept, as part of the Good to be maximized — the so-called “utilitarianism of rights.” (Nozick 1974) This latter position does not erase the difference between consequentialism and deontology. For the essence of consequentialism is still here present: an action would be a right only insofar as it maximizes these Good-making, rights-based states of affairs being caused to exist.

(Some theorists doubt the coherence of treating the nonviolation of rights as part of the Good — as intrinsic goods.)

Consequentialism is frequently criticized for its extreme demandingness. According to critics, for consequentialists, there is no realm of moral permissions, no realm of going beyond one's moral duty (supererogation), no realm of moral indifference. All acts are seemingly either required or forbidden. And there also seems to be no space for the consequentialist in which to show partiality to one's own projects or to one's family, friends, and countrymen, leading some critics of consequentialism to deem it a profoundly alienating and perhaps self-effacing moral theory (Williams 1973). Indeed, any act over which an agent has control is grist for consequentialist assessment, including expressions of moral judgments and judgments of truth and falsity. But if being partial to one's projects, family, and friends, or expressing one's judgments of truth, falsity, blame, and praise, is constitutive of the Good, and consequentialism's injunction to maximize the total Good undermines such partiality and expressions, then consequentialism as an action-guiding principle will be self-undermining. Consequentialism would become instead solely a standard of moral assessment and would not play any role in guiding the practical reasoning of agents.

On the other hand, consequentialism is also criticized for what it seemingly permits — or, more accurately, requires. It seemingly may demand (and thus, of course, permit) that innocents be killed, beaten, lied to, or deprived of material goods to produce greater benefits for others. Consequences — and only consequences — can conceivably justify any kind of act, no matter how harmful it is to some.

Finally, consequentialism is criticized on the ground that it gives little or no guidance to persons' practical reasoning. The consequences of any act stretch into the distant future, making them essentially unknowable. Although end-of-history assessments are not impossible, the guidance of practically reasoning agents becomes problematic.

Although many consequentialists deny these criticisms, others accept them and amend their consequentialism in an attempt to avoid them. Some retreat from maximizing the Good to “satisficing” — that is, making the achievement of only a certain level of the Good mandatory (Slote 1984). This move opens up some space for personal projects and relationships, as well as a realm of the morally permissible, though it is not clear that the satisficing move averts the other criticisms. More importantly, it is not clear that satisficing is otherwise adequately motivated, that the level of mandatory satisficing can be nonarbitrarily specified, or that satisficing will not require deontological ingredients such as rights to protect satisficers from maximizers.

Another move is to introduce a positive/negative duty distinction. On this view, our (negative) duty is not to make the world worse by actions having bad consequences; lacking is a corresponding (positive) duty to make the world better by actions having good consequences (Bentham 1948; Quinton 1988) Yet as with the satisficing move, it is unclear how a consistent consequentialist can motivate this restriction on all-out optimization of the Good.

A more popular move by consequentialists is to move from consequentialism as a theory that directly assesses acts to consequentialism as a theory that directly assesses rules — or character-trait inculcation — and assesses acts only indirectly by reference to such rules (or character-traits) (Alexander 1985). Its proponents contend that indirect consequentialism can avoid the criticisms of direct (act) consequentialism because it will not legitimate egregious violations of ordinary moral standards — e.g., the killing of the innocent to bring about some better state of affairs — nor will it be overly demanding, alienating, and self-effacing or unknowable.

There is not space here to evaluate indirect consequentialism. It is important to point out, however, that indirect consequentialism has been strongly criticized, as either ultimately collapsing into direct consequentialism, or else as being paradoxical and unpublicizable (Lyons 1965; Alexander and Sherwin 2001). Moreover, the knowability criticism of direct consequentialism seems equally applicable to indirect consequentialism, given that the consequences of the rules, etc., like the consequence of acts, stretch into the distant future.

2. Deontological Theories

Having briefly taken a look at deontologists' foil, consequentialist theories of act evaluation, we turn now to examine deontological theories. In contrast to consequentialist theories, deontological theories judge the morality of choices by criteria different than the states of affairs those choices bring about. Roughly speaking, deontologists of all stripes hold that some choices cannot be justified by their effects — that no matter how morally good their consequences, some choices are morally forbidden. On deontological accounts of morality, agents cannot make certain wrongful choices even if by doing so the number of wrongful choices will be minimized (because other agents will be prevented from engaging in similar wrongful choices). For deontologists, what makes a choice right is its conformity with a moral norm. Such norms are to be simply obeyed by each moral agent; such norm-keepings are not to be maximized by each agent. In this sense, for deontologists, the Right has priority over the Good. If an act is not in accord with the Right, it may not be undertaken, no matter the Good that it might produce (including even a Good consisting of acts in accordance with the Right).

2.1 Agent-Centered Deontological Theories

The most traditional mode of taxonomizing deontological theories is to divide them between agent-centered and victim-centered (or “patient-centered”) theories (Scheffler 1988; Kamm 2007). Consider first agent-centered deontological theories. According to agent-centered theories, we each have both permissions and obligations that give us agent-relative reasons for action. An agent-relative reason is an objective reason, just as are agent-neutral reasons; neither are to be confused with the subjective reasons that form the nerve of psychological explanations of human action. (Nagel 1986) An agent-relative reason constitutes an objective reason for some particular agent to do or not to do something, even though it need not constitute such a reason for anyone else. Thus, an agent-relative obligation is an obligation for a particular agent to take some action; and because it is agent-relative, the obligation does not necessarily give anyone else a reason to support that action. Each parent, for example, is commonly thought to have such special obligations to his/her child, obligations not shared by everyone else. Likewise, an agent-relative permission (absence of obligation) is a permission to do some act even though that act will produce certain adverse consequences. Each parent, to revert to the same example, is commonly thought to be permitted (at the least) to save his own child rather than saving two other children to whom he has no special relation. Agent-centered theories and the agent-relative reasons on which they are based not only enjoin each of us to do or not to do certain things; they also instruct me to treat my friends, my family, and my promisees a certain way because they are mine, even if by neglecting them I could do more for others' friends, families, and promisees.

At the heart of agent-centered theories (with their agent-relative reasons) is the idea of agency. The moral plausibility of agent-centered theories is rooted here. The idea is that morality is intensely personal, in the sense that we are each enjoined to keep our own moral house in order. Our categorical obligations are not to focus on how our actions cause or enable other agents to do evil; the focus of our categorical obligations is to keep our own agency free of moral taint.

Each agent's distinctive moral concern with his/her own agency puts some pressure on agent-centered theories to clarify how and when our agency is or is not involved in various situations. Agent-centered theories famously divide between those that emphasize the role of intention or other mental states in constituting the morally important kind of agency, and those that emphasize the actions of agents as playing such a role. There are also agent-centered theories that emphasize both intentions and actions equally in constituting the morally relevant agency of persons.

On the first of these three agent-relative views, it is most commonly asserted that it is our intended ends and intended means that most crucially define our agency. Such intentions mark out what it is we set out to achieve through our actions. If we intend something bad as an end, or even as a means to some more beneficient end, we are said to have “set ourselves at evil,” something we are categorically forbidden to do (Aquinas Summa Theologica).

Three items usefully contrasted with such intentions are the cognitive states of belief, what it is our actions risk, and what it is our actions cause. If we predict that an act of ours will result in evil, such prediction is a cognitive state (of belief); it is not an intention to bring about such a result, either as an end in itself or as a means to some other end. In this case, our agency is involved only to the extent that we have shown ourselves as being willing to tolerate evil results flowing from our acts; but we have not set out to achieve such evil by our acts. Likewise, a risking and/or causing of some evil result is distinct from any intention to achieve it. We can intend such a result, without in fact either causing or even risking it; and we can cause or risk evil results without intending them. Intending thus does not collapse into risking, causing, or predicting; and on the version of agent-centered deontology here considered, it is intending alone that marks the involvement of our agency in a way so as to bring agent-centered obligations and permissions into play.

Deontologists of this stripe are committed to something like the doctrine of double effect, a long-established doctrine of Catholic theology (Woodward 2001). The Doctrine asserts that we are categorically forbidden to intend evils such as killing the innocent, or torturing others, even though doing such acts would minimize the doing of like acts by others (or even ourselves) in the future. By contrast, if we only risk, cause, or predict that our acts will have consequences making them acts of killing or of torture, then we might be able to justify the doing of such acts by the killing/torture-minimizing consequences of such actions. Whether such distinctions are plausible is standardly taken to measure the plausibility of an intention-focused version of the agent-centered version of deontology.

There are other versions of mental-state focused agent relativity that do not focus on intentions (Hurd 1994). Some focus on predictive belief as much as on intention (at least when the belief is of a high degree of certainty). Other versions focus on intended ends (“motives”) alone. Still others focus on the deliberative processes that precede the formation of intentions, so that even to contemplate the doing of an evil act impermissibly invokes our agency (Anscombe 1958; Geach 1969; Nagel 1979). But intention-focused versions are the most familiar versions of so-called “inner wickedness” versions of agent-centered deontology.

The second kind of agent-centered deontology is one focused on actions, not mental states. Such a view can concede that all human actions must originate with some kind of mental state, often styled a volition or a willing; such a view can even concede that volitions or willings are an intention of a certain kind (Moore 1993, Ch. 6). Indeed, such source of human actions in willing is what plausibly connects actions to the agency that is of moral concern on the agent-centered version of deontology. Yet to will the movement of a finger on a trigger is distinct from an intention to kill a person by that finger movement. The act view of agency is thus distinct from the intentions (or other mental state) view of agency.

On this view, our agent-relative obligations and permissions have as their content certain kinds of actions: we are obligated not to kill innocents for example. The killing of an innocent of course requires that there be a death of such innocent, but there is no agency involved in mere events such as deaths. Needed for there to be a killing are two other items. One we remarked on before: the action of the putative agent must have its source in a willing. But the other maker of agency here is more interesting for present purposes: the willing must cause the death of the innocent for an act to be a killing of such innocent. Much (on this view) is loaded into the requirement of causation.

First, causings of evils like deaths of innocents are commonly distinguished from omissions to prevent such deaths. Holding a baby's head under water until it drowns is a killing; seeing a baby lying face down in a puddle and doing nothing to save it when one could do so easily is a failure to prevent its death. Our categorical obligations are usually negative in content: we are not to kill the baby. We may have an obligation to save it, but this will not be an agent-relative obligation, on the view here considered, unless we have some special relationship to the baby.

Second, causings are distinguished from allowings. In a narrow sense of the word we will here stipulate, one allows a death to occur when: (1) one's action merely removes a defense the victim otherwise would have had against death; and (2) such removal returns the victim to some morally appropriate baseline (Moore 1993; Kamm 1994; Kamm 1996; Moore 2008). Thus, mercy-killings, or euthanasia, are outside of our deontological obligations (and thus eligible for justification by good consequences) so long as one's act: (1) only removes a defense against death that the agent herself had earlier provided, such as disconnecting medical equipment that is keeping the patient alive; and (2) the equipment could justifiably have been hooked up to another patient, where it could do some good, had the doctors known at the time of connection what they know at the time of disconnection.

Third, one is said not to cause an evil such as a death when one's acts merely enable (or aid) some other agent to cause such evil (Hart and Honore 1985). Thus, one is not categorically forbidden to drive the terrorists to where they can kill the policeman (if the alternative is death of one's family), even though one would be categorically forbidden to kill the policeman oneself (even where the alternative is death of one's family) (Williams 1973; Moore 2008).

Fourth, one is said not to cause an evil such as a death when one merely redirects a presently existing threat to many so that it now threatens only one (or a few) (Thomson 1985). In the time-honored example of the run-away trolley (Trolley), one may turn a trolley so that it runs over one trapped workman so as to save five, even though it is not permissible for an agent to have initiated the movement of the trolley towards the one to save the five (Foot 1967; Thomson 1985).

Fifth, our agency is said not to be involved in mere accelerations of evils about to happen anyway, as opposed to causing such evils by doing acts necessary for such evils to occur (G. Williams 1961; Brody 1996). Thus, when a victim is about to fall to his death anyway, dragging a rescuer with him, too, the rescuer may cut the rope connecting them. Rescuer is accelerating, but not causing, the death that was about to occur anyway.

All of these distinctions have been suggested as part and parcel of another centuries-old Catholic doctrine, the doctrine of doing and allowing (see the entry on doing vs. allowing harm) (Moore 2008; Kamm 1994; Foot 1967; Quinn 1989). According to this doctrine, one may not cause death, for that would be a killing, a “doing;” but one may fail to prevent death, allow (in the narrow sense) death to occur, enable another to cause death, redirect a life-threatening item from many to one, or accelerate a death about to happen anyway, if good enough consequences are in the offing. As with the Doctrine of Double Effect, how plausible one finds these applications of the Doctrine of Doing and Allowing will determine how plausible one finds this cause-based view of human agency.

A third kind of agent-centered deontology can be obtained by simply conjoining the other two agent-centered views. That is, the view would be that agency in the relevant sense is equally constituted by intention and causings (i.e., action) (Moore 2007). On this view, our agent-relative obligations do not focus on causings or intentions separately; rather, the content of such obligations is focused on intended causings. For example, our deontological obligation with respect to human life is neither an obligation not to kill nor an obligation not to intend to kill; rather, it is an obligation not to murder, that is, to kill in execution of an intention to kill.

By requiring both intention and causings to constitute human agency, this third view avoids the seeming overbreadth of our obligations if either intention or causings alone marked such agency. Suppose our agent-relative obligation were not to do some action such as kill an innocent — is that obligation breached by a merely negligent killing, so that we deserve the serious blame of having breached such a categorical norm? (Hurd 1994) (Of course, one might be somewhat blameworthy on consequentialist grounds (Moore 1997), or perhaps not blameworthy at all (Alexander 1990a).) Alternatively, suppose our agent-relative obligation were not to intend to kill — does that mean we could not justify forming such an intention when good consequences would be the result, and when we are sure we cannot act so as to fulfill such intention? (Hurd 1994) If our agent-relative obligation is neither of these alone, but is, rather, that we are not to kill in execution of an intention to kill, both such instances of seeming overbreadth in the reach of our obligations are avoided.

Whichever of these three agent-centered theories one finds most plausible, they each suffer from some common problems. A fundamental worry is the moral unattractiveness of the focus on the self as the nerve of any agent-centered deontology. The importance of each person's agency to himself/herself has a narcissistic flavor to it that seems unattractive to many. It seemingly justifies each of us keeping our own moral house in order even at the expense of the world becoming much worse. Secondly, many find the distinctions invited by the Doctrine of Double Effect and the Doctrine of Doing and Allowing to be either morally unattractive or conceptually incoherent. Such critics find the differences between intending/foreseeing, causing/omitting, causing/allowing, causing/enabling, causing/redirecting, and causing/accelerating to be morally insignificant. (On act/omission (Rachels 1975); on doing/allowing (Kagan 1989); on intending/foreseeing (Bennett 1981; Davis 1984)) They urge, for example, that failing to prevent a death one could easily prevent is as blameworthy as causing a death, so that a morality that radically distinguishes the two is implausible. Alternatively, such critics urge on conceptual grounds that no clear distinctions can be drawn in these matters, that foreseeing with certainty is indistinguishable from intending, that omitting is one kind of causing, and so forth.

Such criticisms of the DDE and the DDA drive most who accept their force away from deontology entirely and to some form of consequentialism. Alternatively, some of such critics are driven to patient-centered deontology, which we discuss below. Yet still other of such critics attempt to articulate yet a fourth form of agent-centered deontology. This might be called the “control theory of agency.” On this view, our agency is invoked whenever our choices could have made a difference. This cuts across the intention/foresight, act/omission, and doing/allowing distinctions, because in all cases we controlled what happened through our choices (Frey 1995). Yet as an account of deontology, this seems worrisomely broad. It disallows consequentialist justifications whenever: we foresee the death of an innocent; we omit to save, where our saving would have made a difference and we knew it; where we remove a life-saving device, knowing the patient will die. If deontological norms are so broad in content as to cover all these foreseeings, omittings, and allowings, then good consequences (such as a net saving of innocent lives) are ineligible to justify them. This makes for a wildly counterintuitive deontology: surely I can, for example, justify not throwing the rope to one (and thus omit to save him) in order to save two others equally in need.

Thirdly, there is the worry about “avoision.” By casting our categorical obligations in such agent-centered terms, one invites a kind of manipulation that is legalistic and Jesuitical, what Leo Katz dubs “avoision.” (Katz 1996) Some of these worries motivate the alternative, victim-centered views of deontology.

2.2 Patient-Centered Deontological Theories

A second group of deontological moral theories can be classified, in opposition to the first group, as patient-centered. These theories are rights-based rather than duties-based; and some versions purport to be quite agent-neutral in the reasons they give moral agents.

Although all patient-centered deontological theories are properly characterized as theories premised on people's rights, perhaps the most plausible version posits, as its core right, the right against being used only as means for producing good consequences without one's consent. It is not, for example, a right against being killed, or being killed intentionally. It is a right against being used for others' benefit. More specifically, this version of patient-centered deontological theories proscribes the using of another's body, labor, and talent without the latter's consent. One finds this notion expressed, albeit in different ways, in the works of the so-called Right Libertarians (e.g., Robert Nozick, Eric Mack), but also in the works of the Left-Libertarians as well (e.g., Michael Otsuka, Hillel Steiner, Peter Vallentyne) (Nozick 1974; Mack 2000; Vallentyne and Steiner 2000; Vallentyne, Steiner and Otsuka 2005). On this view, the scope of strong moral duties — those that are the correlatives of others' rights — is jurisdictionally limited and does not extend to resources for producing the Good that would not exist in the absence of those intruded upon — that is, their bodies, labors, and talents. In addition to the Libertarians, others whose views include this prohibition on using others include Quinn, Kamm, Alexander, and Gauthier (Quinn 1989; Kamm 1996; Alexander 2004; Gauthier 1986).

2.2.1 Patient-Centered Deontological Theories, Trolleys, and Transplants

The patient-centered theories appear capable of explaining the fairly universal, cross-cultural intuitions about such classic hypothetical cases as Trolley and Transplant (or Fat Man) (Thomson 1985). In Trolley, a runaway trolley will kill five workers unless diverted to a siding where it will kill one worker. Most people regard it as permissible and perhaps mandatory to switch the trolley to the siding.

By contrast, in Transplant, where a surgeon can kill one healthy patient and transplant his organs in five dying ones, thereby saving their lives, the universal reaction is condemnation. (The same is true in Fat Man, where the runaway trolley cannot be switched off the main track but can be stopped before reaching the five workers by pushing a fat man into its path, resulting in his death.)

The injunction against using arguably accounts for these contrasting reactions. After all, in each example, one life is sacrificed to save five. The only significant difference appears to be the means through which the net four lives are saved. In Transplant (and Fat Man ), the doomed person is used to benefit the others. They could not be saved in the absence of his body. In Trolley, on the other hand, the doomed victim is not used. The workers would be saved whether or not he is present.

Notice, too, that this patient–centered libertarian version of deontology handles Trolley, Transplant et al differently from how they are handled by agent-centered versions. The latter focus on the agent's mental state or on whether the agent caused the victim's harm. The patient-centered theory focuses instead on whether the victim's body, labor, or talents were the means by which the justifying results were produced. So one who realizes that by switching the trolley he can save five trapped workers and place only one in mortal danger — and that the danger to the latter is not the means by which the former will be saved — acts permissibly on the patient-centered view if he switches the trolley even if he does so with the intention of killing the one worker. Switching the trolley is causally sufficient to bring about the consequences that justify the act — the saving of net four workers — and it is so even in the absence of the one worker's body, labor, or talents. (The five would be saved if the one escaped, was never on the track, or did not exist.) By contrast, on the intent version of agent-centered theories, the one who switches the trolley does not act permissibly if he acts with the intention to harm the one worker. On the patient-centered version, if an act is otherwise morally justifiable by virtue of its balance of good and bad consequences, and the good consequences are achieved without the necessity of using anyone's body, labor, or talents without that person's consent as the means by which they are achieved, then it is morally immaterial whether someone undertakes that act with the intention to achieve its bad consequences. (This is true, of course, only so long as the concept of using does not implicitly refer to the intention of the user).

That raises the question, how can such patient-centered deontological theories account for the prima facie wrongs of killing, injuring, and so forth when done not to use others as means, but for some other purpose or for no purpose at all? The answer is that the patient-centered deontological constraint must be supplemented by consequentialist-derived moral norms to give an adequate account of morality. Killing, injuring, and so forth will usually be unjustifiable on a consequentialist calculus, especially if everyone's interests are give equal regard. It is when killing and injuring are otherwise justifiable that the deontological constraint against usings comes into play.

This version of deontology is aptly labeled Libertarian in that it cannot accommodate any strong (that is, enforceable or coercible) duty to aid others. For if there were such a strong positive duty — if, for example, A had a duty to aid X, Y, and Z — and if A could more effectively aid X, Y, and Z by coercing B and C to aid them (as is their duty), then A would have a duty to “use” B and C in this way. Any positive duties will thus not be rights-based ones; they will be consequentially-justified duties that can be trumped by the right not to be coerced to perform them. (This point also demonstrates that any deontological theory that posits a strong, coercible duty to aid will be agent-neutral, not agent-relative; everyone has duties correlative to everyone's right not to be used.)

As stated, this patient-centered group of deontological theories is agent-neutral in the reasons it presents. John's right not to have his body, labor, or talent used without his consent is an intrinsic good that everyone has reason to promote. Nor does this version of deontology fail to give everyone's interest impartial consideration. Everyone is equally inviolate as a moral patient.

2.2.2 Patient-Centered Deontological Theories and the Paradox of Deontological Constraints

Patient-centered theories share with agent-centered theories the so-called paradox of deontological constraints — the fact that one may not violate a deontological duty even to prevent several violations by others. (The paradox: If A's using X — one using — is bad, then why is not B's using Y and C's using Z — two usings — worse? And if it is, then why should we prohibit A's using X if his doing so will prevent B's and C's usings of Y and Z?)

A first-cut reply by patient-centered deontologists would go thusly: Violating X's rights to prevent others from violating the rights of Y and Z “uses” X for the benefit of Y and Z; and it is no more paradoxical to proscribe using X to prevent others from using Y and Z than it is to proscribe using X to produce other kinds of benefits for Y and Z.

Still, the critic of deontology may not be satisfied. If usings are bad, then are not more usings worse than fewer? And if so, then it is not odd to condemn acts that produce better states of affairs than would occur in their absence?

The patient-centered deontologist has one possible strategy open at this point. He can just deny that wrong acts on his account of wrongness — usings — can be translated into bad states of affairs. Two wrongings are not “worse” than one. They cannot be summed into anything of normative significance. After all, the victim of a rights-violating using may suffer less harm than others might have suffered had his rights not been violated; yet one cannot, without begging the question against deontological constraints, argue that therefore no constraint should block minimizing harm. That is, the patient-centered deontologist rejects the comparability of states of affairs that involve usings and those that do not. Similarly, the patient-centered deontologist may reject the comparability of states of affairs that involve more or fewer usings (Brook 2007).

The deontologist might attempt to back this assertion by relying upon the separateness of persons. Wrongs are only wrongs to persons. A wrong to Y and a wrong to Z cannot be added to make some greater wrong because there is no person who suffers this greater wrong (cf. Taurek 1977).

This solution to the paradox of deontology, which is consistent with the spirit of the patient-centered version, may seem attractive, but it comes at a high cost. In Trolley, for example, where there is no using and thus no bar to switching, one cannot claim that it is better to switch and save the five. For if the deaths of the five cannot be summed, their deaths are not worse than the death of the one worker on the siding. Although there is no deontological bar to switching, neither is the saving of a net four lives a reason to switch. Worse yet, were the trolley heading for the one worker rather than the five, there would be no reason not to switch the trolley, killing the five in order to save the one. Just as a net gain of four lives is no reason to switch the trolley, so a net loss of four lives is no reason not to switch the trolley. If the numbers don't count, they don't count either way.

The problem of how to account for the significance of numbers without giving up deontology and adopting consequentialism, and without resurrecting the paradox of deontology, is one that a number of deontologists are now working to solve (e.g., Kamm 1996; Scanlon 2003; Otsuka 1006; Hsieh et al. 2006). Until it is solved, it will remain a huge thorn in the deontologist's side.

2.3 Contractarian Deontological Theories

Somewhat orthogonal to the distinction between agent-centered and patient-centered deontological theories are contractualist deontological theories. Morally wrong acts are, on such accounts, those acts that would be forbidden by principles that people in a suitably described social contract would accept (e.g., Rawls 1971; Gauthier 1986), or that would be forbidden only by principles that some people could not “reasonably reject” (e.g., Scanlon 2003).

In deontology, as elsewhere in ethics, is not entirely clear whether a contractualist account is really normative as opposed to metaethical. Thomas Scanlon's contractualism, for example, which posits at its core those norms of action that we can justify to each other, seems as much an ontological and epistemological account of moral notions as an account of which particular acts are right or wrong. The same may be said of David Gauthier's contractualism.

Another complication is that contractualism as a method for deriving moral norms does not necessarily lead to nonconsequentialism. John Harsanyi, for example, argues that parties to the social contract would choose utilitarianism over the principles John Rawls argues would be chosen (Harsanyi 1973). Nor is it clear that contractualism (when it does generate a deontological ethic) favors either an agent centered or a patient centered version of such an ethic.

2.4 Deontological Theories and Kant

If any philosopher is regarded as central to deontological moral theories, it is surely Immanuel Kant. Indeed, each of the branches of deontological ethics — the agent-centered, the patient-centered, and the contractualist — can lay claim to being Kantian.

The agent-centered deontologist can cite Kant's locating the moral quality of acts in the principles or maxims on which the agent acts and not primarily in those acts' effects on others. For Kant, the only thing unqualifiedly good is a good will.

The patient-centered deontologist can, of course, cite Kant's injunction against using others as mere means to one's end. And the contractualist can cite, as Kant's contractualist element, Kant's insistence that the maxims on which one acts be capable of being willed as a universal law — willed by all rational agents.

3. The Advantages of Deontological Theories

Having canvassed the two main types of deontological theories (together with a contractualist variation of each), it is time to assess deontological morality more generally. On the one hand, deontological morality, in contrast to consequentialism, leaves space for agents to give special concern to their families, friends, and projects. At least that is so if the deontological morality contains no strong duty of general beneficence, or, if it does, it places a cap on that duty's demands. Deontological morality, therefore, avoids the overly demanding and alienating aspects of consequentialism and accords more with conventional notions of our moral duties.

Likewise, deontological moralities, unlike most views of consequentialism, leave space for the supererogatory. A deontologist can do more that is morally praiseworthy than morality demands. A consequentialist cannot, assuming none of the moves earlier referenced work. For the consequentialist, if one's act is not morally demanded, it is morally wrong and forbidden. For the deontologist, there are acts that are neither morally wrong nor demanded, some — but only some — of which are morally praiseworthy.

As we have seen, deontological theories can account for strong, cross-cultural moral intuitions better than can consequentialism. The contrasting reactions to Trolley and Transplant are illustrative of this.

Finally, deontological theories, unlike most views of consequentialist ones, have the potential for explaining why certain people have moral standing to complain about and hold to account those who breach moral duties. For the moral duties typically thought to be deontological in character — unlike, say, duties regarding the environment — are duties to particular people, not duties to bring about states of affairs that no particular person has an individual right to have realized.

4. The Weaknesses of Deontological Theories

On the other hand, deontological theories have their own weak spots. The most glaring one is the seeming irrationality of our having duties or permissions to make the world morally worse. Deontologists need their own, non-consequentialist model of rationality, and even more, they need to defuse the model of rationality that motivates consequentialist theories. Until this is done, deontology will always be paradoxical. Patient-centered versions of deontology cannot easily escape this problem, as we have shown. It is not even clear that they have the conceptual resources to make agency important enough to escape this moral paradox. Yet even agent-centered versions face this paradox; having the conceptual resources (of agency and agent-relative reasons) is not the same as making it morally plausible just why each person's agency should be so crucial to that person.

Second, it is crucial for deontologists to deal with the conflicts that seem to exist between certain duties, and between certain rights. For more information, please see the entry on moral dilemmas. Kant's bold proclamation that “a conflict of duties is inconceivable” (Kant 1780, 25) is the conclusion wanted, but reasons for believing it are difficult to produce. The intending/foreseeing, doing/allowing, causing/aiding, and related distinctions certainly reduce potential conflicts; whether they can totally eliminate such conflicts is a yet unresolved question.

Thirdly, there is the manipulability worry mentioned before with respect to agent-centered versions of deontology. To the extent potential conflict is eliminated by resort to the Doctrine of Double Effect, the Doctrine of Doing and Allowing, and so forth, then a potential for “avoision” is opened up. (It is not clear to what extent patient-centered versions rely on these Doctrines and distinctions to mitigate potential conflict.)

Fourth, there is what might be called the paradox of relative stringency. There is an aura of paradox in asserting that all deontological duties are categorical — to be done no matter the consequences — and yet asserting that some of such duties are more stringent than others. A common thought is that “there cannot be degrees of wrongness with intrinsically wrong acts…,” (Frey 1995, 78 n. 3). Yet relative stringency — “degrees of wrongness” — seems forced upon the deontologist by two considerations. First, duties of differential stringency can be weighed against one another if there is conflict between them, so that a conflict-resolving, overall duty becomes possible if duties can be more or less stringent. Second, when we punish for the wrongs consisting in our violation of deontological duties, we (rightly) do not punish all violations equally. The greater the wrong, the greater the punishment deserved; and relative stringency of duty violated (or importance of rights) seems the best way of making sense of greater versus lesser wrongs.

Fifth, there are situations — unfortunately not all of them thought experiments — where compliance with deontological norms will bring about disastrous consequences. To take a stock example of much current discussion, suppose that unless A violates the deontological duty not to torture an innocent person (B), ten, or a thousand, or a million other innocent people will die because of a hidden nuclear device. If A is forbidden by deontological morality from torturing B, many would regard that as a reductio ad absurdum of deontology.

Deontologists have six possible ways of dealing with such “moral catastrophes” (although only two of these are plausible). First, they can just bite the bullet and declare that sometimes doing what is morally right will have tragic results but that allowing such tragic results to occur is still the right thing to do. Complying with moral norms will surely be difficult on those occasions, but the moral norms apply nonetheless with full force, overriding all other considerations. We might call this the Kantian response, after Kant's famous hyperbole: “Better the whole people should perish” than that injustice be done (Kant 1780, 100). One might also call this the absolutist conception of deontology, because such a view maintains that conformity to norms has absolute force and not merely great weight.

The second plausible response is for the deontologist to abandon Kantian absolutism for what is usually called “threshold deontology.” A threshold deontologist holds that deontological norms govern up to a point despite adverse consequences; but when the consequences become so dire that they cross the stipulated threshold, consequentialism takes over (Moore 1997, ch. 17). A may not torture B to save the lives of two others, but he may do so to save a thousand lives if the “threshold” is higher than two lives but lower than a thousand.

There are two varieties of threshold deontology that are worth distinguishing. On the simple version, there is some fixed threshold of awfulness beyond which morality's categorical norms no longer have their overriding force. Such a threshold is fixed in the sense that it does not vary with the stringency of the categorical duty being violated. The alternative is what might be called “sliding scale threshold deontology.” On this version, the threshold varies in proportion to the degree of wrong being done — the wrongness of stepping on a snail has a lower threshold (over which the wrong can be justified) than does the wrong of stepping on a baby.

Threshold deontology (of either stripe) is an attempt to save deontological morality from the charge of fanaticism, but it faces several theoretical difficulties. Foremost among them is giving a theoretically tenable account of the location of such a threshold, either absolutely or on a sliding scale (Alexander 2000; Ellis 1992). Why is the threshold for torture of the innocent at one thousand lives, say, as opposed to nine hundred or two thousand? Another problem is that whatever the threshold, as the dire consequences approach it, counter-intuitive results appear to follow. For example, it may be permissible, if we are one-life-at-risk short of the threshold, to pull one more person into danger who will then be saved, along with the others at risk, by killing an innocent person (Alexander 2000). Thirdly, there is some uncertainty about how one is to reason after the threshold has been reached: are we to calculate at the margin on straight consequentialist grounds, use an agent-weighted mode of summing, or do something else? A fourth problem is that threshold deontology threatens to collapse into a kind of consequentialism. Indeed, it is likely that the sliding scale version of threshold deontology is extensionally equivalent to an agency-weighted form of consequentialism (Sen 1982).

(Deontologists face an analogous “threshold” problem with the notion of consent. Most deontological duties/rights can be waived through someone's consent. Yet deontologists regard the preconditions for valid consent as turning on factors — most importantly, information and freedom from coercive pressures — that are scalar in nature, matters of more or less. The deontologist, in other words, requires a threshold for these factors, above which consent is valid, below which it is not. And the same problem of locating a deontological threshold on a continuum that affects threshold deontology and deontological consent may also affect identifying the “morally considerable.”)

The remaining four strategies for dealing with the problem of dire consequences cases all have the flavor of evasion by the deontologist. Consider first the famous view of Elizabeth Anscombe (Anscombe 1958; Geach 1969; Nagel 1979): such cases (real or imagined) can never present themselves to the consciousness of a truly moral agent because such agent will realize it is immoral to even think about violating moral norms in order to avert disaster. Such rhetorical excesses should be seen for what they are, a peculiar way of stating Kantian absolutism motivated by an impatience with the question.

Another response by deontologists, this one most famously associated with Bernard Williams, shares some of the “don't think about it” features of the Anscombean response. According to Williams (Williams 1973), situations of moral horror are simply “beyond morality,” and even beyond reason. (This view is reminiscent of the ancient view of natural necessity, revived by Sir Francis Bacon, that such cases are beyond human law and can only be judged by the natural law of instinct.) Williams tells us that in such cases we just act. Interestingly, Williams contemplates that such “existentialist” decision-making will result in our doing what we have to do in such cases — for example, we torture the innocent to prevent nuclear holocaust.

Surely this is an unhappy view of the power and reach of human law, morality, or reason. Indeed, Williams (like Bacon and Cicero before him) think there is an answer to what should be done, albeit an answer very different than Anscombe's. But both views share the weakness of seeing morality and even reason as running out on us when the going gets tough.

Yet another strategy is to divorce completely the moral appraisals of acts from the blameworthiness or praiseworthiness of the agents who undertake them, even when those agents are fully cognizant of the moral appraisals. So, for example, if A tortures innocent B to save a thousand others, one can hold that A's act is morally wrong but also that A is morally praiseworthy for having done it.

Deontology does have to grapple with how to mesh deontic judgments of wrongness with “hypological” (Zimmerman 2002) judgments of blameworthiness (Alexander 2004). Yet it would be an oddly cohering morality that condemned an act as wrong yet praised the doer of it. Deontic and hypological judgments ought to have more to do with each other than that. Moreover, it is unclear what action-guiding potential such an oddly cohered morality would have: should an agent facing such a choice avoid doing wrong, or should he go for the praise?

The last possible strategy for the deontologist in order to deal with dire consequences is to distinguish moral reasons from all-things-considered reasons and to argue that whereas moral reasons dictate obedience to deontological norms even at the cost of catastrophic consequences, all-things-considered reasons dictate otherwise. (This is one reading of Bernard William's famous discussion of moral luck, where non-moral reasons seemingly can trump moral reasons (Williams 1975; Williams 1981); this is also a strategy some consequentialists (e.g., Portmore 2003) seize as well in order to handle the demandingness and alienation problems endemic to consequentialism.) But like the preceding strategy, this one seems desperate. Why should one even care that moral reasons align with deontology if all-things-considered reasons align with consequentialism?

5. Deontology's Relation(s) to Consequentialism Reconsidered

The perceived weaknesses of deontological theories have lead some to consider how to eliminate or at least reduce those weaknesses while preserving deontology's advantages. One way to do this is to embrace both consequentialism and deontology, combining them into some kind of a mixed theory. Given the differing notions of rationality underlying each kind of theory, this is easier said than done. After all, one cannot simply weigh agent-relative reasons against agent-neutral reasons, without stripping the former sorts of reasons of their distinctive character.

A time-honored way of reconciling opposing theories is to allocate them to different jurisdictions. Tom Nagel's reconciliation of the two theories is a version of this, inasmuch as he allocates the agent-neutral reasons of consequentialism to our “objective” viewpoint, whereas the agent-relative reasons of deontology are seen as part of our inherent subjectivity. (Nagel 1986) Yet Nagel's allocations are non-exclusive; the same situation can be seen from either subjective or objective viewpoints, meaning that it is mysterious how we are to combine them into some overall view.

A less mysterious way of combining deontology with consequentialism is to assign to each a jurisdiction that is exclusive of the other. One possibility here is to regard the agent-neutral reasons of consequentialism as a kind of default rationality/morality in the sense that when an agent-relative permission or obligation applies, it governs, but in the considerable logical space where neither applies, consequentialism holds sway (Moore 2008). (Remembering that for the threshold deontologist, consequentialist reasons may still determine right action in areas governed by agent-relative obligations or permissions, once the level of bad consequences crosses the relevant threshold.)

5.1 Making no concessions to consequentialism: a purely deontological rationality?

In contrast to mixed theories, deontologists who seek to keep their deontology pure hope to expand agent-relative reasons to cover all of morality and yet to mimic the advantages of consequentialism. Doing this holds out the promise of denying sense to the otherwise damning question, how could it be moral to make (or allow) the world to be worse (for they deny that there is any states-of-affairs “worseness” in terms of which to frame such a question) (Foot 1985). To make this plausible, one needs to expand the coverage of agent-relative reasons to cover what is now plausibly a matter of consequentialist reasons, such as positive duties to strangers. Moreover, deontologists taking this route need a content to the permissive and obligating norms of deontology that allows them to mimic the outcomes making consequentialism attractive. This requires a picture of morality's norms that is extremely detailed in content, so that what looks like a consequentialist balance can be generated by a complex series of norms with extremely detailed priority rules and exception clauses. (Richardson 1990) Few consequentialists will believe that this is a viable enterprise.

5.2 Making no concessions to deontology: a purely consequentialist rationality?

The mirror image of the pure deontologist just described is the indirect or two-level consequentialist. For this view too seeks to appropriate the strengths of both deontology and consequentialism, not by embracing both, but by showing that an appropriately defined version of one can do for both. The indirect consequentialist, of course, seeks to do this from the side of consequentialism alone.

Yet as noted above, indirect consequentialism is plagued by either paradox (“why follow the rules when not doing so produces better consequences?”); collapses into direct consequentialism (“do not follow the rules whenever better consequences can thereby be produced”); or nonpublicizability (“ordinary folks should be instructed to follow the rules but should not be told of the ultimate consequentialist basis for doing so, lest they depart from the rules mistakenly believing better consequences will result”). For more information, please see the entry on rule consequentialism. Nor can the indirect consequentialist adequately explain why those who violate the indirect consequentialist's rules have “wronged” those who might be harmed as a result, that is, why the latter have a personal complaint against the former. (This is true irrespective of whether the rule-violation produces good consequences; but it is especially so when good consequences result from the rule-violation.) Moreover, as also noted, indirect consequentialism faces the same knowability (of consequences) problem that direct consequentialism faces.

The bottom line is that if deontology has intuitive advantages over consequentialism, those advantages cannot be captured by moving to indirect consequentialism, even if there is a version of indirect consequentialism that could avoid the dire consequences problem that bedevils deontological theories.

6. Deontological Moralities and Retributivism

A word is in order about the relation between deontological morality and retributivism as a theory of punishment. Some theorists believe that retributivism and deontology go hand in hand, in the sense that one requires the other. Yet deontology as such does not require retributivism to be true. Retributivism has two aspects: (1) it requires that the innocent not be punished, and (2) it requires that the guilty be punished. One could be a deontologist generally and yet deny that morality has either of these requirements. The converse relationship between deontology and retributivism is also suspect. The retributivist who requires that all and only the guilty be punished can cast this as a categorical demand, in which case the retributivism will be deontological. But a retributivist might alternatively cast these two states of affairs (the guilty getting punished and the innocent not getting punished) as two intrinsic goods, to be traded off both against each other (as in burden of proof allocation) and against other values. Some retributivists urge the latter as a kind of explicitly “consequentialist retributivism.” (Moore 1997)

7. Deontology and the Obligation to Obey the Law

Some argue that one of our deontological duties is the duty to obey the law (Gert 1970). Others argue that any duty to obey the law depends on whether the law possesses practical authority, which for some is a contingent matter (Raz 1979), and for others is impossibility (Hurd 1999). Almost everyone, however, believes that law has a very important moral function, namely, settling what one ought to do and thereby averting the moral costs of unpredictable conduct, failures of coordination, decision-making costs, and outright conflict. Law accomplishes this moral function by making otherwise abstract moral requirements determinate and thus capable of predictably guiding and coordinating conduct. And it makes abstract moral requirements determinate through blunt rules, the application of which turns on a few easily ascertainable facts.

Blunt legal rules perform their moral function by ignoring facts that would otherwise be morally significant. This means that in some, perhaps many, instances, the rules will prescribe penalties for those who violate them for morally compelling though legally immaterial reasons. And this in turn means that, for the sake of morally good consequences, law seemingly mandates penalizing those who act morally blamelessly in violating it – a troubling result for the deontologist who is a retributivist (Alexander & Sherwin 2001; compare Hurd 1999).

Two items of interest to deontology generally have come out of the literature on legal obligation. One is the analysis of non-consequentialist obligations crucial to a deontologist of any stripe; a prominent analysis of the structure of such obligations has been in terms of “exclusionary reasons,” reasons that do not outweigh competing reasons but rather exclude them from counting (Raz 1979; Moore 1989; Alexander 1990b). A second is a role-sensitive version of agent-relative reasons. On one view of the matter, officials may have reasons to enforce laws even though those same reasons fail to obligate those against whom the laws will be enforced to obey the laws. This, it is said, creates a “normative gap” between officials acting on their official roles and ordinary citizens (Alexander and Sherwin 2001; Schauer 1991; compare Hurd 1999).

8. Deontological Theories and Metaethics

Deontological theories are normative theories. They do not presuppose any particular position on moral ontology or on moral epistemology. Presumably, a deontologist can be a moral realist of either the natural (moral properties are identical to natural properties) or nonnatural (moral properties are not themselves natural properties even if they are nonreductively related to natural properties) variety. Or a deontologist can be an expressivist, a constructivist, a transcendentalist, a conventionalist, or a Divine command theorist regarding the nature of morality. Likewise, a deontologist can claim that we know the content of deontological morality by direct intuition, by Kantian reflection on our normative situation, or by reaching reflective equilibrium between our particular moral judgments and the theories we construct to explain them (theories of intuitions).

Nonetheless, although deontological theories can be agnostic regarding metaethics, some metaethical accounts seem less hospitable than others to deontology. For example, the stock furniture of deontological normative ethics — rights, duties, permissions — fits uneasily in the realist-naturalist's corner of the metaethical universe. (Which is why most naturalists, if they are moral realists, tend to be consequentialists.) Nonnatural realism, conventionalism, transcendentalism, and Divine command seem more hospitable metaethical homes for deontology. If that is true, then weaknesses with those metaethical accounts will weaken deontology as a normative theory of action.


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Related Entries

consequentialism: rule | doing vs. allowing harm | double effect, doctrine of | ethics: virtue | Kant, Immanuel: moral philosophy | Moore, George Edward: moral philosophy | moral dilemmas