Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Sun Jan 5, 2003; substantive revision Thu Oct 12, 2006

Federalism is the theory or advocacy of federal political orders, where final authority is divided between sub-units and a center. Unlike a unitary state, sovereignty is constitutionally split between at least two territorial levels so that units at each level have final authority and can act independently of the others in some area. Citizens thus have political obligations to two authorities. The allocation of authority between the sub-unit and center may vary, typically the center has powers regarding defense and foreign policy, but sub-units may also have international roles. The sub-units may also participate in central decision-making bodies. Much recent philosophical attention is spurred by renewed political interest in federalism, coupled with empirical findings concerning the requisite and legitimate basis for stability and trust among citizens in federations. Philosophical contributions have addressed the dilemmas and opportunities facing Canada, Australia and Europe, to mention just a few areas where federal arrangements are seen as interesting solutions to accommodating differences among populations divided by ethnic or cultural cleavages yet seeking a common political order.

1. Taxonomy

Several species of federal orders may be distinguished, and much valuable work contributes to distinguishing and explicating the central terms (cf. Wheare 1964, King 1982, Elazar 1987a, Riker 1993, Watts 1998).

Federations are here taken to involve territorial divisions of authority, typically entrenched in the constitution which neither a sub-unit nor the center can alter unilaterally. In comparison, decentralized authority in unitary states can be revoked by the central legislative authority at will. Such entrenchments notwithstanding, some centralization often occurs owing to the constitutional interpretations by a federal level court in charge of settling conflicts regarding the scopes of final legislative and/or judicial authority.

In contrast, confederations have weaker centers than federations do. Typically, in a confederation a) sub-units may legally exit, b) the center only exercises authority delegated by sub-units, c) the center is subject to sub-unit veto on many issues, d) center decisions only bind sub-units but not citizens directly, e) the center lacks an independent fiscal or electoral base, and/or f) the sub-units do not cede authority permanently to the center. Confederations are often based on agreements for specific tasks, and the common government may be completely exercised by delegates of the sub-unit governments. Thus many would count as confederations the North American states during 1776-1787, Switzerland 1291-1847, and the present European Union.

In asymmetric (con)federations the sub-units have different bundles of authority; some may for instance have special rights regarding language or culture.

If the decisions made centrally do not involve sub-units at all, we may speak of Separate (Split or Compact) federalism. The USA is often given as example, since the two Senators from each state are not representing or selected by sub-unit (State) authorities but by electors voted directly by citizens — though this is by sub-unit decision (U.S. Constitution Art. II Section 1; cf. Dahl 2001). Federations can involve sub-units in central decision-making in at least two different ways in various forms of interlocking (or cooperative) federalism. Sub-unit representatives can participate within central bodies — in cabinets or legislatures - (collective agency/compositional arrangement); in addition they often constitute one central body that interacts with other such bodies, for instance where sub-unit government representatives form an Upper House with power to veto or postpone decisions by majority or qualified majority vote (divided agency/relational arrangements).

Two processes of federalism may be identified (Stepan 1999). Independent states may come together by ceding or pooling sovereign powers in certain domains for the sake of goods otherwise unattainable, such as security or economic prosperity. Such ’coming together’  federations are typically arranged to constrain the center and prevent majorities from overriding a sub-unit. Examples include the present USA, Switzerland, and Australia. ’Holding together’ federations develop from unitary states, as governments’ response to alleviate threats of secession by territorially clustered minorities. Such federations often grant some sub-units particular domains of sovereignty e.g. over language and cultural rights in an asymmetric federation, while maintaining broad scope of action for the central government and majorities. Examples include India, Belgium, Canada and Spain.

In addition to federations, other interesting alternatives to unitary states occur when non-territorial sub-units are constituted by groups sharing ethnic, religious or other characteristics. Karl Renner and Otto Bauer explored such arrangements for geographically dispersed cultural minorities, allowing them some cultural and ”personal” autonomy without territorial self rule (Bauer 1903; Renner 1907; Bottomore and Goode 1978; cf. Tamir 1993). Consociations consist of somewhat insulated groups in sub-units who in addition are represented in central institutions often governing by unanimity rather than by majority (Lijphart 1977).

2. History of Federalism in Western Thought until 1900

Johannes Althusius (1557-1630) is often regarded as the father of modern federalist thought. He argued in Politica Methodice Digesta (Althusius 1603) for autonomy of his city Emden, both against its Lutheran provincial Lord and against the Catholic Emperor. Althusius was strongly influenced by French Huguenots and Calvinism. As a permanent minority in several states, Calvinists developed a doctrine of resistance as the right and duty of "natural leaders" to resist tyranny. Orthodox Calvinists insisted on sovereignty in the social circles subordinate only to God's laws. The French Protestant Huguenots developed a theory of legitimacy further, presented 1579 by an author with the telling pseudonym "Junius Brutus" in Vindiciae Contra Tyrannos. The people, regarded as a corporate body in territorial hierarchical communities, has a God-granted right to resist rulers without rightful claim. Rejecting theocracy, Althusius developed a non-sectarian, non-religious contractualist political theory of federations that prohibited state intervention even for purposes of promoting the right faith. Accommodation of dissent and diversity prevailed over any interest in subordinating political powers to religion or vice versa.

Fundamentally dependent on others for the reliable provision of requirements of a comfortable and holy life, humans require communities and associations that are both instrumentally and intrinsically important for supporting [subsidia] their needs. Families, guilds, cities, provinces, states and other associations owe their legitimacy and claims to political power to their various roles in enabling a holy life, rather than to individuals' interest in autonomy. Each association claims autonomy within its own sphere against intervention by other associations. Borrowing a term originally used for the alliance between God and men, Althusius holds that associations enter into secular agreements — pactum foederis — to live together in mutual benevolence.

Ludolph Hugo ((ca.) 1630–1704) was the first to distinguish confederations based on alliances, decentralized unitary states such as the Roman Empire, and federations, characterized by ‘double governments’ with territorial division of powers, in De Statu Regionum Germanie (1661) (cf. Elazar 1998; Riley 1976).

In The Spirit of Laws (1748) Charles de Secondat, Baron de Montesquieu (1689-1755) argued for confederal arrangements to ensure the ideal scale of government required for political liberty understood as non-domination — that is, security against abuse of power. A ‘confederate republic’ with separation of powers secures the requisite homogeneity, identification and self-sacrifice within sufficiently small sub-units where the common good subdues private interests thus preventing tyranny and ‘internal imperfection’. The sub-units pool powers sufficient to secure external security, reserving the right to secede (Book 9, 1). Sub-units also serve as checks on each other, since other sub-units may intervene to quell insurrection and power abuse in one sub-unit.

David Hume (1711-1776) disagreed with Montesquieu that smaller size is better. Instead, "in a large democracy ... there is compass and room enough to refine the democracy." In "Idea of a Perfect Commonwealth" (Hume 1752) Hume recommended a federal arrangement for deliberation of laws involving both sub-unit and central legislatures. Sub-units enjoy several powers and partake in central decisions, but their laws and court judgments can always be overruled by the central bodies, hence it seems that Hume’s model is not federal as the term is used here. He held that such a numerous and geographically large system would do better than small cities in preventing decisions based on “intrigue, prejudice or passion” against the public interest.

Several 18th century peace plans for Europe recommended confederal arrangements. The 1713 Peace Plan of Abbé Charles de Saint-Pierre (1658-1743) would allow intervention in sub-units to quell rebellion and wars on non-members to force them to join an established confederation, and required unanimity for changes to the agreement.

Jean-Jacques Rousseau (1712-1778) presented and critiqued Saint-Pierre’s proposal, listing several conditions including that all major power must be member, that the joint legislation must be binding, that the joint forces must be stronger than any single state, and that secession must be illegal. Again, unanimity was required for changes to the agreement.

Immanuel Kant (1724-1804) defended a confederation for peace in On Perpetual Peace (1796). His Second Definite Article of a Perpetual Peace holds that the right of Nations shall be based on a pacific federation among free states rather than a peace treaty or an international state: "This federation does not aim to acquire any power like that of a state, but merely to preserve and secure the freedom of each state in itself, along with that of the other confederated states, although this does not mean that they need to submit to public laws and to a coercive power which enforces them, as do men in a state of nature."

The Articles of Confederation of 1781 among the 13 American states fighting British rule had established a center too weak for law enforcement, defense and for securing interstate commerce. What has become known as the U.S. Constitutional Convention met May 25 — September 17 1787. It was explicitly restricted to revise the Articles, but ended up recommending more fundamental changes. The proposed constitution prompted widespread debate arguments addressing the benefits and risks of federalism versus confederal arrangements, leading eventually to the Constitution taking effect in 1789.

The "Anti-federalists" were fearful of undue centralization. They worried that the powers of central authorities were not sufficiently constrained e.g. by a bill of rights (John DeWitt 1787, Richard Henry Lee) — which was eventually ratified in 1791. They also feared that the center might gradually usurp the sub-units’ powers. Citing Montesquieu, another pseudonymous ‘Brutus' doubted whether a republic of such geographical size with so many inhabitants with conflicting interests could avoid tyranny and would allow common deliberation and decision based on local knowledge (Brutus (Robert Yates?) 1787).

In what has become known as The Federalist Papers, James Madison (1751-1836), Alexander Hamilton (1755-1804) and John Jay (1745-1829) argued vigorously for the suggested model of interlocking federal arrangements (Federalist 10, 45, 51, 62). Madison and Hamilton agreed with Hume that the risk of tyranny by passionate majorities was reduced in larger republics where sub-units of shared interest could and would check each other: "A rage for paper money, for an abolition of debts, for an equal division of property, or for any improper or wicked project, will be less likely to pervade the whole body of the Union than a particular member of it." (Federalist 10). Splitting sovereignty between sub-unit and center would also protect individuals’ rights against abuse by authorities at either level, or so believed Hamilton, quoting Montesquieu at length to this effect (Federalist 9).

Noting the problems of allocating powers correctly, Madison supported placing some authority with sub-units since they would be best fit to address “local circumstances and lesser interests” otherwise neglected by the center (Federalist 37).

Madison and Hamilton urged centralized powers of defense and interstate commerce (Federalist 11, 23), and argued for the need to solve coordination and assurance problems of partial compliance, through two new means: Centralized enforcement and direct applicability of central decisions to individuals(Federalist 16, also noted by Tocqueville 1945). They were wary of granting sub-units veto power typical of confederal arrangements, since that would render the center weak and cause “tedious delays; continual negotiation and intrigue; contemptible compromises of the public good.” (Madison and Hamilton, Federalist 22; and cf. 20).

They were particularly concerned to address worries of undue centralization, arguing that such worries should be addressed not by constraining the extent of power in the relevant fields, such as defense, but instead by the composition of the central authority (Federalist 31). They also claimed that the people would maintain stronger "affection, esteem, and reverence" towards the sub-unit government owing to its public visibility in the day-to-day administration of criminal and civil justice (Federalist 17).

John Stuart Mill (1806-1873), in chapter 17 of Considerations on Representative Government (1861), recommended federations among "portions of mankind" not disposed to live under a common government, to prevent wars among themselves and protect against aggression. He would also allow the center sufficient powers so as to ensure all benefits of union — including powers to prevent frontier duties to facilitate commerce. He listed three necessary conditions for a federation: sufficient mutual sympathy "of race, language, religion, and, above all, of political institutions, as conducing most to a feeling of identity of political interest"; no sub-unit so powerful as to not require union for defense nor tempt unduly to secession; and rough equality of strength among sub-units to prevent internal domination by one or two. Mill also claimed among the benefits of federations that they reduce the number of weak states hence reduce temptation to aggression, ending wars and restrictions on commence among sub-units; and that federations are less aggressive, only using their power defensively.

Pierre-Joseph Proudhon (1809-1865), in Du Principe fédératif (1863) defended federalism as the best way to retain individual liberty within ‘natural’ communities such as families and guilds who enter pacts among themselves for necessary and specific purposes. The state is only one of several non-sovereign agents in charge of coordinating, without final authority.

Philosophical reflections on federalism during the 20th century has addressed several issues, including reasons for federalism to concerns for stability, the legitimate allocation of authority between sub-unit and center, distributive justice and challenges to received democratic theory.

3. Reasons for Federalism

Many arguments for federalism have traditionally been put in terms of promoting various forms of liberty in the form of non-domination, immunity or enhanced opportunity sets (Elazar 1987a). When considering reasons offered in the literature for federal political orders, many appear to be in favor of decentralization without requiring constitutional entrenchment of split authority. Two sets of arguments can be distinguished: Arguments favoring federal orders compared with secession and completely independent sovereign states; and arguments supporting federal arrangements rather than a (further) centralized unitary state. They occur in different forms and from different starting points, in defense of ’coming together’ federalism, and in favor of ’holding together’ federalism.

3.1 Reasons for a federal order rather than separate states or secession

- Federations may foster peace, in the senses of preventing wars and preventing fears of war, in several ways. States can join a (con)federation to become jointly powerful enough to dissuade external aggressors, and/or to prevent aggressive and preemptive wars among themselves. The confederate American states moved to a federation largely for the first of these reasons, since the center powers of the Confederacy were too weak for protection from external threats. The European federalists Altieri Spinelli, Ernesto Rossi and Eugenio Colorni argued the latter in the 1941 Ventotene Manifesto: Only a European federation could prevent war between totalitarian, aggressive states. Such arguments assume, of course, that the (con)federation will not become more aggressive than each state separately, a point Mill argued.

- Federations can promote economic prosperity by removing internal barriers to trade, through economies of scale, by establishing and maintaining inter-sub-unit trade agreements, or by becoming a sufficiently large global player to affect international trade regimes (for the latter regarding the EU, cf. Keohane and Nye 2001, 260).

- Federal arrangements may protect individuals against political authorities by constraining state sovereignty, placing some powers with the center. By entrusting the center with authority to intervene in sub-units, the federal arrangements can protect minorities’ human rights against sub-unit authorities (Federalist, Watts 1999). Such arguments assume, of course, that abuse by the center is less likely.

- Federations can facilitate other ends where credible commitments, coordination or control over ‘spill-over’ effects and externalities by sovereign states is desired but difficult to ensure without transferring some powers to a common body. Since cooperation in some areas can create a need for further coordination in other sectors, federations often exhibit creeping centralization.

- Federal arrangements may enhance the political influence of formerly sovereign governments, both by facilitating coordination, and - particularly for small states — by giving these sub-units influence or even veto over policy making, rather than remaining mere policy takers.

- Federal political orders can be preferred as the appropriate form of nested organizations, for instance in ’organic’ conceptions of the political and social order. The federation may promote cooperation, justice or other values among and within sub-units as well as among and within their constituent units, for instance by monitoring, legislating, enforcing or funding agreements, human rights, immunity from interference, or development. Starting with the family, each larger unit responsible for facilitating the flourishing of sub-units and securing common goods beyond the reach of sub-units without a common authority. Such arguments have been offered by such otherwise divergent authors as Althusius, the Catholic traditions of subsidiarity as expressed by pope Leo XIII (1891) and Pius XI (1931), and Proudhon.

3.2 Reasons for preferring federal orders over a unitary state

- Federal arrangements may protect against central authorities by securing immunity and non-domination. Constitutional allocation of powers to a sub-unit protects individuals from the center, while interlocking arrangements provide influence on central decisions via sub-unit bodies (Madison, Hume, Goodin 1996). Sub-units may thus check central authorities and prevent undue action contrary to the will of minorities: "A great democracy must either sacrifice self-government to unity or preserve it by federalism. The coexistence of several nations under the same State is a test, as well as the best security of its freedom . . . The combination of different nations in one State is as necessary a condition of civilized life as the combination of men in society" (Acton 1907, 277).

- Federal orders may increase the opportunities for citizen participation in public decision-making; through deliberation and offices in both sub-unit and central bodies that ensures character formation through political participation among more citizens (Mill 1861, ch. 15).

- Federations may facilitate efficient preference maximization more generally, as formalized in the literature on economic and fiscal federalism - though many such arguments support decentralization rather than federalism proper.

Research on ’fiscal federalism’ addresses the optimal allocation of authority, typically recommending central redistribution while local provision of public goods. Federations may thus allow optimal matching of the authority to create public goods to specific affected subsets of the populations. If individuals' preferences vary systematically by territory according to external or internal parameters such as geography or shared tastes and values, federal — or decentralized — arrangements that allow local variation are favored, for several reasons. Local decisions prevent decision-making from becoming overloaded, and local decision-makers may also have a better grasp of affected preferences and alternatives, making for better service than would be provided by a central government that tends to ignore local preference variations (Smith 1776, 680). Granting powers to population subsets that share preferences regarding public services may also increase efficiency by allowing these subsets to create such ‘internalities’ at costs borne only by them (Musgrave 1959, 179-80, Olson 1969, Oates’ 1972 ’Decentralization Theorem’). Federal arrangements also shelter territorially based groups with preferences that diverge from the majority population, such as ethnic or cultural minorities, so that they are not subject to majority decisions severely or systematically contrary to their preferences. Non-unitary arrangements may thus minimize coercion and be responsive to as many citizens as possible (Mill 1861 ch. 15, Elazar 1968; Lijphart 1999). Such considerations of economic efficiency and majority decisions may favor federal solutions, with "only indivisibilities, economies of scale, externalities, and strategic requirements ... acceptable as efficiency arguments in favor of allocating powers to higher levels of government" (Padou-Schioppa 1995, 155).

- Federal arrangements may promote mobility and hence territorial clustering of individuals with similar preferences, and allow sub-unit autonomy to experiment and compete for individuals who are free to move where their preferences are best met. Such mobility towards sub-units with like-minded individuals adds to the benefits of local autonomy over the provision of public services — absent economies of scale and externalities (Tiebout 1956, Buchanan 2001).

4. Further Philosophical Issues

Much recent attention has focused on philosophical issues arising from empirical findings concerning federalism, and has been spurred by dilemmas facing Canada, Australia and Europe.

4.1 Sources of Stability

As political orders go, (con)federal political arrangements pose peculiar problems concerning stability and trust. Federations tend toward disintegration in the form of secession, or toward centralization in the direction of a unitary state. Such instability should come as no surprise given the tensions typically giving rise to federations in the first place. Federations are often marked by a high level of ’constitutional politics’: Political parties often disagree on constitutional issues regarding the appropriate areas of sub-unit autonomy, the forms of cooperation and how to prevent fragmentation. Such sampling bias among states that federalize to hold together makes it difficult to assess claims that federal responses perpetuate cleavages and fuel rather than quell secessionist movements. Some nevertheless argue that democratic, interlocking federations alleviate such tendencies (Simeon 1998, Simeon and Conway 2001, Linz 1997; cf. McKay 2001, Filippov, Ordeshook and Shvetsova 2004).

Many authors note that the challenges of stability must be addressed not only by institutional design, but also by ensuring that citizens have an ‘overarching loyalty’ to the federation as whole in addition to loyalty toward their own sub-unit (Franck 1968, Linz 1997). The legitimate bases, content and division of such a public dual allegiance are central topics of political philosophies of federalism (Norman 1995a, Choudhry 2001). Some accept (limited) appeals to considerations such as shared history, practices, culture, or ethnicity for delineating sub-units and placing certain powers with them, even if such ‘communitarian’ features are regarded as more problematic bases for (unitary) political orders (Kymlicka 1995, Habermas 1996, 500). The appropriate consideration that voters and their sub-unit politicians should give to the interests of others in the federation in interlocking arrangements must be clarified if the notion of citizen of two commonwealths is to be coherent and durable.

4.2 Allocation of Authority

Another central topic is the critical assessment of alleged grounds for federal arrangements in general, and the allocation of authority between sub-units and central bodies in particular, indicated in the preceding sections. A related important issue is who shall have the authority to make such allocations and changes (Recent contributions include Knop et al. 1995, Kymlicka 2001, Kymlicka and Norman 2000, Nicolaidis and Howse 2001).

The “Principle of Subsidiarity” has recently received attention owing to its inclusion in European Union treaties. It holds that authority should rest with the sub-units unless allocating them to a central unit would ensure higher comparative efficiency or effectiveness in achieving certain goals. This principle can be specified in several ways, for instance concerning which units are included, which goals are to be achieved, and who has the authority to apply it. The principle has multiple pedigrees, and came to recent political prominence largely through its role in quelling fears of centralization in Europe - a contested role which the principle has not quite filled (Fleiner and Schmitt 1996, Burgess and Gagnon 1993, Follesdal 1998).

4.3 Distributive Justice

Regarding distributive justice, federal political orders must manage tensions between ensuring sub-unit autonomy and securing the requisite redistribution within and among the sub-units. Indeed, the Federalists regarded federal arrangements as an important safeguard against “the equal division of property” (Federalist 10). The political scientists Linz and Stephan may be seen as finding support for the Federalists’ hypothesis: Compared to unitary states in the OECD, the ‘coming together’ federations tend to have higher child poverty rate in solo mother households and a higher percentage of population over-sixty living in poverty. Linz and Stepan explain this inequality as stemming from the ‘demos constraining’ arrangements of these federations, seeking to protect individuals and sub-units from central authorities, combined with a weak party system. By comparison, the Constitution of Germany (not a ’coming together’ federation) explicitly requires equalization of living conditions among the sub-units (Art. 72.2) Normative arguments may also support some distributive significance of federal arrangements, for instance owing to legitimate trade-offs between sub-unit autonomy and redistributive claims among sub-units (Follesdal 2001). A central normative issue is to what extent a shared culture and bonds among citizens within a historically sovereign state reduce the claims on inter-sub-unit redistribution.

4.4 Democratic Theory

Federalism raises several challenges to democratic theory, especially as developed for unitary states. Federal arrangements are often more complex, thereby challenging standards of transparency and accountability. The restricted political agendas of each center of authority also require defense (Dahl 1983; Braybrooke 1983).

The power that sub-units wield in federations often restricts or violates majority rule, in ways that merit careful scrutiny. Federal political orders typically influence individuals’ political influence by skewing their voting weight in favor of citizens of small sub-units, or by granting sub-unit representatives veto rights on central decisions. Minorities thus exercise control in apparent violation of principles of political equality and one-person-one-vote — more so when sub-units are of different size. These features raises fundamental normative questions concerning why sub-units should matter for the allocation of political power among individuals who live in different sub-units.

Federations are often thought to be ’sui generis’ , one-of-a-kind deviations from the ideal-type unitary sovereign state familiar from the Westphalian world order. Indeed, every federation may well be federal in its very own way, and not easy to summarize and assess as an ideal-type political order. Yet the phenomenon of non-unitary sovereignty is not new, and federal accommodation of differences may well be better than the alternatives. When and why this is so has long been the subject of philosophical, theoretical and normative analysis and reflection. Such arguments may also contribute to the overarching loyalty required among citizens of stable, legitimate federations, who must understand themselves as members of two commonwealths.




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authority | Hume, David | Kant, Immanuel | liberty | Mill, John Stuart | Montesquieu, Charles-Louis de Secondat, Baron de | Proudhon, Pierre | Rousseau, Jean Jacques | sovereignty