Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Thu Dec 20, 2001; substantive revision Thu Jul 24, 2008

To exploit others is to take unfair advantage of them. Although ‘exploitation’ has figured prominently in Marxist theories, it is frequently invoked in ordinary moral and political discourse. This entry surveys various definitions that have appeared in the literature, attempts to identify the core elements of exploitation, and then considers its moral force.

1. Introduction

Consider these examples of alleged exploitation.

1. The president of Stanford University claimed that big-time college athletics “reeks of exploitation,” because the universities gain a great deal of revenue from the services of the athletes while the athletes (whose graduation rate is much lower than that of non-athletes) gain little from their college experience. (Kennedy 1990)

2. Advocates for people with AIDS protested the (then) annual price of AZT ($8,000), a drug that was thought to slow the progress of HIV. It was claimed that the Burroughs-Welcome Co., which produces AZT, was exploiting people who were already suffering.

3. A newspaper article described the proliferation of “posh strip clubs,” at which topless young women dance for the customers. It was both claimed and denied that these clubs were loci of exploitation. The article noted that many believe that such bars “exploit women.” At the same time, “many dancers say their work is no more exploitative than most other forms of employment,” and the owner of one bar remarked that “If anyone is being exploited it is the men, the guys buying into the fantasy of she really likes me.” (New York Times, April 15, 1992, C.12)

4. USA Today featured an article advocating the legalization of organ sales, whereby a person could be paid cash for a kidney. One reply maintained that such a policy would “open wide the door to exploitation.” (September 14, 1991)

5. When Mary Beth Whitehead refused to surrender her daughter (who was known as “Baby M”), as specified in her $10,000 surrogacy contract with William Stern, the case touched off extended public, legal, and philosophical discussion of surrogate motherhood. One commentator observed that “one of the most serious charges against surrogate motherhood contracts is that they exploit women.” (Field 1989, 25)

Although we frequently claim that some act, practice, or transaction is exploitative, the concept of exploitation is typically invoked without much analysis or argument, as if its meaning and moral force were self-evident. They are not. Even if some or even all of these sorts of claims are true, we still need to ask why are they true? And if they are true, what follows? More precisely, we can ask two questions: (1) what are the truth conditions of an exploitation claim? (2) what is the moral force of an exploitation claim? Let me explain.

For present purposes, an exploitation claim refers to statements that A's interaction with B is (or is not) wrongfully exploitative or to statements that presuppose such a claim. To say that colleges exploit student athletes is to make an exploitation claim. Susan Okin makes an exploitation claim when she says that our family system constitutes “the pivot of a societal system of gender that renders women vulnerable to dependency, exploitation, and abuse,” for we must know what exploitation involves to determine whether this claim is true. (Okin 1989, 135-36).

The first task of a theory of exploitation is to provide the truth conditions for an exploitation claim. At least one such condition is a moral criterion: a transaction is exploitative only if it is unfair. Interestingly, however, the (moral) “fact” of exploitation settles less than meets the eye. We must also consider the moral force of exploitation. In particular, we can ask whether the state should prohibit exploitative transactions or refuse to enforce exploitative agreements. The wrongness of exploitation does not dictate the way in which these moral questions should be answered.

This entry focuses on exploitative transactions or relations rather than “systemic” or macro level exploitation. It also has little to say about the Marxist view of exploitation. There are two major reasons for taking a different tack. First, the moral core of the Marxist view of exploitation is not unique to Marxism. When Marxism claims that the capitalist class exploits the proletariat, it employs the ordinary notion that one party exploits another when it gets unfair and undeserved benefits from its transactions or relationships. On that, the entry will have something to say. Second, what is unique to Marxism — its approach to measuring exploitation through calculations of surplus value—is very problematic.

This entry does the following. It first surveys the definitional landscape that has been marked out and highlights the conceptual quarrels which have arisen in the literature. It then sketches a very rough and preliminary account of the elements of exploitation. Finally, it makes some brief remarks about the moral force of exploitation.

2. Accounts of Exploitation

At the most general level, A exploits B when A takes unfair advantage of B. (I shall always refer to the alleged exploiter as A and to the alleged exploitee as B). One problem with such a broad account, as Arneson notes, is that there will “be as many competing conceptions of exploitation as theories of what persons owe to each other by way of fair treatment.” (Arneson 1992, 350). We can gain a somewhat sharper view of the issues that we must confront if we consider a sampling of the accounts that appear in the literature.

1. “[T]o exploit a person involves the harmful, merely instrumental utilization of him or his capacities, for one's own advantage or for the sake of one's own ends.” (Buchanan 1985, 87).

2. “It is the fact that the [capitalist's] income is derived through forced, unpaid, surplus [wage] labor, the product of which the workers do not control, which makes [wage labor] exploitive.” (Holmstrom 1997, 357).

3. “Exploitation necessarily involves benefits or gains of some kind to someone … Exploitation resembles a zero-sum game, viz. what the exploiter gains, the exploitee loses; or, minimally, for the exploiter to gain, the exploitee must lose.” (Tormey 1974, 207-08)

4. “Exploitation [in exchange] demands…that there is no reasonably eligible alternative [for the exploitee] and that the consideration or advantage received is incommensurate with the price paid. One is not exploited if one is offered what one desperately needs at a fair and reasonable price.” (Benn 1988, 138).

5. “Exploitation of persons consists in … wrongful behavior [that violates] the moral norm of protecting the vulnerable.” (Goodin 1988a, 147).

6. “There are four conditions, all of which must be present if dependencies are to be exploitable. First, the relationship must be asymmetrical … Second, … the subordinate party must need the resource that the superordinate supplies … Third, … the subordinate party must depend upon some particular superordinate for the supply of needed resources … Fourth, the superordinate … enjoys discretionary control over the resources that the subordinate needs from him…” (Goodin 1988b, 37).

7. “Common to all exploitation of one person (B) by another (A)…is that A makes a profit or gain by turning some characteristic of B to his own advantage…exploitation … can occur in morally unsavory forms without harming the exploitee's interests and … despite the exploitee's fully voluntary consent to the exploitative behavior…” (Feinberg 1988, 176-79).

8. “Persons are exploited if (1) others secure a benefit by (2) using them as a tool or resource so as (3) to cause them serious harm.” (Munzer 1990, 171)

9. “A society is exploitative when its social structure is organized so that unpaid labor is systematically forced out of one class and put at the disposal of another … On the force-inclusive definition of exploitation, any exploitative society is a form of slavery.” (Reiman 1987, 3-4).

10. “[A] group is exploited if it has some conditionally feasible alternative under which its members would be better off.” (Roemer 1986, 136)

11. “[E]xploitation is seen as the failure to pay labour its marginal product…” (Brewer 1987, 86).

12. “An exploitative exchange is… an exchange in which the exploited party gets less than the exploiting party, who does better at the exploited party's expense… [T]he exchange must result from social relations of unequal power … exploitation can be entered into voluntarily; and can even, in some sense, be advantageous to the exploited party.” (Levine 1988, 66-67).

13. “[Capitalist] social relations … are exploitative, not only in the specific sense of extracting surplus labour, but in the more general sense of using someone as a means, utilizing her to detriment as a way of promoting one's own good…” (Kymlicka 1989, 114).

14. “Workers are exploited if they work longer hours than the number of labor hours employed in the goods they consume.” (Elster 1986, 121).

15. “[E]xploitation forms part of an exchange of goods and services when 1) the goods and services exchanged are quite obviously not of equivalent value, and 2) one party to the exchange uses a substantial degree of coercion.” (Moore 1973, 53).

16. “[E]xploitation is a psychological, rather than a social or an economic, concept. For an offer to be exploitative, it must serve to create or to take advantage of some recognized psychological vulnerability which, in turn, disturbs the offeree's ability to reason effectively.” (Hill 1994, 637).

All these accounts are compatible with the view that “A wrongfully exploits B when A takes unfair advantage of B.” But there are some important differences among them. Some accounts (10, 14) are technical definitions of exploitation that are specific to a Marxist approach. Although none of the accounts denies that exploitation requires a gain to the exploiter, only some (3, 8) specifically mention that criterion. Some accounts invoke the Kantian notion that one wrongfully exploits when one treats another instrumentally or merely as a means (1, 8, 13). On some accounts, the exploited party must be harmed (1, 2, 3, 8, 9, 12), whereas other accounts allow that the exploited party may gain from the relationship (4, 7, 11, 12, 15). On some accounts, the exploited party must be coerced (2, 4, 6, 9, 15), whereas others require at least a defect in the quality of the consent (12, 16), and another maintains that exploitation can be fully voluntary (7).

We should not put rigid constraints on what counts as exploitation, at least at the outset. While some exploitative transactions are harmful to the exploitee, we often call exploitative cases in which the exploitee seems to gain from the transaction. Indeed, it is arguable that exploitation would be of much less theoretical interest on a “no harm, no exploitation” rule. It is trivially true that it is wrong for A to gain from an action that unjustifiably harms or coerces B. And even a libertarian will grant that some harmful exploitation may be legitimately prohibited by the state, if only because it is harmful (or rights violating) rather than because it is exploitative. By contrast, it is more difficult to explain when and why it might be wrong for A to gain from an action that benefits B and to which B voluntarily consents. And it is certainly more difficult to explain why society might be justified in prohibiting such transactions or refusing to enforce some such agreements.

For these reasons, it will be useful to make two sets of distinctions. First, we can distinguish between harmful exploitation and mutually advantageous exploitation. By mutually advantageous exploitation, we refer to those cases in which the exploitee gains from the transaction as well as the exploiter. The advantageousness of the transaction is mutual, not the exploitation. To use somewhat different terminology, exploitation is mutually advantageous only when the transaction is Pareto Superior, that is, a transaction that leaves all parties better off. We can similarly distinguish between nonconsensual exploitation, where the exploited party does not give voluntary (or valid) consent, say because of coercion or fraud, and consensual exploitation, where it appears that the exploited party has given voluntary and appropriately informed consent to the transaction.

It might be argued that it begs the question to assume that exploitation can be mutually advantageous and consensual. The objection fails. If we were to assume, for the sake of argument, that the word exploitation is best limited to cases in which the exploitee is harmed, nothing would have changed. We would still have to ask whether there are important distinctions between those cases which are (ex hypothesi) wrongly referred to as mutually advantageous exploitation and those mutually advantageous transactions that are not described in that way. It would remain an open question as to whether some mutually advantageous arrangements are wrongful and why they are wrongful. If one wants to claim that a mutually advantageous and consensual transaction cannot be unfair, then that is not a dispute over language. That is a substantive claim, but there is no reason to think that position is correct.

3. The Elements of Exploitation

Let us start with the claim that A exploits B when A takes unfair advantage of B. Taking unfair advantage could be understood in two ways. First, it may refer to some dimension of the outcome of the exploitative act or transaction, that is, the transaction is substantively unfair. And this, it seems has two elements: (1) the benefit to A and (2) the effect on B. We may say that the benefit to A is unfair because it is wrong for A to benefit at all from his act (e.g. by harming B) or because A's benefit is excessive relative to the benefit to B. Second, to say that A takes unfair advantage of B may imply that there is some sort of defect in the process by which the unfair outcome has come about, for example, that A has coerced B or defrauded B or has manipulated B. In the final analysis we may find that these three elements are not all necessary to account for exploitation, but they provide us with a way to begin.

Benefit to A

A cannot take unfair advantage of B unless A gets some advantage from B. We can see the relevance of the “benefit to A” by contrasting exploitation with other forms of wrongdoing, such as discrimination, abuse, and oppression. Let us say that A discriminates against B when A wrongly deprives B of some opportunity or benefit because of some characteristic of B that is not relevant to A's action. There was a period in American history in which many women became public school teachers because they were denied the opportunity to enter other professions such as law and medicine. To the extent that society benefitted (in one way) from the pool of highly qualified public school teachers, the discrimination may have been exploitative, even if unintentionally so. But if A refuses to hire B solely because of B's race, then it would be odd to say that A exploits B, for A does not gain from the wrong to B.

Consider abuse. It has been alleged that medical students are frequently abused by verbal insults and denigration and that this abuse may leave long-lasting emotional scars. It is also sometimes claimed that medical interns are exploited, that they work long hours for low pay. The contrast is just right. There is no reason to think that anyone gains (in any normal sense) from abuse, but it is at least plausible to think that the hospitals or patients gain from the exploitation of interns.

Let us say that A oppresses B when A deprives B of freedoms or opportunities to which B is entitled. If A gains from the oppressive relationship, as when A enslaves B, then A may both oppress and exploit B. But if A does not gain from the oppression, the oppression is wrong but not exploitative. We might say that the unemployed are oppressed, but unless we could specify the ways in which some gain from their lack of employment, the unemployed are not exploited. Marxists would claim that capitalists pay exploitative wages to the employed precisely because there is a “reserve army” of the unemployed with whom the employed must compete. But that merely confirms that they are exploited because the oppression generates a gain to the capitalist class, and it is the employed who are exploited and not the unemployed that make such exploitation possible.

The Effect on B

As our definitional survey indicated, some commentators maintain that exploitation resembles a zero-sum game, that the exploiter gains what the exploitee loses. (Tormey, 207) Others maintain that exploitation is always harmful to the exploitee, even if the gains and losses do not cancel out. It is relatively uncontroversial that exploitation can be harmful to B, as in slavery. Other cases are more controversial. There are cases in which B is not directly affected by A's utilization of B, what Feinberg refers to as harmless parasitism, as when A follows B's taillights in a dense fog. A uses B to his own advantage, but does not render B worse off (assume that B is not bothered by A's headlights in B's mirror). (Feinberg, 14) In other cases of non-harmful exploitation, the transaction appears to benefit both A and B, as may be true of organ sales or commercial surrogacy.

Now in asking how A's action affects B's interests, we must be careful to adopt an all things considered point of view. There are, after all, negative elements in virtually all uncontroversially beneficial transactions. Paying money for a good that is clearly worth the price is still a negative element in the transaction. It would be better to get it for free. If A and B enter into a cooperative agreement where A gives B $100 for a book that is worth a lot to A (because it completes a collection) but is worth little to B, we do not say that B has been harmed by the transaction just because B has lost her book any more than we say that A has been harmed because the transaction required A to pay $100. Similarly, we do not say that a worker is harmed by employment merely because the worker prefers leisure to work. If the benefits to B from employment are greater than the costs to B, then employment is beneficial to B, all things considered. So in deciding whether a case of alleged exploitation should be classified as harmful exploitation or mutually advantageous exploitation, we must look at its net effect on B. If the benefits of a transaction exceed its costs, then it is not harmful even if it is exploitative, as might be true of organ sales and working as a stripper.

Joel Feinberg argues that if a transaction is mutually advantageous, then A does not gain at B's expense. (Feinberg 1988, 178). Not quite. There is an important sense in which any marginal gain to one party within a “zone of agreement” is always at the other party's expense. For while the parties may prefer any outcome within the zone of agreement to the non-agreement solution, they are not indifferent to the terms of the agreement. Mutually advantageous exploitation occurs when A and B gain relative to the non-cooperation baseline, but where the distribution of the benefits between A and B is unfair to B. Consider a garden variety case of alleged exploitation. An unexpected blizzard hits an area and people rush to the hardware store to buy a shovel. The hardware store owner sees the opportunity to make an abnormal profit and raises the price of a shovel from $15 to $30. If B agrees to pay $30 for the shovel, because the shovel is worth more than $30 to B under the circumstances, then the transaction is advantageous to both parties. If B is exploited, it is because B has paid too much. A similar structure applies to some of the other cases of alleged exploitation with which we began—AZT for AIDS, surrogacy, organ sales. We need not deny that B benefits from these transactions, all things considered. Rather, A may exploit B if B pays too a high price for what she gains or does not receive enough for what she gives.

A mutually advantageous transaction is arguably (wrongly) exploitative only if the outcome is (in some way) unfair to B. This is not merely definitional. After all, it may be thought that a transaction is exploitative whenever takes advantage of B's vulnerabilities or desperate situation to strike a deal. That is false. For if A makes a reasonable proposal that B has no alternative but to accept given B's desperate situation, A does not exploit B. If a doctor proposes to perform life-saving surgery for a reasonable fee, the patient is hardly exploited, even though the patient would not have agreed but for the fact that her life was in danger.

It might be said that “mutually advantageous” exploitation can and should be understood as a form of harmful exploitation. If we evaluate a transaction by reference to a fairness baseline as contrasted with a no-transaction baseline, then B is harmed when she pays $30 for a shovel by comparison with the fairness baseline (say, where B pays $15 for a shovel) even if B gains by comparison with the no-transaction baseline. Such relabeling would not change anything, for we would still have to distinguish between those cases in which B is harmed relative to both the fairness baseline and the no-transaction baseline and those cases where B is harmed only by reference to the fairness baseline but not by reference to the no-transaction baseline.

It may also be objected that the proposed distinction between harmful exploitation and mutually advantageous exploitation ignores a deeper—Kantian—way in which “mutually advantageous” exploitation is harmful to B, namely that A treats B merely as a means to be utilized to his own advantage rather than as an end in herself—if so treating a person is to harm her. Allen Buchanan argues that exploitation occurs “whenever persons are harmfully utilized as mere instruments for private gain,” and adds that this could apply to business transactions between two affluent bankers—“Each harmfully utilizes the other as a mere means to his own advantage.” (Buchanan, 1984, 44.)

It is not clear what to make of this view. First, on one plausible reading of the Kantian maxim, one treats another as a mere means only when one treats “him in a way to which he could not possibly consent,” as in cases of coercion and fraud, where A seeks to undermine B's capacity as an autonomous decision-maker. (Korsgaard 1993, 40). There is no reason to think that each banker could not possibly consent to be so treated by the other banker. Second, to say that A exploits B when A “harmfully utilizes” B as a “mere means” is equivocal as to whether “harmfully” is a reinforcing or modifying adverb. On one view, “harmfully” is merely reinforcing because the utilization of B merely as a means constitutes an independent harm to B. On another view, “harmfully” is a modifying adverb, because we can contrast the cases in which A harmfully utilizes B as a mere means with cases in which A non-harmfully utilizes B as a mere means. If we accept the first interpretation, we would still want to distinguish between those cases in which B is harmed apart from being treated merely as a means from those in which B is not harmed apart from the harm that derives from being treated merely as a means. On the second view, the bankers may utilize each other as means, but absent an independent form of harm, there is no reason to think that they are harmed by their utilization as a means itself. So that Kantian view does nothing to deny the distinction between harmful exploitation and mutually advantageous exploitation.

And so it seems better simply to grant that some allegedly exploitative transactions are mutually advantageous and go on to ask what makes a mutually advantageous transaction unfair. This is not easy because there is no non-problematic account of fair transactions. (Wertheimer 1996). Here are several possibilities.

We might say that a transaction is unfair when the goods exchanged are “incommensurable,” as might be thought of the exchange of an organ for money. There are two problems here. First, it is not clear whether goods are ultimately incommensurable (Chang 1997). Second, if goods are incommensurable, it is not why an exchange of those goods is unfair.

Assuming that we can compare the gains of the parties, it is frequently suggested that a transaction is exploitative when A gains much more than B. But if we measure the parties' gains in terms of marginal utility from the no transaction baseline, the exploitee often gains more than the exploiter. If a doctor overcharges for life-saving surgery, exploiting the patient's situation, the doctor gains less than the patient. If a store owner charges $30 for a shovel, the buyer may well get more utility from the shovel than the seller gets for the money. Indeed, the exploiter's power over the exploitee stems precisely from the fact that he does not stand to gain too much. He can easily walk away from the transaction, whereas the exploitee cannot.

This suggests that we cannot evaluate the fairness of a transaction solely by comparing the gains of the parties. Rather, we must measure the fairness of their gains against a normative baseline as to how much the parties ought to gain, and that baseline is not easy to specify. A promising but not unproblematic candidate is to measure the parties' gains against what they would have gained in a “hypothetical competitive market,” where there was relatively complete information. On this view, there is no independent standard of a “just price” for goods such as a shovel or a kidney, nor need we accept whatever the actual market yields, given the market's sundry imperfections. Rather, we evaluate the parties' gains by what they would have received under relatively perfect market conditions, just as we may try to determine the “fair market value” or a home by what the home would sell for under relatively perfect market conditions in that locale.

It might be thought that exploitation (at least when it is morally objectionable) is confined to cases in which the exploitee is less well-off than the exploiter. Although most cases of exploitation will probably fit this pattern, exploitation is not confined to such cases. We might think, for example, that a store owner who charges an exorbitant price for the snow shovel is exploiting the customer, even if the customer is much wealthier than the store owner. On the present view, exploitation is transaction specific.

Although I am not sure that any available account of fair transactions provides the solution we need, some transactions are intuitively quite unfair even though they are advantageous to both parties. So let us assume that, in principle, some account of unfair transactions can be given. The question now arises as to whether an unfair transaction is always exploitative or whether A exploits B only if there is some defect in the process that culminates in B's decision.


As we have seen, it seems plausible to argue that A does not exploit B simply because there is unfairness in the distribution of rewards. If B voluntarily agrees to what might otherwise be a maldistribution of advantages, as when B voluntarily decides to make a gift of goods or labor to A, then it seems wrong to say that A has exploited B. It would, for example, be odd (although perhaps not impossible) to claim that a hospital exploits its volunteer workers just because the workers are volunteers rather than paid employees. So it seems that a relationship or transaction is exploitative only if there is some defect in the process by which it came about.

Interestingly, both Marxists and libertarians accept the view that voluntary transactions cannot be exploitative. Marxists tend to adopt a “force inclusive definition” of exploitation. Marxists do not say that capitalists exploit their workers in spite of the fact that the workers voluntarily agree to their employment status. They argue that workers are exploited only because they do not voluntarily agree to their employment status. Marxists concede that the proletariat is not enslaved, because they are not tied to any particular employer, but they transfer their labor to the capitalist under the “dull compulsion of economic relations.” (Elster 1983, 277-78). Libertarians can be understood as accepting this “force inclusive” definition of exploitation, but come to the opposite conclusion. They maintain that since market transactions are not coerced, the workers are therefore not exploited. We do not need to accept these alternatives. Leaving aside just how to distinguish between nonconsensual and consensual exploitation, A can arguably exploit B even if B is not coerced (or defrauded), even if there is nothing untoward about B's decision within her objective situation.

Let us press this issue a bit further. There are some instances of alleged exploitation in which the issue of consent does not seem to arise. There are cases in which the exploitee may be entirely passive. A may sell photographs of B without B's knowledge, or rob a purse from a sleeping B or follow B's taillights in a dense fog. In these cases, B's will is not involved. Call this nonvolitional exploitation. If nonvolitional exploitation operates without the engagement of B's will, then nonconsensual exploitation operates against B's will, as when A coerces B or deceives B. The question now arises as to when there is such a procedural defect.

In general, A coerces B to do X only if A proposes (threatens) to make B worse off with reference to some baseline condition if B chooses not do X, although specifying the appropriate baseline against which to measure the proposal can be a complicated matter. (Wertheimer, 1987) If A gets B to pay A $100 per week by threatening to bomb B's store if he does not pay up, then A coerces B into paying $100 a week. By contrast, if A gets B to pay A $100 per week by proposing to clean B's store each night, then A has made a non-coercive (or inducive) offer to B. A does not propose to worsen B's situation if B rejects A's proposal. On this view, A does not coerce B in the cases involving organ sales or commercial surrogacy, because A does not propose to worsen B's situation if B rejects A's proposal.

Fraud also undermines the validity of B's consent. Suppose that A offers to sell B a car for $10,000. A tells B that the car has been driven only 50,000 miles, but has set back the odometer from 90,000 to 50,000. B has not given valid consent, because valid consent must be informed (or not misinformed) as well as uncoerced.

By contrast with cases of coercion and fraud, there are at least some cases of alleged exploitation in which B's consent is not defective in either of these ways. In many cases of alleged exploitation, A gets B to agree to a mutually advantageous transaction to which B would not have agreed under better or perhaps more just background conditions, where A has played no direct causal role in creating those circumstances, where A has no special obligation to repair those conditions, and where B is fully informed as to the consequences of various choices. Although B might prefer to have a different range of options available to him, she can make a perfectly rational choice among the various options. Such conditions may (or may not) obtain in cases such as commercial surrogacy, organ sales, and, say, our snow shovel case.

It might be objected that perfectly rational and (otherwise) uncoerced choices are not appropriately consensual if made under conditions of desperation or from an inequality of bargaining power, or under unjust background conditions. But even if we refer to such transactions as nonconsensual, we would still have to contrast the cases that are nonconsensual because of coercion or fraud and those that are allegedly nonconsensual in other ways. And we will still have to ask what the moral force of such exploitation amounts to: Should we prohibit A from making such proposals? Should we refuse to enforce agreements made under such conditions? And that brings us to the moral force of exploitation.

4. The Moral Force of Exploitation

I have suggested that exploitation provides a moral description of a transaction, but that its moral force is less clear. The moral force of harmful and nonconsensual exploitation is relatively unproblematic. Whatever the added moral importance of the gain to A from the harm to B, it is certainly at least prima facie wrong for A to harm B and it seems that the state is at least prima facie justified in prohibiting or refusing to enforce such transactions.

Mutually advantageous transactions present a more difficult set of problems. Even if a transaction between A and B is unfair, it might be thought that there can be nothing seriously wrong about an agreement from which both parties benefit, particularly if A has no obligation to enter into any transaction with B. Moreover, even if there is something seriously wrong about such transactions, it might be argued that it could not be a wrong that would justify state intervention. Recall the snow shovel case. Even if A acts wrongly or fails to act virtuously, it is arguable that A does not harm anyone or violate anyone's rights, and only harm or rights violations justify state intervention. If the state cannot force A to sell the shovel to B, it might be thought completely irrational for the state to prohibit A and B from entering into a consensual and mutually advantageous transaction.

Perhaps this view is correct. Bracketing arguments based on externalities, it seems perfectly plausible to maintain that the state is justified in interfering with transactions only if one party is violating the other's rights. That said, those who invoke the concept of exploitation frequently maintain that such exploitation provides a reason for state intervention. For example, when it is claimed that commercial surrogacy exploits the birth mothers, the critics typically argue that surrogacy contracts should be unenforceable or entirely prohibited. Similar things are said about the sale of bodily organs. Those who make such arguments do frequently claim that the transactions are nonconsensual or harmful, but they seem prepared to make such arguments even if the transactions are consensual and mutually advantageous.

On what grounds might we justify interfering with consensual and mutually advantageous exploitative transactions? It might be thought that we could interfere on paternalistic grounds. A paternalistic argument could not justify interfering with exploitative transactions if the exploitative transaction is advantageous to the exploitee and if interference is not likely to result in a transaction that is more beneficial to B. For paternalism justifies interfering for someone's good, and this interference would not be to the target's benefit. But there might be situations in which B knows enough to agree only to those exploitative transactions that are beneficial (as compared with no transaction), but does not know that less exploitative transactions are available. And so there may be a “soft paternalist” justification for interference with some mutually advantageous exploitative transactions.

We might also justify interfering with exploitative transactions on strategic grounds. Suppose that A enjoys a monopoly position, say, as a potential rescuer of B. If we prohibit A from charging an exorbitant price for his services, then A might offer his services for a reasonable price. This argument would not justify interfering in a highly competitive market, for, under such conditions, A would not and could not offer his services for a better price. But there may be numerous situations in which such strategic arguments can work. (Wertheimer 1996).

Can we justify interfering with mutually advantageous and consensual transactions on perfectionist or moralistic grounds? That is more difficult. Joel Feinberg has maintained that because mutually advantageous exploitation is not harmful, such exploitation would constitute a “free-floating evil,” a wrong that is bad for no one. “In these cases there is no wrongful loss for the exploitee, who can himself have no grievance.” (Feinberg 1988, 176). There are two questions here: is mutually advantageous exploitation a free-floating evil? and free-floating or not, can we justify interfering with immoral transactions on the ground that they are immoral?

Is mutually advantageous exploitation a free-floating evil? I think not. Suppose that B and C both need blood transfusions, and that the only available blood is compatible with B's blood type, but not with C's blood type. There are only two possible worlds: (1) No Transfusion, where neither B nor C gets a transfusion; (2) Transfusion, where B gets the transfusion and C does not. In this case, to say that it would be wrong—in any way—to give the transfusion to B would seem to involve a “free-floating evil.” Giving the transfusion to B is good for B and bad for no one, including C, for there is no feasible alternative world in which C could have gained.

But the world of mutually advantageous exploitation is not like this. Recall the “snow shovel” example. Here there are, let us say, three feasible alternative worlds: (1) Transaction 1, where A sells B a shovel for an exorbitant $30; (2) Transaction 2, where A sells B a shovel for the normal price of $15; (3) no transaction. Is Transaction 1 better for A and worse for no one? Yes and No. Yes, when compared to the No Transaction baseline. No, when compared with Transaction 2. By comparison with Transaction 2, the “wrong” in Transaction 1 is not free floating. B is not harmed in Transaction 1, but B's interests are clearly negatively affected by A's choice to engage in Transaction 1 as contrasted with Transaction 2. To say that the wrong involved in mutually advantageous exploitation is not free floating does not establish its moral force. There might be good reason for the state to stay its hand. But even if there are good reasons not to interfere with most cases of mutually advantageous exploitation, it does not follow that exploitation is morally trivial. The disposition not to take unfair advantage of one's fellows may be among the more important moral virtues and a necessary condition of civilized life, even if there are also good reasons for not penalizing the failure to display that virtue.

Even if exploitation is seriously wrong, it may not be the worst form of injustice or inequality. Suppose that social justice requires a relatively egalitarian distribution of resources. If an inequality between A and B is exploitative only if there is some causal relationship between A's and B's positions, then many injustices will have nothing to do with exploitation. Although it may be unjust that A has much more than B, A's having more may have nothing to do with B's having little. Consider the exploitation of labor. Some people are more productive than others, albeit often because of morally irrelevant factors, such as social background or native talents.

If we exploit people when we fail to reward them in proportion to their productive contribution, then the low contributors may not be exploited. (Nagel 1991, 99-100) Indeed, if the high contributors are taxed to provide for the needs of the low contributors, they might maintain that it is they who are being exploited. Consider the unemployed. If the unemployed are not exploited because they “do not produce any surplus value for the capitalist to appropriate,” we may well conclude that being excluded from the labor system is much worse than being exploited in the system. (Kymlicka, 176). Still, even if exploitative inequality is not always morally worse than non-exploitative inequality, it is an interesting and important question as to whether and in what ways the inequalities and suffering that arise from exploitation have a special call on our moral attention.


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