Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

John Stuart Mill

First published Thu Jan 3, 2002; substantive revision Tue Jul 10, 2007

John Stuart Mill (1806-1873), British philosopher, economist, moral and political theorist, and administrator, was the most influential English-speaking philosopher of the nineteenth century. His views are of continuing significance, and are generally recognized to be among the deepest and certainly the most effective defenses of empiricism and of a liberal political view of society and culture. The overall aim of his philosophy is to develop a positive view of the universe and the place of humans in it, one which contributes to the progress of human knowledge, individual freedom and human well-being. His views are not entirely original, having their roots in the British empiricism of John Locke, George Berkeley and David Hume, and in the utilitarianism of Jeremy Bentham. But he gave them a new depth, and his formulations were sufficiently articulate to gain for them a continuing influence among a broad public.

1. Life

John Stuart Mill was born in Pentonville, then a suburb of London. He was the eldest son of James Mill, a Scotsman who had come to London and become a leading figure in the group of philosophical radicals which aimed to further the utilitarian philosophy of Jeremy Bentham. John Stuart Mill's mother was Harriet Barrow, who seems to have had very little influence upon him. James Mill's income was at first slight, as he struggled to make his living as a reviewer. But his History of India secured him a position in the East India Company and he rose to the post of Chief Examiner, in effect the chief administrator of the Company. In spite of these duties and the work they entailed James spent considerable time on the education of his eldest son. The latter began to learn Greek at three and Latin at eight. By the age of fourteen he had read most of the Greek and Latin classics, had made a wide survey of history, had done extensive work in logic and mathematics, and had mastered the basics of economic theory. This education was undertaken according to the principle of Bentham's associationist psychology, and aimed to make of the younger Mill a leader in views of the philosophical radicals.

At fifteen John Stuart Mill undertook the study of Bentham's various fragments on the theory of legal evidence. These had an inspiring influence on him, fixing in him his life-long goal of reforming the world in the interest of human well-being. At eighteen he spent considerable time and effort at editing these manuscripts into the long coherent treatise that they became in his hands. Guided by his father he threw himself into the work of the philosophical radicals, and began an active literary career. Shortly thereafter, in 1823, his father secured him a junior position in the East India Company. He rose in the ranks, eventually to occupy his father's position of Chief Examiner. A visit to France in 1820 had made Mill thoroughly fluent in the language, and he became a life-long student of French thought and history.

In 1826, Mill suffered a sudden attack of intense depression. This lasted for many months. He continued his work, and indeed even his political activities, but internally he felt that his former goals were without worth. He came to believe that his capacity for emotion had been severely weakened by his father's rigorous training in analysis. His intellect had been educated but not his feelings. In the reading of Wordsworth's poetry he found something of the cure that he needed, and the depression gradually disappeared.

Mill met Gustave d'Eichtahl in 1828. D'Eichtahl was a follower of St. Simon, and introduced Mill to the latter and to works of Auguste Comte. Mill also met John Sterling who was a disciple of Coleridge. Through these thinkers Mill came to appreciate the role of social and cultural institutions in the historical development of human beings. He became convinced of the Comtean view that social change proceeds through “critical periods,” in which old institutions are overthrown, followed “organic periods,” in which new forms of social cohesion emerge and are consolidated. He came to believe with these French thinkers that in his own time society was emerging from a critical period. From Coleridge he came to view the educated class as the vehicle for ensuring social cohesion in the emerging organic period.

Mill now saw his task to be that of helping British society to emerge into the coming organic period. The merely negative polemics of Bentham and his father now seemed very limited. It became necessary not merely to criticize older forms of social organization but to work towards replacing them with something better. Moreover, the defenders of older forms of life should no longer be dismissed as representatives of vested interests. The very fact that the older forms had so long survived meant that they had some good in them, and their defenders should be seen not as reactionaries but as those who continue to recognize that good. If that good is now limited, it still must be acknowledged, and not merely dismissed.

Tactically, the social reformer in critical periods cannot proceed by formulating grand philosophic schemes, however correct they may be in principle. Rather he or she must work for piece-meal reform. Only gradually should general principles be proposed, so that the appearance of radical novelty will be avoided. Mill never abandoned his earlier acceptance of the principle of utility, but now used it positively, not just critically and destructively; he emphasized how it could be deployed constructively, enabling new forms of society to emerge, but ones which incorporate the best of the older forms. He now came to think that the democratic demands of the older radicals had to be tempered with a concern for the dangers which it posed for individualism.

In 1830 Mill was introduced to Harriet Taylor. Her husband was a druggist whose grandfather had once been a neighbor of James Mill. The younger Mill rapidly became intimate with Mrs. Taylor, who came to influence profoundly the rest of his life. She was an invalid who lived apart from her husband. The latter, while he lived, remained remarkably tolerant of the Platonic but very close relationship that Mill and his wife maintained. Mill's father highly disapproved of the connection. When Mill married Mrs. Taylor in 1851 two years after her husband's death there was a complete estrangement from his mother and sisters. Mill reports in his Autobiography that Harriet was of crucial significance to his intellectual and moral development. His father, though an Epicurean in principle, was in fact one who eschewed pleasure. His ends were rather a sort of rigid discipline of work: he never did free himself from the confines of Scots Calvinsim. It was reading Wordsworth that gave the younger Mill a sense of greater human possibilities. But it was Harriet Taylor who kept this sense alive, and continually strengthened his conception of the real end of human being is the progressive development of individuality in all, in women as well as men, in workers as well as aristocrats. It was she who imbued Mill with the sense that if these ends could be developed then it would become clear that at present human beings were enjoying only a small fraction of the happiness that was possible. It was she who gave Mill the expansive idea of the good that was to form the new utilitarian end that replaced the rather rigid and narrow ends described by Bentham and his father. As Mill insisted, she was indispensable to his later thought. He was nearly inconsolable when she died. It was during a trip to Europe in 1858 that she fell fatally ill and died at Avignon, where she is buried. For the rest of his life, Mill spent half a year at a house in Avignon so that he could be near to her grave.

Mill remarks in his essay on the Subjection of Women that

The most favourable case which a man can generally have for studying the character of a woman, is that of his own wife: for the opportunities are greater, and the cases of complete sympathy not so completely rare. And in fact, this is the source from which any knowledge worth having on the subject generally comes. But most men have not had the opportunity of studying in this way more than a single case: accordingly one can, to an almost laughable degree, infer what a man's wife is like, from his opinions about women in general. To make even this one case yield any result, the woman must be worth knowing, and the man not only a competent judge, but of a character sympathetic in itself, and so well adapted to hers, that he can either read her mind by sympathetic union, or has nothing in himself which makes her shy of disclosing it. Hardly anything can be more rare than this conjunction. (Subjection of Women, Chapter I)

This gives a sense of how Mill felt about his own relationship with Harriet Taylor.

In 1823 Mill had entered the employ of the East India Company as a clerk. India was governed by the Company through correspondence between the Court of Directors in London and the Governors on the subcontinent. This was supervised by the Office of the Examiner of Indian Correspondence. Mill rose through the ranks, and for many years was in charge of the correspondence dealing with the princely states not under the direct rule of the Company. In 1856 he became Chief Examiner, in charge of all correspondence, succeeding another utilitarian, Thomas Love Peacock, who had succeeded James Mill. After the Indian Mutiny, the British parliament proposed the dissolution of the Company. Mill prepared a vigorous defense of the Company and of the government that it provided, but it was unsuccessful. He was offered a position on the new advisory council, but he declined. He retired on a reasonable pension in 1858.

In 1865 Mill was elected to the House of Commons. Given his reputation and his previous seclusion, his work was subject to immense attention. His performance was generally acclaimed, but he found himself at odds with the aims of his electors. He was unwilling to compromise his own principles, and as a consequence he failed in his attempt at re-election in 1868. He continued to work, as he had earlier in his life, for many radical causes. He was particularly concerned for the status of women. His later work was made easier by the cooperation of Mrs. Taylor's daughter, Helen, who in many respects took the latter's place in Mill's life. A number of his important works were published posthumously by Helen Taylor. Mill died in 1873 at Avignon, where he is buried next to his wife.

Mill made his philosophical reputation with his System of Logic, which he published in 1843; this work re-vitalized the study of logic, and provided for the remainder of the century the definitive account of the philosophy of science and social science. This was followed by The Principles of Political Economy in 1848; this defined the orthodox form of liberal principles for the next quarter century. In 1861 he published his only systematic treatise in first philosophy. This was his Examination of Sir William Hamilton's Philosophy, a comprehensive critique of the latter's rationalism and intuitionism. So effective was Mill's critique that this work effectively dated itself and is now unfortunately neglected. His two best-known works in moral philosophy were On Liberty and Utilitarianism, which appeared in 1859 and 1861 respectively. These are of continuing significance. His Considerations on Representative Government, published in 1851, is perhaps now less important than his essay on The Subjection of Women (1869). Mill's partially finished Autobiography was published, with additions by Helen Taylor, in 1873. She also saw for the posthumous publication in 1874 of his Three Essays on Religion.

John Robson has created a monument to Mill in his edition of Mill's Collected Works. All the Mill material is here, admirably introduced by various authors. Besides the standard works, and such things as his newspaper articles, there is also his correspondence. Among the latter there are many gems to be found. For example, there is his remark in his speech on the Reform Bill of 1866, where he proposed and defended universal suffrage and votes for women; this remark is in response to a comment by Conservative MP Sir John Pakington on a remark Mill had made elsewhere:

What I stated was, that the Conservative Party was, by the law of its constitution, necessarily the stupidest party. Now, I do not retract that assertion; but I did not mean to say that the Conservatives are generally stupid. I meant to say that stupid people are generally Conservative. I believe that is so obviously and universally admitted a principle that I hardly think any gentleman will deny it. (Public and Parliamentary Speeches, 31 May 1866, pp. 85-86.)

One finds Mill elsewhere also saying that

Stupidity is much the same the world over. A stupid person's notions and feelings may confidently be inferred from those which prevail in the circle by which the person is surrounded. Not so those whose opinions and feelings are emanations from their own nature and faculties. (Subjection of Women, Chapter I, p. 273)

The volumes are a pleasure to work with. The editing is excellent. The variants are unobtrusively noted, and one can trace with ease the various changes that appeared in later editions of such works as the System of Logic and the Political Economy. Students of Mill cannot but find these volumes invaluable: we are indebted to the editor for a job well done.

2. Language and Logic

In the System of Logic, Mill accepts the traditional doctrine that propositions as used to describe the world are divided into subject and predicate terms, or, as he would say, names, joined by a copula, either affirmative or negative. Among names there are singular and general. All names denote, either individuals or the attributes of individuals. Names are either singular or general. A general name connotes an attribute and denotes all individuals which have that attribute. Thus, ‘white’ connotes the attribute whiteness, and denotes all things that have that attribute. Some singular names only denote; they have no connotation. ‘Caesar’ is such a name. However, many singular names not only denote, they also have a connotation. Thus, ‘the conqueror of Gaul’ is a singular name. It denotes the same individual as is denoted by ‘Caesar’, but unlike ‘Caesar’ it also connotes; it connotes the attribute of being a conqueror of Gaul. In terms of logic, Mill is less concerned that later thinkers would be about the uniqueness implied by the connotation: Caesar is not only a conqueror of Gaul but the conqueror.

In a proposition, names are joined by a copula, either affirmative or negative. The meaning of a proposition—its “import”, as Mill says—is determined by the connotation of its parts, the sole exception being given in the case of proper names, where the meaning is determined by the denotation.

Where the import of a proposition is given by connotation, truth or falsity is determined by denotation. An affirmative proposition is true just in case that the thing or things denoted by the subject term are in the class of things denoted by the predicate term; otherwise it is false. Similarly, a negative proposition is true just in case that no thing denoted by the subject term is a member of the class of things denoted by the predicate term. Things and attributes are always such that any proposition is either true or false and not both. This states the Principles of Non-contradiction and of Excluded Middle. No thing or attribute is such that it can be said to be both wholly itself but also necessarily connected to something other than itself: each thing or attribute is logically and ontologically independent of every other thing or attribute.

Since the holding of these principles depends upon the systematic nature of things and their attributes, it follows that the truth of these principles is in the end a fact about the world and the things in the world—the deepest, perhaps, of all metaphysical facts about the world and the entities in it.

The world we talk about in our propositions is the world that we come to know in our ordinary sense experience or inner awareness. The ontology of the world as reflected in language and logic is the ontology of the world as we know it to be. Knowing the meaning of terms and therefore of the import of propositions is knowing the individuals and attributes which they denote and connote. As we know them in our ordinary experience these individuals and attributes are logically self-contained. The rationalists and the Aristotelians argued that beyond our ordinary experience of things we have intuitions—“rational” intuitions—of ontological connections that structure things in ways not apparent in our ordinary sense experience of the world. Empiricism is the claim that there is no such rational intuition and nothing in the ontology of the world beyond what we know in ordinary experience. The world of the empiricist is one without necessary connections among individuals and attributes. It is this deep fact about the world that is the metaphysical basis of the truth of the Principles of Non-contradiction and of Excluded Middle.

Mill is thus arguing that, while there are no objective necessary connections, there is nonetheless an objective basis for the necessity of logic, but that it is a fact about the ordinary world that forms this basis, a deep fact to be sure, but a fact nonetheless. It is experience which is the test of logic. More recently there have been philosophers of logic and mathematics such as G. Frege who have argued that the objectivity and necessity of logic requires in one's ontology, besides a world of ordinary things known by sense and the world of mental entities known by inner awareness, a third world of objective meanings. Mill clearly rejects, on empiricist grounds, any such third world: for him, the test for logic, as for anything else, is the ordinary world as we ordinarily experience it. In more recent terms, in logic and mathematics, as in epistemology and philosophy of science, Mill must be considered a naturalist. In this naturalism his views are in general similar to those of W. V. O. Quine.

There is no metaphysical necessity. All necessity is verbal, a matter of the import of propositions. A proposition is necessarily true in the case of connotative names just in case that the connotation of the names is by convention the same, as in ‘Bachelors are unmarried’. Since the connotations are the same, the set of individuals denoted by the subject term is identical with the set of individuals denoted by the predicate term, and the proposition is true, simply by virtue of the verbal conventions. In the case of proper names, where the terms do not connote, as in ‘Cicero is Cicero’, the individual denoted by the one term is precisely that denoted by the other, and so its truth is again verbal.

This account of the meaning of propositions is not complete. Mill does not consider the contrasting cases of ‘Cicero is Cicero’ and ‘Cicero is Tully’. Since ‘Cicero’ and ‘Tully’ are both proper names and therefore purely denotative, it would seem to follow on Mill's account that, contrary to fact, the two propositions have the same import. Later logicians would work hard to solve some of these difficulties in Mill's semantics. They would also have to work on problems arising from connotative proper names (“definite descriptions”).

Mill's empiricist thesis, that all necessity is verbal, has important consequences for his account of logic.

Consider the syllogism:

Man is mortal
Socrates is a man
Ergo, Socrates is mortal

It had been argued by Aristotelean and rationalist defenders of logic as a system of necessary science that it is a science that contributed to the growth of knowledge. The inference from ‘Socrates is a man’ to ‘Socrates is mortal’ is mediated, on this view, by the major premise ‘Man is mortal’ which establishes a real necessary connection between the minor premise and the conclusion by virtue of itself recording a necessary connection among the attributes connoted by the terms which it contains. This traditional account presupposes that there are necessary connections among attributes, that, in other words, attributes are not logically self-contained. Given Mill's claim that attributes are logically independent, this is wrong and the truth of the major adds nothing to the truth of the particular propositions, ‘this man is mortal,’ ‘that man is mortal’, etc., whose conjunction it records. Accepting the major as true is simply a way, on the one hand, of accepting that particulars one already knows share the attributes in question, and, on the other hand, a determination that one will continue to affirm this connection of hitherto unexamined particulars.

On Mill's semantics, then, the major premise ‘Men are mortal’ of the syllogism is, in its import, semantically equivalent to the extended conjunction:

Peter is a man and Peter is mortal, & Caius is a man and Caius is mortal, & Cicero is a man and Cicero is mortal, & etc.

It is, in other words a way of asserting an indefinitely long conjunction. Now, an inference

Peter is a man and Peter is mortal, & Caius is a man and Caius is mortal
Hence, Peter is a man and Peter is mortal

is not a genuine inference, one that is ampliative, yielding an increase of truth. It is only an apparent inference. Given the import as a conjunction of the major premise in the syllogism,

Man is mortal
Socrates is a man
Hence, Socrates is mortal

it follows that this too is only an apparent inference. Thus, logic—that is, deductive logic or syllogistic—adds nothing to our knowledge; its rules merely reflect our determination to reason consistently with the ways in which we have reasoned in the past: the rules of formal logic, of syllogistic, are the rules of a logic of consistency.

In contrast, logic as ampliative involves a passage from the knowledge of particulars summarized in the major, or universal premise, to an application of the same rule to a new case. In terms of knowledge, the major premise of a syllogism provides no knowledge beyond what it summarizes about particulars already known. Ampliative inference, that is, inference as a part of a logic of truth, is thus always a passage from particulars to particulars.

3. Induction

Since there are no objective necessary connections among the attributes of phenomena given in ordinary experience, it follows that the only grounds that we have for inferring from a sample to a population or from the past to the future are given by present experience or memory: all ampliative inference is inductive. It follows that such inference can never achieve apodictic certainty. This does not imply, as some have suggested, a scepticism about all events beyond present experience; it does not imply that all such judgments are somehow unreasonable or unjustified. It does imply, however, that our notion of rational justification ought to be adapted to this fact.

Humans find themselves as embodied creatures in the world, making “spontaneous” and “unscientific” inductions about specific unconnected and natural phenomena or aspects of experience. Examples are “fire burns” and “food nourishes”. The satisfaction of our desires, and indeed our very survival, depends upon our coming to ascertain, so far as we can, the truth about the natural world in which we find ourselves and about ourselves too. Ascertaining such truth as best we can is the cognitive means we have available for meeting those ends. No judgment aiming at such truth can, however, ever attain apodictic certainty, and so we ought, as reasonable beings at least, to be satisfied with less than that. In the absence of infallible knowledge, we ought as reasonable persons be satisfied with fallible knowledge. And within that framework we ought to find as best we can those rules of inference that on the basis of past experience form the best—though fallible—guide to matter of fact truth.

The spontaneous inductions, such as “fire burns”, all admit of qualification. Humans soon discover their limitations, and undertake inquiry to try to fill these gaps in their knowledge. The making of inductions we cannot avoid: that is part of our being human in the world, it is what we must do. The judgments at which we arrive are all fallible, and the Cartesian, proposing the cognitive goal of infallibility, would therefore have us reject them all. Since we must continue the practice, it is unreasonable to propose a cognitive goal that requires us to stop. It is therefore reasonable to continue the search after matter-of-fact truth, fallible though it is: that is what we ought to do: must implies ought.

(This principle that must implies ought is the converse of the well-known Kantian principle that ought implies can. It is justified by the argument that where there is something we must be then it is unreasonable to propose that something else be required. This principle permits one to infer an ought from an is, to move from the realm of fact to the realm of justification. Mill appeals to this principle to establish that it is reasonable to make inductive inferences, even though they are all fallible: this is not the only place where Mill appeals to this principle.)

But if the general practice of making inductive inferences is reasonable, some forms of that practice are more reasonable than others. Science is more reasonable than superstition; it is more reasonable than simply sticking with our original spontaneous inductions; and certainly it is more reasonable than the intuitions of the rationalists—including Mill's central opposition, William Whewell, who defended rationalism in science, intuitionism in ethics, the established Anglican religion, and unreformed universities.

Deductive logic keeps us consistent in our search after matter-of-fact truth; the logic of science—inductive logic—provides a set of rules that form the best, though fallible, guide that we can discover for the discovery of new truth. The rules of logic, both deductive and inductive, are rules of the art that has as its end, its cognitive end, the search after truth. All inferences are matters of psychological fact. For this Mill was later criticized by some later philosophers such as Husserl; he was accused of the sin of psychologism. But this is unfair to Mill. The latter is not claiming that the laws of logic are part of the subject-matter of the empirical science of psychology. He is arguing, rather, that the laws of logic, of both deductive logic and inductive logic, are normative, rules or standards about how we ought to reason, or, at least, about how we ought to reason given that we have a concern for matter-of-fact truth.

4. Mill's Empiricism: The Relativity of Knowledge

Mill argues that the apparatus of logic permits us to define predicates such as ‘unicorn’ that connote attributes that are not present in things given in ordinary experience. Such predicates have no denotation, and any proposition such as ‘this is a unicorn’ is false. More difficult are subject terms which connote but do not denote, e.g., ‘the present king of Mexico’. Mill was not alone in having difficulty with the logic of such terms; it was only with the work of Bertrand Russell on definite descriptions that these problems were solved in a way that could fit with an empiricist account of logic and of meaning.

But Mill's basic point is clear enough. Language aims to state matters of fact about the world. There are logical terms, such as ‘is’ or ‘is not’ or ‘and’, and non-logical terms. The latter are the subject terms and predicate terms of propositions. There are certain subject terms and predicate terms which are primitive to this language. All others are somehow defined on the basis of these primitive terms—leaving aside the details, to be worked out by later logicians, how these rules for introducing non-primitive terms are to be specified. Meanings are a matter of subject terms and predicate terms being hooked as it were to things and their attributes. (Mill is hazy, unfortunately, on relations, but in this he is hardly to be distinguished from any logicians prior to Peirce and Russell.) It is Mill's empiricism that these things and attributes to which the primitive terms of language are hooked are presented to us in ordinary experience, either sensory experience or inner awareness of our own states of consciousness.

Subject terms and predicate terms provide the content of propositions. Assuming that thought is propositional, they thereby define the limits of thought. Mill's empiricism thus determines the limits of what is thinkable. In this sense, all knowledge is relative to us, to our consciousness. We can of course have beliefs and even knowledge of things of which we are not conscious; there are parts of the world that we have never experienced. There are parts of things too small to observe by means of unaided sense; there are things too far to be seen by unaided sense; and there are things, such as the inside of unopened oranges, that we do not see but which we would see were we to do certain things, e.g., cut open the orange. The grounds of such knowledge or beliefs are not direct experience, but rather inference from direct experience. But our knowledge of those things, our beliefs about them, are still relative to us in the sense that we cannot think of them except as similar to or resembling things or attributes of which we are conscious in sense experience or inner awareness.

This much Mill takes for granted in his System of Logic. The empiricist framework he defends in detail in the Examination of Sir William Hamilton's Philosophy.

Some philosophers, for example, George Berkeley, have argued that the only grounds that can justify beliefs about ordinary things is direct consciousness. Mill rejects such an idealism: there is nothing in the being of attributes of things that ontologically determines that such things when they exist must be sensed. Mill argues in the Examination that material objects as the permanent possibilities of sensation exist independently of being sensed. But these are capable of being sensed, provided the knower is appropriately situated; though unsensed they are part of the world of (sensory) phenomena.

Mill also rejects the view of other philosophers, e.g., Kant or Sir William Hamiliton, that there are things or entities beyond the phenomenal world. According to these philosophers, phenomena are in fact the effects of such things but those things, as trans-phenomenal or noumenal, are wholly different from those phenomena; unlike material things as the permanent possibilities of sensation, they are devoid of sensory or phenomenal characteristics. These things which are wholly other and wholly foreign to anything we experience constitute the Unknowable cause or causes of the phenomena of which we are ordinarily aware. Among these philosophers, some such as Kant held that all that we can know is that the entities exist as causes of phenomena. Others such as Sir William Hamilton argued that we can know these not only as causes but also as being in themselves characterized by attributes, e..g., the primary qualities, which are also given phenomenally. Finally others, such as Hamilton's follower H. E. Mansel, argued that we can know the Unknowable as having attributes that at once resemble those that are had by ordinary things, e.g., some of the human virtues, but in ways which exceed our human powers to conceive—the suggestion here is that God, the Unknowable, is just but in a way that exceeds all humanly conceivable forms of justice.

Mill objects to these views in the name of logic: they are simply not consistent with the logic that is appropriate to the claim accepted by these philosophers that all knowledge is relative. In the first place, the concept of cause is, contrary to Kant and Hamilton, not an a priori concept. The concept of cause in its basic sense is acquired through our experience of matter-of-fact regularity: it is one that relates phenomena to other phenomena and not phenomena to noumena. The relativity of knowledge includes the relativity of our knowledge of causal relations, and these philosophers therefore have no grounds for supposing the existence of noumenal entities. As for Hamilton's claim that we have in our phenomenal experience knowledge of attributes of noumenal entities as these are in themselves, Mill has no trouble in showing the logical confusion in this claim. Hamilton wants to have it both ways—all our knowledge is relative or phenomenal and within this phenomenal realm we can discover concepts which apply absolutely or non-relatively to the noumenal things-in-themselves. Mansel's views receive Mill's particular scorn: if terms are not to be used in their ordinary sense then they ought not be used at all. A being, no matter how powerful, whose acts cannot be described in terms characteristic of human morality, is not one that we can reasonably worship. Mill made his well-known proclamation that “I will call no being good who is not what I mean when I apply that epithet to my fellow creatures, and if such a being can sentence me to hell for not so calling him, then to hell I will go.” (Examination of Sir William Hamilton's Philosophy, p. 103)

5. Scientific Method

Mill works out the basic principles of experimental science in the System of Logic, Book III.

He argues that the rules of scientific method evolve out of the spontaneous inductions about the world that we make as embodied creatures. As we investigate the world to find the best means to satisfy our natural needs and aims, some patterns maintain themselves, others turn out to be false leads. The former guide us in our anticipations of nature, and in our plans; they enable us to infer what will be and what would be if we were to do certain things or if other things were to happen. These patterns that we accept as guides we come to think of as laws: a law is a regularity that we accept for purposes of prediction and contrary-to-fact inference. Out of these ways of experiencing and coming to understand the world grows our account of explanation: to explain a fact is to locate a law under which it can be subsumed.

(This is what has come to be called the “covering Law” model of explanation or the “deductive-nomological” model. Positivists such as C. G. Hempel came to accept this model, as did K. Popper. But contrary to Popper's claim to originality, Mill is the first to clearly state this model.)

As we proceed in our efforts to understand and explain the world in which we find ourselves, the generalizations we accept begin to accumulate and interweave. We find, moreover, that there are not only generalizations but also at a more generic level patterns among these generalizations. We discover that as we search out such patterns we are often successful in discovering them. This itself is a pattern, a pattern about patterns, or, as Mill put it, a law about laws, a law to the effect that for all sorts of event there are laws, there to be discovered, which explain those sorts of event. This is a generic law to the effect that for every specific sort of event there is another specific sort to which it is regularly or lawfully connected. As we progress in science we generalize this law about laws to include all sorts of events: it is the Law of Universal Causation. It assures us that for any sort of event there are laws, there in the world, which, if we search diligently enough, we will be able to discover.

Guided by this principle, we also discover—fallibly, to be sure—that various rules of inference are more effective than others in generating acceptable causal beliefs. At the specific level, for any sort of event there are a wide variety of alternative possible determining attributes. We make assumptions—revisable—about the possible relevant causes, and identify the actual sort of cause by a process of elimination. Mill provides a detailed study of the various rules of eliminative inference in his well-known “Methods of Experimental Inference” (System of Logic, Bk. 2, ch. 9).

Mill here clearly describes the experimental method of science. One has a range of hypotheses. One searches for data and experiments that eliminate all hypotheses but one. One concludes that the uneliminated hypothesis is true. Clearly, the method of elimination yields a conclusion of truth only if two assumptions are fulfilled. One, it must be assumed that there is a cause, that at least one of the hypotheses is true. This has been called a Principle of Determinism. And two, one must assume that the true hypothesis is among the set one is working with, that the specific cause for which we are searching falls within this genus. This has been called a Principle of Limited Variety. Given that these assumptions hold, then the uneliminated hypothesis must be true.

But why accept the Principles of Determinism and Limited Variety for this area of research? Here one must assume a background theory, a laws about laws, which predicts for this area that these two laws hold. These laws are generic, and predict that there is a law, there to be discovered, that will be a specific law under the genus. The task of the researcher is to discover that specific law, guided by the theory.

The theory itself will be a generalization from laws in other, related areas. Confirmation of these specific laws tends to confirm the theory, and this confirmed theory then supports the Principles of Determinism and Limited Variety that guide the research. If the research is successful and one locates confirmed laws at the specific level, then that confirmation in turn supports the two Principles, which in its turn supports the generic theory from they have been derived. The confirmational support travels up from the specific laws to the generic and then down from the generic to the specific.

The Principles of Determinism and Limited Variety are laws. They predict that there is a cause of a certain generic sort, but do not predict specifically what it is. If that is all we know then it is clear that we would prefer to know the specific cause that they assert is there. In that sense, they are, to use J. L. Mackie's term,“gappy”, and it is the aim of research to fill in those gaps.

Our spontaneous inductions such as “water boils” are gappy in just this sense (“water boils” neglects the role of air pressure). Inquiry aims to fill those gaps. But such inquiry becomes the inductive method science only when those gappy laws are themselves supported, not simply as spontaneous inductions, but there is a background theory, a generic law about laws, that provides for them antecedent inductive support deriving from other, related areas.

Mill's picture of the inductive method of inquiry and the research that it guides is remarkably close to T. Kuhn's picture of “normal science.” What Mill calls a law about laws, Kuhn calls a “paradigm”, but that is a terminological difference. For both, they are theories that guide research: they assert that there is a law, there to be discovered in a certain generically described area, and it is the task of the researcher to discover it.

Mill also allows for something like what Kuhn calls “revolutionary science,” inquiry undertaken when the paradigm or background theory no longer leads to the discovery of specific laws. Failure to find the cause the theory asserts to be there will in general not require the rejection of the theory: the claim is an existence claim, and a failure to find something asserted to exist does not refute that claim, perhaps one has not looked hard enough. Mill, by the way, here agrees with Kuhn about paradigms or generic theories that they are not falsifiable by simple observations: specific hypotheses are so falsifiable but not generic laws about laws. In this they agree that Popper is wrong that falsifiability is the sole criterion of the scientific.

When a theory is not falsified but fails to be a successful guide in research then scientists begin to search for a new theory. But now this research is not guided by a theory: the research-guiding theory is no longer available. A looser form of research is now called for to discover a new theory. When a new theory is located by this research and it replaces the old theory then what Kuhn calls a scientific revolution occurs: the practice of normal science is restored, guided by the new theory.

The new theory will make predictions contrary to the old. When these predictions are successful theory new theory is confirmed. It is confirmed in areas where the old theory has failed. Since the new theory is confirmed perforce where the old theory is confirmed, and is further confirmed where the old theory is not, the new theory comes to be accepted as the one that is true. Since the new theory is contrary to the old, the old is therefore rejected as false. The elimination of an old theory is thus not a matter of a simple confrontation with falsifying observations as occurs as the level of specific laws, and as Popper would have it, but is more complicated, involving not only observational data but also a confrontation of theories. That at least is how Kuhn describes it. Mill would not disagree.

Kuhn is more subtle than Mill in his description of revolutionary science. But the principles Mill allows for the confirmation of generic theories are much of a piece with the looser methods of revolutionary science described by Kuhn. For Mill allows that as one moves up the generic hierarchy to more abstract levels of theory, then the eliminative methods no longer apply, and one must rely on something more akin to induction by simple enumeration. Not only must one do this, but it is reasonable so to do, Mill argues. Mill does not detail instances of theory change, as Kuhn does, but he makes his position clear in his account of the inference to the most generic theory of all, the Law of Universal Causation. That is, he makes clear how looser methods of inference come into play as one moves up the generic hierarchy of laws, how these looser methods are reasonable, and how the generic laws they justify asserting can be reckoned to be confirmed by observational data at the specific level. The terminology is not that of Kuhn, but the ideas are very similar.

Here is Mill's point. At the level of specific sorts of event the rule of enumerative induction—“from all observed As are Bs infer that all As are Bs”—is unreliable, often leading us to accept as true generalizations that later turn out to be false. Inferences in conformity to this rule often overlook relevant factors that are the real causes or mistake necessary conditions for sufficient conditions. Because of the variety of possible factors at the specific level, the eliminative methods lead to judgments that are more secure than the judgements which mere enumerative judgments would yield.

However, for any event, if one takes it generically, simply as an event, then there are at that level only two alternatives, caused or uncaused. Here there are not a variety of alternatives to be eliminated, and the rule of enumerative induction turns out to be more reliable than at the specific level: we have regularly been successful in finding causes at the specific level and this provides grounds for accepting the generic claim, the law about laws, that for all events there are causes to be discovered. Which is the Law of Universal Causation.

But then, as we extend our researches to a new specific area, the thesis that there are causes to be discovered provides inductive support for the lower-level claim that the result of the eliminative inference has really isolated a cause. There is thus an interplay as it were between eliminative and enumerative methods, with inferences at the specific level providing support for generic-level inferences, and the latter in turn providing support for specific-level inferences. Confirmational support rises up a hierarchy from specific laws to laws about laws, and then down from the laws about laws to the specific laws. Inferences in different specific areas mutually support one another through their joint support of the Law of Universal Causation which provides the grounding principle for inductive inference.

Mill's great opponent about the logic of scientific inference was William Whewell, whose History of the Inductive Sciences (1837) Mill had read with considerable care. Whewell argued that acceptance of scientific hypotheses depends first upon their capacity to explain observed phenomena and more specifically upon their capacity to explain phenomena in diverse areas (the “consilience of inductions”). Mill can accept the point about the consilience of inductions, given what he argues about the interplay of enumerative and eliminative reasoning. Further, Mill could accept the importance of hypotheses as working assumptions—“heuristic devices,” in Whewell's terms—, but he could not accept Whewell's claim that the mere fact that an hypothesis accounts for the data provides safe grounds for accepting it as a true statement of law. To be sure, eliminative methods may often show that a working hypothesis is in fact the only one consistent with the facts, and that it is therefore acceptable as true. But Whewell argued on the basis of the history of science that there are cases of hypotheses where the supposed causes have not been observed and which yet seem to yield explanations of observable phenomena. Such hypotheses involving unobserved causes can be found in inferences about areas too small or too distant to be observed—Whewell instances the undulatory theory of light. Mill agrees that there are such cases, and even allows that such hypotheses provide useful analogies for the guidance of future research. But so long as the data do not determine a unique hypothesis, such hypotheses cannot be accepted as yielding a new truth. Whewell's method of hypotheses, or the “hypothetico-deductive method” as it has come to be called by its defenders such as Popper, is often useful in inquiry, but does not justify accepting as true the hypotheses it assumes: for such acceptance to be reasonable, alternatives must be eliminated. It is the eliminative methods that provide the best (though still fallible) test for truth.

For Whewell, consilience is effected by generic hypotheses subsuming under themselves more specific hypotheses. These hypotheses involve generic concepts that, in Whewell's terms, “colligate” the more specific concepts that appear in hypotheses further down the ladder. Genuine progress in science depends not so much upon simple generalization from observed data as from the locating by inventive genius new colligating concepts. Mill does not disagree, but argues, contrary to Whewell, that colligation by itself is no test of truth.

It is Whewell's contention that as new colligating ideas emerge in the history of science, the principles in which they are embedded become necessary. The concepts in these axioms, such as ‘cause’ or ‘force’, are a priori, and research consists in gradually articulating these concepts into principles the necessity of which becomes more evident over time. What Mill would allow to be the free action of creative genius, Whewell construes as the uncovering by the mind of the divine ideas that provide the formal structure in conformity to which the Unknowable Creator constructs the world of phenomena. It is this necessity deriving from the Divine Creator that guarantees the truth of the basic axioms that organize scientific theories and which ensures the consilience of inductions. Needless to say, Mill rejects this account. The claim that some concepts have their origin a priori is inconsistent with the guiding thesis of the relativity of knowledge. Mill does not deny that in the process of scientific investigation, basic axioms become indubitable in the sense that their contraries become inconceivable. But such indubitability is psychological and does not derive from some sort of conformity to divine necessity. The truth of such axioms, if it really does obtain, is a matter of their conformity to the way the phenomenal world is, and mere fact that they are psychologically indubitable to the human mind does not guarantee that: given the relativity of knowledge, even indubitable judgements are fallible.

6. The Science of Psychology: Associationism

Central to both Mill's account of human reason and also to his social projects is his account, deriving from Bentham and his father, of the science of the human mind. This theory of how the human mind derives originally from Aristotle's discussion of associative memory. In Mill's hands it becomes a systematic hypothesis about which regularities govern human learning. Mill himself never wrote a systematic treatise on psychology, but late in his life he reprinted his father's Analysis of the Phaenomena of the Human Mind (1829, second edition, ed. J. S. Mill, 1869), with extensive notes revising and correcting his father's work.

The theory proposes that if f and g are regularly presented in experience as standing in relation R, then the habit forms in the mind, that if we have an impression or idea of f then it is accompanied with the idea of g. If R is the relation of spatio-temporal contiguity, then the ideas are joined to form a judgment of regularity, a causal judgment. If R is the relation of resemblance, then the ideas associated in the mind according to resemblance classes. A few experiences of connection will produce a loose connection in the mind. An increased frequency of experienced connection will produce a stronger association in the mind. And so attributes that are logically separate in experience through being repeatedly experienced in conjunction come to be inseparably connected in the mind.

Mill argues that this theory can account, however sketchily, for our use of language and how it becomes meaningful. If a word ‘w’ comes causally to be associated with a kind f, and f is associated with the resembling kind g, then the presence of f to the mind will call up both the associated kind g and the word w, so that w will come to be associated not only with f but also with g, and in fact with all the kinds that stand in the resemblance relation R to f. In this way words become general, applying to all members of a resemblance class. The mechanisms of association and the relations of resemblance thus come, for Mill, to play the role that abstract ideas played for earlier philosophers.

The habits of causal inference provide ways of anticipating what will occur in the world; that is how we learn what to expect. It is through processes of this sort that we form our spontaneous generalizations such as “fire burns” of “food nourishes.” Cognitively, these are inferences that conform to the rules of induction by simple enumeration. And in terms of our adapting to the world, these inferences are acquired purely passively. If this was all there is to Mill's account to the human mind then the criticism often level by the idealists that it ignores the active element in the human intellect, and presents a simplistic view of human reason.

But Mill's psychology also includes an account of motivation and action. On this theory, pleasure is the prime motivator, the primary end in itself, and the anticipation of pleasure serves as an immediate cause of bodily motions which in turn bring about that pleasure. Through regular success in attaining pleasure, anticipations of pleasure become associated with the sorts of action that bring about that pleasure. When Mill asserts that people seek pleasure, what he is to be taken to mean is that people seek things other than pleasure but that they seek it because pleasure has become associated with it, and that when the desire is fulfilled they experience the pleasure of satisfied desire. In this sense human welfare consists in satisfied desire.

There is one important feature of Mill's psychology in which he differed from his father. On his father's view, a complex idea produced by association is simply a collection is its associated parts. Thus, the idea of a house consists literally of the ideas of bricks, mortar, windows, etc., and the idea of everything consists of the ideas of every thing. This is surely a case of theory over-riding our clear experience. So it seemed to the younger Mill. On the latter's view, as he explained both in the Logic and his introductory notes to the second edition of his father's Analysis of the Phaenomena of the Human Mind, there is a sort of mental chemistry in which the parts fuse, as it were, into a new sort of mental whole. The causation is like that of chemistry, where, for example, water is the product of the fusion of oxygen and hydrogen, and unlike the mechanical causation of mechanics, where (as Mill saw it—not quite correctly [see Section 10, below])the product of several causes is merely the additive sum of the effects of those causes taken separately. These new sorts of mental unity emerge from associational processes and have properties which are not among the properties that appear in the genetic antecedents. Analysis of ideas is still possible, but it is not the simplistic sort of thing, a literal taking apart, that his father would have it be. As Mill explained in his Examination of Sir William Hamilton's Philosophy, the genetic antecedents are not integrant or real parts, as his father supposed, but only (as he put it) metaphysical parts; as metaphysical parts, they are present but only dispositionally. They can, however, through association (under the appropriate analytic set) be recovered, and brought to consciousness.

This new account of psychological association and analysis was important in Mill's thinking about ethics. Thus, where his father (and Bentham) had a simple notion that pleasures are all of a piece, and distinctions among them merely quantitative, one bit added to another bit, Mill came to see that there are qualitative distinctions among pleasures: the “higher” pleasures do result from association but they are different in kind from the “lower” pleasures out of which they arise, and as a matter of fact turn out to be more satisfying forms of pleasure. So Mill could say, where his father could not, that it is better to be Socrates dissatisfied than a pig satisfied.

It is evident that it was during his mental crisis that Mill came to be clear on the existence of, and importance for personal development, of these higher forms of mental unity in our conscious experience of the world. It was reading Wordsworth, it seems, that gave him this sense that there were forms of human being that were hardly part of his father's scheme of things. These feelings, to be obtained through poetry and human intercourse, were subsequently encouraged through his relationship with Harriet Taylor. These feelings, and their cultivation, came to form an important part of Mill's idea of the good that shaped his thought and his efforts towards social reform and progress.

Given the account of association and of action, it is evident that various means to pleasure will become associated with feelings of pleasure. But on Mill's view, this will not be a mere conjunction; to the contrary, as the association becomes strong enough the two parts will fuse into a new sort of emergent whole. The means will not simply be conjoined to pleasure but will become part of pleasure. And so money, for the miser, becomes not just a means to pleasure but for him part of pleasure, a end in itself.

This account of human action presupposes the acceptance of determinism, which Mill vigorously defends in the System of Logic, where he outlines the idea of a naturalistic science of human being. Freedom, Mill argues in Book Six, Ch. 2, which he thought the best in the work, is not the absence of causation but rather the absence of coercion. In fact the whole point of education is to determine the future free actions of the individual: it aims through the associative processes to determine the person's motives and actions.

This much Mill takes over from earlier thinkers such as Hume. But leaving it here has seemed by some again to render the person passive. Mill takes up this point in detail in Examination of Sir William Hamilton's Philosophy. The argument of the critics is that if character and motive are determined by earlier causes, how could a person be said him- or herself to be responsible for his or her actions? Hamilton so argued: the view makes the person a creature of his or her environment. This notion seemed convincing to Mill himself until he came to recognize that among the motives that one could acquire is the motive of self-improvement or self-realization. There are irresistible motives; for these we are not as persons responsible. But there are also resistible motives, and these we can shape and determine. That is, we can shape and determine them provided that we have the desire so to do. One is free if one could have resisted the motives on which one did in fact act, provided there had been good reasons so to do. A motive impairs freedom only if it is irresistible, only if it cannot be blocked by a strong reason against it. The free person is one who is sensitive to good reasons for behaving as he or she does. The second-order ends that lead one to shape one's motives and to develop as an individual became the central feature of Mill's social thinking, and this marks a major break in detail, though, to be sure, not in principle, with the utilitarianism of Bentham and his father. In the Examination of Hamilton's Philosophy, Mill vigorously defends the notion of human beings as active in their own self-determination.

This account of human being also provides an answer to those who argue that Mill's picture of human reason makes persons purely passive rather than active as thinkers. For, among the ends that can come to be associated with pleasure is the end of truth; in this way curiosity becomes an end in itself. And the motive for self-improvement will lead us to find, so far as we can, better ways to satisfy that end. We will so educate ourselves that our reasoning will conform, not to the simplistic rules of induction by simple enumeration, but to the more reliable rules of eliminative induction. The charge that Mill fails to take into account the active side of human reason is thus mistaken, resting on a failure to recognize those parts of the psychological theory that deal with motivation.

Mill has little to say about issue of mind-body relations. He clearly holds that mind, that is, mental events affect bodily events and conversely. These connections are not at all mysterious. Many, such as Descartes, create a chasm between mind and body by taking them to be separate substances of kinds that separable from one another and which therefore lack the necessary connection which is the core of causation on the substance philosophy. Since Mill, on the usual empiricist grounds, rejects substances and objective necessary connections, these problems do not arise. The core idea in causation is, alternatively, regularity, there are regularities with respect to mind-body connections (whenever I will my arm to go up, then it goes up, mostly anyway; when I am in the presence of, say, an orange, I see that orange, mostly anyway), since there are these regularities, there are causal relations: there is no mystery to it.

Mill is certainly not an epipehnomenalist: mind does causally affect body, as well as body affecting mind. Even more certainly, he is not an identity theorist: mental events are clearly distinguished in experience from bodily events: they are therefore not identical. He does hold that the laws of psychology are within themselves gappy, and that the gaps are to be filled by reference to non-mental events. There are, on the one hand, events in the world that evoke as responses mental events, and, on the other had, there are the actions and the upshot of actions which are the effects of mental events. Also relevant are the physiological events that intervene between the sensory stimuli and the bodily response. While Mill recognizes their existence, he has little to say about them, unlike Herbert Spencer who, importantly, deals with them in detail in his Principles of Psychology.

Many now hold that the system of physical or bodily events forms a causally closed system. This has been the standard view since the discovery of the Law of the Conservation of Energy in the middle of the nineteenth century. Like the other great, perhaps greater, discovery in the nineteenth century, Darwin's theory of the origin and evolution of species by natural selection, Mill simply fails to note their significance. In any case, he has a clear solution: parallelism. This was the solution proposed and defended by Mill's contemporary, the physiologist W. B. Carpenter, who found it more reasonable than the epiphenomenalism of T. H. Huxley. Mill could have found, and perhaps did find, this parallelistic solution congenial. Certainly, he was familiar with David Hartley's Observations on Man (1749) which clearly, on the one hand, proposed a parallelism between mental states and bodily states, and, on the other hand, articulated with equal clarity an associationist account of learning. Joseph Priestley had edited Hartley into a textbook of associationist psychology by eliminating much of the physiology (and by also eliminating much of the rather odd theology with which Hartley ended his work). This became a standard presentation of associationism until Mill's father published his Analysis of the Phaenomena of the Human Mind. The younger Mill himself read Hartley, likely in Priestley's edited version, but enough anyway to pick up the parallelism. The latter was therefore most likely his considered view. He would have found acceptable the notion, since popular, that mind supervenes on body. If he thought in evolutionary terms then he would hold that the mental emerges from the physical. Some have thought this to be problematic: how could something so unlike matter emerge from matter, what forces could produce the one our of the other? must the cause not already be contained in the effect? But this idea of causation is rejected by Mill, it is part of the substance tradition (it is present in Aristotle, and is clearly stated by the Stoic Zeno of Citium), and Mill rejects this view of causation on empiricist grounds. All there is to causation is regularity, and so long as there are regularities describing the development of the mental out of the material, then there is causation, and there is no mystery. On this point he is perfectly clear: much of the proclaimed mystery of mind-body relation derives from non-empiricist accounts of causation, and not from the ontological or logical separability of mental events and bodily events. Separable though mental events and bodily events may be, there are regularities between them, and therefore causation between them. Once one adopts, as Mill does, the regularity account of causation, much of the mystery disappears. In Berkeley's phrase, “they raise a dust, and then complain they cannot see.” All that remains is the puzzle of how mind can affect body and the system of bodily or physical events remain causally closed, as required by the Conservation of Energy, but this puzzle too disappears: with parallelism, there is no puzzle.

Mill's psychology, though old-fashioned and nineteenth-century-ish in its presentation, is in its content surprisingly modern. To be sure, it is, like all the older psychology, mentalistic through and through: non-mental contexts were thought to be not really relevant until Darwin located the person and therefore the mind securely in the biological realm, and therefore subject to the operations of the environment and of natural selection. But details aside, the associationism, in its simplest form, clearly amounts to classical conditioning, and if you consider Mill's account of the role of pleasure then there is a strong element of re-inforcement theory. The associationism also has clear affinities for, and indeed is in many ways the genetic antecedent of, connectionism in recent neuropsychology and cognitive science. It also faces many of the problems that confront these later views. Parallelism allows Mill's psychology to be assimilated, like connectionism and much of cognitive science, into the mainstream of methodological behaviourism in psychology. In its day, the psychology had considerable impact. With that of Spencer it dominated thought in psychology, until Wundt made the science experimental, and William James' Principles of Psychology became the standard presentation, and until, with the latter, the home of the science as a discipline moved from Britain and Germany to America.

7. Geometry and Arithmetic

It is within this context that one must place the account of the necessity of geometrical and arithmetical truth that Mill develops in the System of Logic.

The truths of geometry and arithmetic had traditionally been taken to be necessary. But they clearly have more than verbal import. They are therefore not necessary truths, given Mill's argument that the only necessity is verbal necessity: on Mill's metaphysics, therefore, they depend for their truth upon the individuals and their attributes of the world as we experience those entities.

The propositions of geometry are empirical. The theorems are deduced from premises which are themselves inductively established. These premises are inexact descriptions of objects in physical space. Insofar as the premises are exact descriptions—referring, e.g., to exactly straight lines—they describe material attributes taken to their limits. Thus, all smooth lines resemble one another with regard to different degrees of curvature, and taking a line to be exactly straight is to neglect the degree of curvature. The proposition, “two straight lines cannot enclose a space”, when taken as applying literally, is only inexactly true; taken as exactly true it means something to the effect that “The more closely two smooth lines approach absolute breadthlessness and straightness, the smaller the space that they enclose.” Mill's views on geometry are close to those of the logical positivists in the twentieth century.

His views on arithmetic are more controversial. These were later to be vehemently disputed by the logician Gottlob Frege, not without good grounds. Mill disagreed with those whom he called Conceptualists, who held that arithmetical truths were truths about psychological states. Mill also agreed with Kant against Nominalists such as Hobbes that the propositions of arithmetic are not true by definition; they are, in Kantian terms, synthetic. But that implies, for Mill, against Kant, that they are a posteriori, inductive rather than a priori. The only way that Mill could see one holding that they are both synthetic and a priori, is to hold that they are truths about rationally intuited forms not presented in ordinary experience. This was the solution that Frege was later to adopt. But Mill on empiricist grounds rejected this sort of Realism. This makes Mill in more recent terminology a nominalist. The problem is that arithmetic seems to have a necessity which is at once more than verbal, as Mill correctly held, but also more than that which attaches to the inductive truths of, say, physics or botany. Mill's ontology of things and attributes is simply not sophisticated enough to permit a solution to this problem.

Mill argues that a number is an attribute of an aggregate of units. This brings him close to Frege's idea that the number of a given class is the class of all classes equinumerous to that given class. But he does not clearly distinguish an aggregate from a class, nor the sum of two numbers from the (Boolean) sum of two classes. Moreover, he takes measurement to be the empirical counting of units, rather than a matter of relations among the members of an ordered dimension. In both cases a more sophisticated account of relational form is necessary, but this was developed only by later logicians. Mill is certainly confused from the point of view of later thinkers such as Frege or Russell. Certainly, the view of the later positivists that mathematical truths are a matter of logical form would fit more comfortably with his empiricism.

(It is worth noting, however, that not everyone is dismissive of Mill's view of arithmetic; see the study by Hugh Lehman cited in the Bibliography.)

What Mill does argue about the necessity of geometry and arithmetic, and, for that matter, the basic axioms of other sciences such as physics and chemistry, is that these principles, while from the point of view of their truth are inductive generalizations, are from the point of view of the thinker matters of psychological necessity. The appeal is to the principles of association. The propositions of geometry and arithmetic record matters of fact that are very deep and invariable in our experience. Our repeated experience of these facts creates in the mind invariable associations. These inseparable connections create in the mind of the knower a sense of the necessity of these propositions. The necessity is there, as Whewell and others insist. But the necessity is one of thought rather than one in the ontological structure of things.

8. Perception and Material Things

In his Examination of Sir William Hamilton's Philosophy, Mill applies empiricist principles to the ontology of material things and his associationist principles to their perception.

These discussions, and what he says elsewhere about observation and inquiry, show that Mill is not the simplistic phenomenalist and foundationalist that he is often made out to be.

When we cut open an orange we are presented with certain sensory impressions, shapes, colors and textures with which we were not previously presented. However, we also firmly believe that those parts of the orange were there even when we were not perceiving them. Our experience has so formed our habits of expectation that we not only form the conception of those things as existing when they were not being perceived but firmly believe them so to exist. These are things, parts of the orange, existing unperceived; they are possible sensations, which, through our expectations, have become conditional certainties. Mill refers to these possibilities which are conditional certainties as “permanent possibilities”, thus distinguishing them from mere vague possibilities which experience gives us no warrant for reckoning upon.

It is important to note that, while we do not experience these permanent possibilities, they are not mere fictions. To the contrary, as just indicated, Mill carefully distinguishes between the permanent possibilities that constitute ordinary things from the mere or “vague” possibilities that we conjure up in our imagination. The acceptance of these possibilities is a matter of certainty, though, to be sure, a certainty that is conditional, based on inference from what we do actually experience. With regard to the ontology of ordinary objects, Mill is a phenomenalist, but among the parts of those things are unexperienced phenomena.

(Mill's “permanent possibilities of sensation” are what later philosophers such as Bertrand Russell would refer to as “unsensed sensibilia.” Mill's phenomenalism is similar to what they were to call “neutral monism.” The later philosophers differ in the more sophisticated logical apparatus that they could bring to bear.)

Ordinary things, physical objects, are clusters of sensations, actual and possible, that is, permanent, in Mill's sense. These clusters are lawfully ordered; it is our knowledge of these laws or regularities that make the permanent sensations conditional certainties. The clusters include not only visual but also tactual and other forms of sensation. Ideas of depth (Mill agrees with Berkeley here) arise from associations of kinaesthetic sensations that arise as we move from here to there. At a certain point, here, there are visual sensations of color and shape. At another point there are different visual sensations, perhaps the same color, but a different shape—things are seen in perspective. Also at the other point that shape is presented not only visually but tactually. Relative to the actual experience of the former the others are conditionally certain possibilities located at the appropriate distance.

When we perceive an orange we have certain visual sensations which through our expectations we refer to a collection that includes not only these actual sensations but also the permanent possibilities that are there but which we are not sensing. A perceiving is in effect an associational inference from given sensations to things taken as clusters of sensory parts, most of which are there as unperceived but permanent parts. Like all inferences those inferences are associations of ideas. But these perceivings are so ingrained as to be in effect instantaneous. The ideas which are their parts fuse into a single whole. Through the chemistry of association the perceiving of an ordinary thing is an emergent unity, a new whole which has that thing as its cognitive or intentional object.

In experience we often find that whenever a given cluster of certified possibilities of sensation obtains, then a certain other cluster follows. In such a context through a further process of association our ideas of causation, power, and activity become connected not with sensations but with groups of possibilities of sensations. The perceptual object thus comes to be thought of as having the power of producing sensations. It becomes the permanent material source of the sensory data that we actually experience. Thus, for example,

When … I say, The sky is blue, my meaning, and my whole meaning, is that the sky has that particular colour …. I am thinking only of the sensation of blue, and am judging that the sky produces this sensation in my sensitive faculty; or (to express the meaning in technical language) that the quality answering to the sensation of blue, or the power of exciting the sensation of blue, is an attribute of the sky. (Examination of Sir William Hamilton's Philosophy, p. 386)

As far as it goes, this inference to a permanent material source of the sensory data the experience is a legitimate inference. But there is a tendency of the human mind to transform this material object into a noumenal object that is thought somehow to exist apart from all sensory appearances. But it is precisely this tendency that Mill decries as illegitimate: this is his empiricism.

I assume only the tendency, but not the legitimacy of the tendency, to expand all the laws of our own experience to a sphere beyond our experience. (Examination of Sir William Hamilton's Philosophy, Ch. XI, p. 187n)

Observation forms the starting point of all inference, that is, inductive inference. But the study of the conditions for sound observation is, he suggests in the System of Logic, more properly the province of psychology than of logic. There are judgments of sensation, about the sensory data that are given to us, and there are perceptual judgments, about material objects. Neither sort is infallibly certain, in the way that Descartes proposed judgments are to be certain if they are to be reckoned knowledge. Indeed, nothing is certain in the Cartesian sense. The ends of inquiry cannot be achieved, and in fact the process cannot even get started, if we hold on to the Cartesian standard. That being so, it is unreasonable for a rational person to strive after such a cognitive goal. In this sense, it is wrong to suggest that Mill is, like some later positivists, seeking a “foundation”, that is, an infallible or incorrigible foundation, for empirical knowledge. What inquiry or the search after truth needs is not such a “foundation” but simply a starting point.

As we have seen Mill insist, humans find themselves as embodied creatures in the world, making “spontaneous” and “unscientific” judgments about the way the world is and about their being in that world. Judgements of individual fact about the world and ourselves in it impose themselves, as it were, upon us. This is much of a piece with the fact that we also spontaneously make inductions about specific unconnected and natural phenomena or aspects of experience. Examples of those inductions are “fire burns” and “food nourishes”. Examples of the judgements of individual fact are our judgments of sense, “this is red”, and perceptual judgments, “this is an orange.” The satisfaction of our desires, and our very survival, depends upon our coming to ascertain, so far as we can, the truth about the natural world in which we find ourselves and about ourselves too. Ascertaining such truth as best we can is the cognitive means we have available for meeting those ends. No judgment aiming at such truth can, however, ever attain the infallible certainty demanded by the Cartesian, and so we ought, as reasonable beings at least, to aim at a cognitive goal that can in fact be attained. In the absence of infallible knowledge, we ought as reasonable persons be satisfied with fallible knowledge. We are tied by the world to the world through judgments that it imposes upon us. That is our starting point.

(Note that here, in our basic cognitive practices in observation, as in the case of the practice of making inductive inferences, Mill justifies the practice by appeal to the principle that must implies ought. Nor are these the only places where Mill makes such an appeal.)

Note that among the judgments imposed upon us are various perceptual judgments about material objects, about tables and chairs, rainbows and oranges, and so on. Since these are as it were condensed inductive inferences, they may fail for the same reason that inductive inferences may fail. Since perceptual judgments are judgments about actual and possible sensory experiences, in cases where perceptual error occurs we correct those judgments by appeal to judgments about the sensible content of our experience. There is nothing more basic. But he does allow perceptual judgments, judgments about material objects, to be included among the judgments that form the starting point of inquiry. This makes clear that, unlike some of the logical positivists, he is no crude phenomenalist who insists that judgments of sense and only judgments of sense can constitute the staring point, or indeed, the “foundation” for all empirical inquiry.

If a judgment about the world of experience is imposed upon us, then there is a sense in which its contrary is inconceivable. Herbert Spencer argued that this, the “inconceivability of the contrary,” provided the criterion of truth. Mill argued to the contrary that such inconceivability was merely psychological and had no place in logic. He engaged in a lengthy debate with Spencer about the issue: Spencer would address the topic, Mill would reply in the notes to the next edition of the Logic, Spencer would produce another response, and Mill would reply in the next edition of the Logic, and so on. Both were agreed the starting point of human inquiry about the world were the spontaneous judgments we make about the world. For Spencer the inconceivability of the opposite in such judgments gave them a necessity similar to the necessity of logic. For Mill the inconceivability of the opposite in the case of perceptual judgments and judgments of sense was a matter of psychology while the inconceivability of the opposite in the case of logic was a matter of that opposite being inconsistent, which is not a matter of psychology. There was a good deal of talking past one another, but in the end one must say that Mill was no doubt the one who got things correct.

That discussion is now dated. But Mill's taking spontaneous judgments of sense and of perception as the starting point of inquiry while taking them also to be fallible and corrigible continues to be an example worthy of consideration as a philosophy that is at once empiricist in its framework yet non-foundationalist in its epistemology. Many insist that empiricism and foundationalism go together: Mill provides the example that shows that they are wrong.

Many also suggest that there is a conflict between Mill's naturalism, on the one hand, and his account of material things and of observation on the other. This would be so if Mill's views were those of Berkeley, where the sensory qualities that constitute ordinary things are all dependent for their existence upon their being present in a substantial mind. An idealism like Berkeley's is hardly compatible with naturalism. But Mill is not a Berkeleyan idealist. In the first place, there are no substantial minds for the sensible parts of things to be dependent on. In the second place, there is nothing about the sensible parts of the world that make them dependent upon being perceived: to the contrary, there is nothing contradictory in affirming the existence of a sensible object apart from its being sensed. In the third place, Mill is fully prepared to allow one to count not merely sensations but also perceptions of material objects to be part of the observational starting point upon which our system of knowledge is constructed. Unlike Berkeley's, Mill's is a pretty commonsense view of the world. It is a view which, in contrast to Berkeley's idealism and subjectivism, is compatible with a naturalistic approach in the philosophy of science, in the philosophy of mathematics, in epistemology, and even in moral philosophy.

9. Minds

There are two cases, other minds and one's own. Mill discusses both in the Examination of Sir William Hamilton's Philosophy (Ch. XII, Appendix).

Among the bodies to which one refers one's sensations, there is one that is as it were peculiar. That is, one stands in a peculiar relationship to it. One is aware of it from the inside. For this body alone one is aware of kinesthetic sensations. One's perceivings locate other bodies at a distance to this one. Our motives and volitions move this body directly in ways that they can move no other body. Mill's view is that one has as a matter of fact this special relation to one's own body; it largely determines one's identity as a person. Nonetheless, mental events and bodily events are distinct sorts of events in the world of phenomena. There is no problem created by this distinction, however, compared to the problems raised by the similar Cartesian dichotomy. For, where Descartes has substances and a rationalist account of causation with objective necessary connections, with no such connections, and therefore no causation, between distinct sorts of substances (such as mind and body), Mill has no substances—they are foreign to his empiricism—and his view of causation is the regularity view of the empiricists. There are regularities in the mind-body connection—regularly when I will my arm to go up, it goes up—and so the Cartesian problems disappear. His views on the centrality of one's awareness of one's own body to one's being nd to one's being in the world are closer to those of Merleau-Ponty than they are to those of Descartes.

Now, there are regularities that connect outward actions of one's body with states of consciousness within that body. These would include patterns such as this: “Whenever my arm goes up there is a consciousness of my body from the inside that contains a willing that my arm go up.” These regularities are verified in one's own case. But they can be used to infer the existence of conscious states within other bodies that exhibit the same outward actions as one's own body. Thus, whenever I observe the arm of another going up I can infer that there is a consciousness of that body from the inside that contains a volition that the arm go up. The regularities that obtain in one's own case render the existence of such conscious states in others conditional certainties.

The inference to other minds is thus perfectly reasonable. It is based on two facts, one the peculiar relationship that one's own conscious states have to one's body and the regularities that obtain in one's own experience between one's own conscious states and one’ body. The former accounts for the privacy of conscious states, the latter justifies the inference to the presence of similar private states in others.

It is worth noting that many have suggested that our knowledge of other minds is based on an argument from analogy. On Mill's view this is not so. The inference is a simple causal inference. Nor is it an inference based on a single case. To be sure, the regularities are verified in one's own case, but the facts that verify them are the repeated instances that they describe. Nor is privacy a problem. When I infer from a bodily state to the presence of another mind, the consciousness to which I infer is an awareness of that body from the inside. Since I am aware of only my own body from the inside and not that of any other, I should expect to consciousness to which I infer to be private to the other person.

As for the problem of mind in one's own case, this is more difficult. What is mind? Matter is resolved by Mill into a lawfully related bundle of sensations including many permanent possibilities of sensation. Can one's own mind similarly be resolved into a bundle of feelings with a background of permanent possibilities? The problem is that when I expect or remember a state of consciousness I do not simply believe that is has or will exist; it is also to believe that I myself have experienced or will experience that state of consciousness. If it is a series or bundle then it is a series or bundle in which a part of the bundle is conscious of the whole. This had been an objection to the bundle view ever since Plotinus used it against the Epicureans. Mill simply accepts the reality of such awareness. If we accept the bundle view, rejecting the common view of mind as a substance, as he thinks we must, then we are reduced to “accepting the paradox that something which ex hypothesi is but a series of feelings, can be aware of itself as a series” (Examination of Sir William Hamilton's Philosophy, Ch. XII, p. 194). He thus sees himself as driven to “ascribe a reality to the Ego—to my own Mind—different from that real existence as a Permanent Possibility, which is the only reality I acknowledge in Matter” (ibid.).

10. Moral Sciences

The Sixth and final book of the System of Logic is a masterful account of the methodology of the social or moral sciences, one that still repays detailed attention. Its strength derives not only from the thorough and systematic approach to the issues, but also from the fact that Mill himself practised the whole body of these sciences as they then existed, from psychology of course, through economics—in his own day he was recognized as the leading political economist—to history and the then emerging science of sociology. He thought as an economist as well as a moral philosopher about socialism, taxation, and democracy, and he thought not merely as a social thinker about the institutions that govern society but also as a colonial administrator and as a politician in his own country.

The basic pattern of explanation—subsumption under matter-of-fact regularity—applies to the realm of the social as it does to the physical and the mental. Idealists were of course to raise the possibility that the human escapes the natural casual order, and requires a form of explanation toto caelo different from that of the physical sciences. But with his basic arguments for the relativity of knowledge and for the idea that minds are bundles of perceptions, Mill rejects all such proposals. So within his framework, there are no problems in principle with the idea of a natural science of human being. There are problems, to be sure, but they are problems of detail not of principle.

The major problem in the social sciences is that of complexity. For single individuals, the experimental methods can be applied in much the same way that they can be applied in physics or biology: the science of psychology raises no problems. But with large groups those methods cannot be used; the fact that there are a large number of interacting variable precludes that. Other methods are needed. Mill suggests such methods. These proposals depend upon his views on social relations, his ontology of social structures, if you wish.

According to Mill “the effect produced, in social phenomena, by any complex set of circumstances, amounts precisely to the sum of the effects of circumstances taken singly” (Logic, VI, ix, 1). The same principle does not hold in every science; in chemistry, for example, or in psychology itself, effects often have properties which are not reducible to the properties of the causes. In these cases the laws are said to be “chemical”: the resultants have properties that are not present in the causes. But in the case of social phenomena, there is nothing in the resultant whole that is not already in the parts; the resultant whole is simply, as Mill says, the “sum” of the parts. In these cases, then, there is two fold process of inference. First, we consider each cause that is operating and use the science of psychology to infer what effect it would have. Second, we then deduce the laws for the group, that is, the social laws. The deduction is direct, since the social cause is the sum of the individual causes taken as parts, and the social effect is the sum of the individual effects taken as parts.

Thus, it is possible to discover the laws for the group phenomena simply by deducing them from the assumed conjunction of the many single causes. This is what Mill calls the “physical” or “concrete deductive” method (Logic, VI, ix). It can be used in political economy, where one assumes everyone is acting on the motive of preferring the greater gain to the smaller (Logic, VI, ix, 3). However, in other social phenomena there are many more motives, many more causes, as in sociology and history, and here it is necessary to trace over time the detailed effects of all the many causes. However, this detailed set of inferences is beyond the powers of human computation. The best that we can do is begin with the empirical laws of social phenomena and show by deduction that this was likely to result from what we know of the nature of humankind and the circumstances in which the many individuals then existed. This is the “inverse deductive” method (Logic, VI, x, 4).

In either case, however, it is never possible safely to assume that we have located all the causes. That means, in effect, that the laws of social phenomena that we have located are in fact gappy. Social science can therefore never be anything more than a science of tendencies rather than one in which positive predictions are possible. This is in fact the best that we can do, given the complexity of the phenomena; but even so, such knowledge can be useful in proposing policy (Logic, VI, ix, 2). After all, weather forecasting, too, is useful, even though it too is only a science of tendencies (Logic, III, xvii, 2).

It is evident that these methods for investigating social phenomena can work only if the deductions that Mill describes really are valid. Mill, naturally, argues that they are. In fact he holds that they occur elsewhere in science, in physics in particular (Logic, VI, ix, 1). Thus, for example, in mechanics it would appear to be possible to deduce the laws for a complex system from the laws for simple systems. If we have a three-body system, we can conceptually divide it into three two-body systems, and knowing the forces that would operate in the two-body systems were they isolated, we can deduce what the forces are that are operating in the three-body system. Mill holds that this deduction proceeds a priori (Logic, III, vi, xi); in these cases, as opposed to those such as chemistry and psychology where the effect is “heterogeneous” with its causes, “the joint effect of the causes is the sum of their separate effects” (Logic, III, vi, 2; italics added), and, while we know the law of the separate causes by induction, the inference to their joint effects involves no further induction but only “ratiocination” (Logic, III, xi, 1, 2). In fact, in this matter Mill is simply wrong. In order for the deduction to go through one must take into account the relations by which the simpler systems are constituted into the more complex system, and there is no a priori reason for assuming that a given relational structure will yield one sort of law for the complex system rather than another. This means that the deduction of the law for the complex system depends not only upon the laws for the simpler systems but also upon another factual assumption that relates the laws of the complex system to both the laws for the simpler systems and the relational structure the constitutes the complex system out of the simpler systems. This factual assumption relating the laws for the complex system to both the laws for the simpler systems and the relational structure is itself a law, not a specific causal law but rather a law about such laws. Since it is a law the step from the causal laws for the simpler systems is not one of pure ratiocination or pure deduction but also involves an inductive feature. This law, this inductive step the existence of which Mill denies, has been referred to as a “composition law.” When Mill asserts that the inference is a deduction that proceeds wholly a priori without any inductive step beyond those that provided the laws for the simple systems, he is neglecting to take into account this additional factual premise. In effect this amounts to neglecting the causal role of the relations which constitute the whole out of the parts. Mill, then, is wrong in his claim that in mechanics the deduction of a law for the complex system can be deduced a priori from the laws for simpler systems; what he calls the “deductive” method does not in fact have any place in mechanics.

Mill makes a similar mistake in the case of the social sciences. When he claims that the deduction of the laws for the complex social wholes can be deduced a priori from the laws for the parts, that is, from the laws for persons taken individually, he is claiming in effect that there is no need for a composition law, or, what amounts to the same, no need to take into account the social relations which, by virtue of holding among individuals, constitute the social whole out of those individuals. Mill suggests that in the social sciences, the individual cases act “conjunctively,” in just the way that they act in mechanics (Logic, VI, ix, 1). But a conjunction is merely that and not a relational whole. Mill also indicates that the inference from the laws of the co-existent causes to the “aggregate” effect is something that we can “calculate a priori” (ibid.); the inference will, of course, be a priori if it proceeds on the basis of a conjunction of premises, but not if it requires additional factual premises concerning the relational structure and a composition law. He also suggests, as we have noted, that the total social effect is merely the “sum” of the individual effects. He makes the same point when he explicitly compares social phenomena to those of mechanics. For, he tells us, “in social phenomena the Composition of Causes is the universal law” (Logic, VI, vii, 1), where the Composition of Causes is “the principle which is exemplified in all cases in which the joint effect of several causes is identical with the sum of their several effects” (Logic, III, vi, 1; italics added). In short, when Mill proposes the “deductive” method for the social sciences he is neglecting to take into account social relations as relevant factors. It is much as if Newton failed to take into account the relative positions of the planets when he inferred the forces acting in the solar system from the assumption that gravity would act among the planets and the sun taking them pairwise; but then, Mill's account of mechanics implies that Newton did just that!

Mill was in fact sensitive in his many writings to the role of social relations. He had early in his career supported many of the ideas of Coleridge against the dogmatic social atomism earlier utilitarian radicals. From Coleridge he had learned to appreciate the role of social and cultural institutions in the historical development of human beings. Mill, like his father, was a determinist with regard to social phenomena, but from Comte he had absorbed the idea that social change proceeds in a series of stages: there are “critical periods,” in which old institutions are overthrown, and these are followed by “organic periods,” in which new forms of social structure emerge and are consolidated. He felt that in his own time society was emerging from a critical period. It was from his reading of Coleridge on social institutions that Mill came to be aware of the roles that they, especially educational institutions, would play in re-establishing a new social structures, new forms of social relations.

Mill certainly objected to the notion, found in Coleridge and other Hegelians, in Comte (both of whom he had read) and Marx (whom he had not read), that there are social wholes that are greater than the individuals which are their parts. To be sure, institutions, particularly those that are involved in education, shape the individuals that are their members. But these institutions, Mill holds, are not somehow metaphysically superior to, or more real than those individuals. Mill rejects this notion on empiricist grounds: we see no such entities. The Law in its majesty may condemn defendant Y, but what we observe is judge X passing sentence on that defendant: it may be the Inquisition that condemns Juan to the auto da fe but it is Torquemada whom we observe sentencing the wretch. As Mill put it, people “do not form a new kind of substance” when they come together in society. (Logic, Bk. VI, ch. 7, sec. 1) To be sure, when people come together in a social group they are “members of a body”. (Utilitarianism, ch. 3). What is crucial, of course, what makes them members of a body are the social relations in which these individuals stand to one another. Social wholes are all reducible to individuals and the social relations in which they stand to one another. This we can refer to as “reduction1.” Reduction1 is the reduction of concepts.

There is also “reduction2”, the reduction of laws in the sense of the deduction of laws for complex social systems from the laws for simpler systems. Clearly, this depends upon whether or not there is a composition law. Reduction1 is a matter of empiricist principle; reduction2, in contrast, is a matter of fact, does a composition law obtain? Corresponding to the two cases of reduction of social laws to laws about individuals are two senses of “methodological individualism.” In the debate about methodological individualism these two senses are often confused (as in, for example, Popper); and it is important to keep them distinct, as the grounds for accepting them are different in the two cases. In Mill, they are clearly distinct, and the reasons for accepting them are with equal clarity distinct. Mill is a methodological individualist in the first sense; in this he is on solid empiricist ground. He is also a methodological individualist in the second sense; but in this his reasons are mistaken. But he is likely right here too, even though his reasons are wrong.

Social relations are constituted by social roles, that is, habits of behaviour and feelings and emotions of two or more individuals coordinated relative to each other by symbols, mainly linguistic symbols. Thus, Ysaying to Z “I promise x” effects the coordination of the behaviour of Yas promisor and Z as promisee. The issue of reduction2 is this: can the laws for the learning and performance of the social roles appropriate to large groups, e.g., behaviour in a mob, be deduced from the basic laws for learning for small groups, that is, the laws of association. It is likely that they can; it is pretty clear that Mill thought that the learning of social roles of any sort could be derived from the laws of association. He is likely to be right in affirming methodological individualism in the second sense, even though his official set of reasons are mistaken.

Mill's father argued in his Essay on Government (1820) for a democratic form of government. He deduced his conclusions more or less geometrically from a set of narrow egoistic assumptions about human motivation. This was attacked by T. B. Macaulay in his masterful essay “Mill on Government” in the Edinburgh Review in 1829. It was criticized for being abstract and based on a priori assumptions about human behaviour, in particular the “pernicious” assumption that people are moved only by narrow self interest. Rather than the geometric method of the elder Mill, Macaulay, invoking the name of Bacon, advocated that social thinkers use the inductive method, proceeding from historical studies to general conclusions. If the issues were thought through in this way, one would end up a Whig like Macaulay rather than a social radical like Mill and Bentham. Bentham replied in the Westminster Review, but not very effectively. More to the point were the methodological reflections of the younger Mill. He granted the correctness of Macaulay's criticism of his father's use of the geometric method. Its narrow assumptions omitted many relevant variables, and did not allow for changing social conditions. But he also argued that Macaulay's proposal for the use of history and the inductive method amounted to the use of induction by simple enumeration, and failed for the reason that that method failed generally, its failure to eliminate alternatives. So Macaulay's conclusions were as unsound as those of his father. But the eliminative methods for experimental science were also inappropriate: the phenomena in question are too complex for such methods. Mill therefore recommended what he called the inverse deductive method: he saw his discussion of this method in his Logic as a defence of his father and of the philosophic radicals. By this method, the best that we can do is begin with the empirical laws of social phenomena and show by deduction that this was likely to result from what we know of the nature of humankind and the circumstances in which the many individuals then existed. Mill's justification of this method failed, as we have noted. More recent methdologists have found that complexity can be handled in another way, by the use of statistical methods which “average out” as it were the effects of complex and unknown relevant factors.

The younger Mill could still mount a defence of democracy, as we shall see: his father's method of reasoning may have had its faults, but the general point could be sustained. It could still be argued that a society with a set of democratic institutions would better than alternatives foster human development and well-being. On the one hand, this argument does not depend on assuming the only motive is narrow self-interest; it can allow, as the younger Mill knew was the case, that there are other and higher human motives. On the other hand, this argument builds on an awareness of the importance, learned from Coleridge, of social institutions in developing and furthering human ends. Where his father's argument was social atomistic in its assumptions, that of the younger Mill built on an awareness of the existence and significance of social relations.

In his work is the social sciences, then, and in is work as a social reformer, Mill was well aware of the importance of social relations as relevant variables. In this he had gone beyond the social atomism of his father. But in his proposals for a methodology of social science he quite neglected the role of those social relations. In his methodological pronouncements he has had not yet freed himself from those atomistic assumptions.

It was only later that methodologists came to recognize that the way to deal with the complexity of social phenomena and therefore the inevitable gappiness of the laws that we can discover is through the use of statistical methods.

The gappiness of our knowledge in the case of social phenomena means, of course, that both reduction1 and reduction2 are matters of principle, and not matters to be pursued in ordinary research is the social sciences. To fully reduce1 all the social concepts would involve giving a detailed description of all the social roles that combine to form the institutions reality. We are far form being able to do this, save in very simple cases such as promising (saying “I promise”). One must make do with concepts that are only partially defined and which fit in only ill-determined ways with other such concepts in statements of “law” in sociology. In many respects we have not gone much further than in Mill's own day.

The same holds for reduction2. We are far from being able to deduce the laws for behaviour in complex social contexts from the simple laws of learning.

Mill recognizes both these limitations of social scientific knowledge. Nonetheless, it perhaps goes without saying that neither should be seen as a bar to on-going scientific investigations of social phenomena: they mark the gappiness of our knowledge of laws in these areas and should therefore imply the need for further research, not its cessation. More empirical research is called for, and not a throwing of our hands in the air with lamentations concerning the limitations the world has imposed upon us; nor are we forced to retreat to some non-scientific sort of “intuition” to supply what science had found it could not (yet) supply: the cognitive goal of inquiry remains the closing of the gaps in our empirical knowledge, and the method that is called for is empirical and, broadly understood, inductive.

Even though neither reduction1 nor reduction2 are at present feasible as clear programmes for research, it is nonetheless important that they be affirmed and defended. Reduction1 is the denial that there are super-empirical entities, like the Law or the Church, that explain social change (or lack of it) in a way that is not reducible to the behaviour of individual persons. There are no such entities, and one cannot, by appeal to such an entity, escape one's responsibility for the way the world is. As for reduction2, this is important to make the point that science is indeed and as matter of fact part of a unified science of which physics is the central theory (at the top, or, if you wish to vary the metaphor, at the bottom of their hierarchical order though which all other theories find their ultimate grounding). In either case, that of reduction1 or reduction2, the point is to make the case against the possibility of gaining knowledge of society by means other than the inductive methods science. Thinkers like Coleridge (or Marx) often claim that they have special cognitive means, e.g., rational intuition or dialectics, for gaining knowledge of social wholes, and this (spurious) knowledge is then cited as grounds for special social policy recommendations. Such appeals are more ideology than reason, and inevitably must be rejected. But the potential harm is great indeed. What could be more retrograde than Coleridge's defence of the established Church and of the House of Lords (or the game laws or the practice of the English aristocracy of fox hunting [recently defended on philosohical grounds by Roger Scruton])? What could be more dangerous than the a priori justification of revolutionary terror by Robbespierre (or by Marx or Lenin or Pol Pot)? Rational persons accept rational means, in both cognition and as justifying social policy recommendations: cognitively, that rational means is inquiry conforming to the standards of empirical science and the inductive method, in sociology as in psychology as in physics, and in social policy the reasonable person, to justify those decisions, relies on what one has by way of knowledge, where that knowledge is cognitively acceptable as the product of scientific inquiry. The point is that the same general methods are to be used for people as are used for stones or stars. The arguments for reduction1 and reduction2 are simply defences of the claim that the methods of sociology are the methods of empirical science.

11. Political Economy

In political economy Mill built upon the foundations laid down by Ricardo, Malthus and his father. His Principles of Political Economy and some of the applications to Social Philosophy (1848) was the leading economics textbook for many years. Mill's reasoning generally followed that of Ricardo and Malthus, but was more realistic, allowing that beyond the motive of pecuniary gain and economic self-interest, there were other, higher motives that could play a role, and that moreover institutional forms and even sheer habit might also be relevant. These concerns, and well as his greater methodological insights, led him to challenge the claims of the classical school that wages, rent and profit are the result of immutable laws: there may be laws about wages, but there is no “iron law” of wages. These laws are, to the contrary, the result of institutional constraints, and these institutions can be changed, if the will be there. He came to regard the Malthusian principle of population not as an immutable law and a barrier to progress, but as showing the conditions under which progress can be achieved. His book is throughout governed by his belief in the possibility of great social improvements, combined with a determination to expose simplistic remedies and uncomfortable truths.

In analytical theory, Mill at first differed little from Ricardo, but in later editions of his Principles he came to modify those views. Thus, for example, the theory of the wages fund was modified almost to the point of rejection under the criticisms of William Thomas Thornton. Where Mill first adopted Ricardo's view that the average wage is determined by a fixed lot of capital divided by the number of workers, he came to allow that other factors play a role in determining wages, among them workers' expectations as well as various institutional factors.

Mill emphasized the distinction between production and distribution: there are laws in both cases, but these laws are different in kind. The laws of the former, he argued, “partake of the character of physical truths…. It is not so with the Distribution of Wealth. That is a mater of human institution merely” (Principles, p. 199). The way goods are distributed depends upon the rules of property, and Mill explores various sorts of property relations, from the usual form of his own country, to the ways of holding property in Ireland and India, to the various forms of socialism. The rules that obtain at any given time or place “are what the opinions of the ruling portion of the community makes them” (ibid., p. 200); but these in turn are “not a matter of chance” (ibid.). To the contrary, they have causes and these can be understood using the methods of empirical science: they are “as much a subject for scientific enquiry as any of the physical laws of nature” (ibid., p. 21). However, though Mill emphasizes how production and distribution differ, he holds that production too depends upon social factors. For example, security and monetary incentives are among the things that influence productivity.

From more recent perspectives in economic analysis, some of Mill's economics decidedly looks backward. Thus, Mill retains the now abandoned distinction between productive and unproductive labour. But if this has no place in pure economics, it does have a legitimate place in Mill's work. For Mill the distinction is related to his concern to eliminate vestiges of feudalism, the primitive sector of the economy in which retainers and menial servants are maintained more or less in idleness. This concern recommends the development of the more advanced industrial at the expense of the pre-industrial sector. Mill's economics should be seen as concerned as much with the economics of development as it is with pure theory. Nor is Mill's concern simply with the production of material goods: Book 4, Ch. 6 of the Principles (“Of the Stationary State”) ends with a moving plea for the preservation of natural beauty.

On the whole Mill supported the laissez faire economic policies that had been defended by earlier economists such a his father and David Ricardo. His overall concern was here as elsewhere with self development, and laissez faire policies seemed to provide the scope needed for individual freedom. But on further reflection, moved in this by his wife, he came to the view that personal development required not just the freedom of the economic market but also political freedom, and that this is of little use to an individual who lacks economic security and opportunity. Mill was concerned, too, with motivation. He saw the system of wages that had developed in the industrial revolution as one which robbed the workers of any interest in the goods that they were producing. He came increasingly to re-examine the objections to socialism, and came to argue in later editions of the Principles that, as far as economic theory was concerned, there is nothing in principle in economic theory that precludes an economic order based on socialist policies. He therefore made the radical proposal that the whole wage system be abolished, and that it be replaced by a cooperative system in which the producers would act in combinations, collectively owning the capital necessary for carrying on their operations, and working under managers who would be responsible overall to them. Like Ricardo, he held that profits in the long run would tend to diminish and that the formation of new capital would thereby come to an end. This would bring industry to a halt and population to a stationary level. The result would be a relatively static form of society. In such a society, Mill hoped, people's thoughts would turn from concerns of self-interest to more socially and humanly worthy ends. In such a state many of our present problems would disappear.

Mill summed up his objective in his Autobiography (1873): “how to unite the greatest individual liberty of action, with a common ownership in the raw material of the globe, and an equal participation of all in the benefits of combined labour.” (p. 239) In his economic theory Mill no doubt appears to the modern socialist to be a follower of Ricardo and the classical liberal economists, but to the latter, and no doubt to himself, he was clearly a socialist.

12. Moral Philosophy: Utilitarianism

Throughout his major works and in his many essays, Mill argues that the moral worth of actions is to be judged in terms of the consequences of those actions. In this he contrasts his own view with that of those who appealed to moral intuitions. For some, these intuitions are just that, in which case they have little moral force indeed; they are simply the arbitrary feelings of approbation and disapprobation. But intuitions conflict, and we need some standard to decide which of these feelings is correct. Intuition does not supply that. There are some, however, such as William Whewell (here as in the philosophy of science his arch opponent) or Immanuel Kant, or, later, idealists such as T. H. Green, who claim that there are objective criteria for adjudicating conflicts. These philosophers support their intuitions by appeal to a moral order that pervades the universe, some sort of moral essence or objective demand from the noumenal or transcendental realm. However, given the basic argument that Mill offers for the relativity of all knowledge these claims do not amount to much; they are to be taken no more seriously than those who justify their moral judgments by appeal to “God said so”. These opponents all appeal to no more than their private sentiment: this is what I like or this is what I dislike. That fact that it appears as a moral authority gives it no superior authority.

Moral intuitions are said to reveal ends which are superior to those of our worldly nature, superior to mere pleasure and self-interest. Mill of course agrees that our moral feelings often conflict with our inclinations of self-interest. But these feelings are not feelings that are contrary to our pleasure. They like all ends are sought to the extent to which they are enjoyable. It is just that different, and conflicting things, are enjoyable.

Mill can of course account for these divergent feelings and inclinations. On the psychological account of human being that he defends, pleasure and pain are the prime motivators. Other things are sought, at least initially, as means to pleasure or the avoidance of pain. But as the associative mechanisms work, things that are sought as means come to be associated with the ends for which they are means. These things come to be sought as ends in themselves, as parts of pleasure. The variety of ends that persons suggest are morally demanded by their intuitions are simply things that have come to be among those things that are for them part of pleasure, ends that are in conflict with those ends that are other parts of pleasure. The appeal to intuition does not solve the problems of moral philosophy. It is no more than a commonplace of fact, that we feel better about some ends rather than others and that we often feel that our ends are better that those that others have. The real problem is elsewhere: how to resolve the conflict.

All ends are either pleasure or parts or of pleasure. This is a matter of psychological fact. As Mill puts it, “to desire anything, except in proportion as the idea of it is pleasure, is a physical and metaphysical impossibility” (Utilitarianism, Ch. 4). This implies that pleasure is the end of morality:

The sole evidence it is possible to produce that anything is desirable [ = worthy of desire], is that people do actually desire it. If the end which the utilitarian doctrine proposes to itself were not, in theory and in practice, acknowledged to be an end, nothing could ever convince any person that it was so (Utilitarianism, Ch. 4).

Mill's point is often criticized as making an illegitimate inference from “is” to “ought,” from “is desired” to “is worthy of desire.” G. E. Moore made such a criticism, calling it the “naturalistic fallacy.” It is indeed a move characteristic of Mill's naturalism which makes experience the test of one's principles, in ethics as in science. Moreover, such a move is in many cases a fallacy. Mill was himself to criticize just such a fallacious move in his late essay on “Nature.” But in the present case, the inference is not a fallacy. In his proof of the principle of utility, Mill does infer an ought from an is, but he does so legitimately. Mill's point is that, just as we must make inductions, and must accept certain basic perceptual judgments, so we must seek pleasure. And since, as a matter of lawful fact about human beings, we must seek pleasure, it is unreasonable to suggest that anything else could be morally demanded of us. Mill is here replying especially to Carlyle, who asked (in Sartor Resartus), “What right do you have to pleasure?” Mill's reply is that so to act is right because that is just the way human beings are, anything else is simply not, as a matter of psychological fact, possible: we cannot be in any other way. Mill in this argument is (once again) relying on the principle that must implies ought, the converse of the principle that ought implies can. If these principles did not govern our moral attitudes, we would end up attempting the impossible, and, if the point of morality is to guide action, then that is unreasonable: any action attempting the impossible is bound to be pointless.

The maximization of pleasure or happiness is therefore the moral end. But this ought not to be taken in simplistic terms. Mill's is not a crude hedonism. In the first place, it is not crude sensual pleasure that is the aim. Rather, welfare consists in the satisfaction of desire, and the relevant pleasure is the pleasure that comes from satisfied desire. In the second place, when he insists that welfare consists in the experiencing of pleasurable states, he argues, in contrast to what Bentham implied, that quality, not simply the amount of pleasure, is to be taken into account. As Mill came to see in his own experience, reading Wordsworth is better as an experience than drinking ale. As he put it himself, better Socrates dissatisfied than a pig satisfied. Some experiences are qualitatively better than others, and in determining which line of action is better, this has to be part of the calculation. These pleasures are not merely the sum of more elementary pleasures; they are qualitatively different. These differences are a matter of the chemical nature of psychological processes. Among the qualitatively superior ends are the moral ends, and it is in this that people acquire the sense that they have moral intuitions superior to mere self-interest. And in the third place, Mill holds that it is possible to be content with life even though dissatisfied, provided that one has the proper balance of pleasure, reckoned both quantitatively and qualitatively. As he himself suggested, better Socrates dissatisfied than a pig satisfied. The pig may be satisfied, but Socrates' life, even with its dissatisfaction, is preferable. The person who has a good life has a reasonable balance of tranquility, on the one hand, and, on the other, moments of excitement and more intense pleasure.

Human beings collectively develop rules to aid them in their efforts to maximize their happiness. Each of us wants to appropriate goods to satisfy our material needs. But they are scarce, not everyone can satisfy these needs. Given this scarcity of material goods, there will be conflict. If one succeeds in appropriating goods, then others will attempt to take them away to satisfy their own needs. What one more exactly wants is not a maximum of goods but a satisfactory level of goods together with security of tenure. Since each has this an end, norms for the distribution of the scarce goods come to be established. Together with these norms of justice there will also come to be established norms for their enforcement, for the punishment of those who violate these norms. These norms with sanctions attached, that is, the norms of justice will function as means to the satisfaction of material desires, but through the associative mechanisms they will come to sought as ends, as parts of one's pleasure. Because they concern the essential of human well-being, they therefore come to felt as more morally demanding than the principle of utility itself.

The principle of utility judges these norms. Mill is therefore not an “act utilitarian” who holds that the principle of utility is used to judge the rightness or wrongness of each and every act. But neither is he a “rule utilitarian” who holds that individual acts are judged by various moral rules which are themselves judged by the principle of utility acting as a second order principle to determine which set of rules secures the greatest amount of happiness. For the principle of utility judges not simply rules, according to Mill, but rules with sanctions attached. But Mill holds that there are some occasions on which the principle of utility must be used to judge individual acts. There are two sorts of such occasion. One is to judge when exceptions to ordinary rules are to occur or to judge which subsidiary rule applies when two come into conflict. The other is to judge actions aimed at changing the social structure of rules. It is the leaders in “the ruling portion of the community” who must think and plan in this way, those who are in positions of economic or political or moral power that enables them to sway or determine public feeling and sentiments for social change.

Different forms of such things as agricultural practice will generate different patterns of what will be accepted as norms for distribution; the legitimate ends of justice will be secured by different institutional forms. It is these forms that develop over time through periods of crisis and consolidation.

This consolidation or re-consolidation results in better social forms. Mill in fact argues that such social improvement is the overall trend of development: the direction is to maximize the general well-being. Mill argues that since each person aims to maximize his or her own happiness therefore the overall effect will be to maximize the pleasure of all. As he puts it, since “each person's happiness is a good to that person, then ‘the general happiness’ must be a good to the aggregate of all persons” (Utilitarianism, Ch. 4). It is commonly charged that Mill's inference commits the fallacy of composition—the fallacy that since this person has a mother, that person has a mother, and that other person has a mother, therefore the aggregate of all persons has a mother. But as he elsewhere explains that “I merely meant in this particular sentence to argue that since As happiness is a good, Bs is a good, Cs is a good, etc., the sum of all these goods must be a good” (Later Letters, p. 1414).

Nor is Mill arguing that since each seeks his or her own happiness, therefore each seeks the happiness of all, though he is often accused of this fallacy. To the contrary, Mill clearly holds that it is seldom true that individuals seek the general happiness. In the best state of society this would be so. But we are clearly not in the best state. In fact, it would be contrary to the principle of utility itself to have individuals constantly seeking the general good. To seek the general good would require constant calculation of long term consequences, and that is hardly possible. If it were attempted, then mistakes would be made and time wasted. Better on utilitarian grounds to work with subsidiary and time-tested rules, with the appeal to utility itself being made only on those relatively rare occasions when subsidiary rules come into conflict or where exceptions are needed, or where whole systems of rules are called into question.

Mill's inference is nonetheless fallacious. It presupposes that the laws for the social whole, the aggregate, are simply the sum of the laws for the individual cases. This is simply an application of the inverse deductive methods that Mill advocates in the System of Logic. But this method is fallacious, as we have seen: it ignores the causal role of social relations. Mill in fact in other contexts recognizes this. For he holds that a greater degree of general well-being might be achieved by a different form of social organization.

There is, then, no general justification for the principle of utility. But this does not mean that after all each individual is nothing more than an egoist seeking his or her own happiness and that there is no basis in human nature for a rule capable of resolving conflicts. There is, in the first place, the forms of justice that develop; conformity to these rules which ensure that the needs of others as well as one's own are satisfied, becomes part of the pleasure of each. These systems of rules will often, as in complex modern societies, have rules for changing the rules and magistrates or others in positions of power who can determine how society will change and develop.

But further, in the second place, there is the natural sympathy of human kind, each for the other, or at least the others that are close to us. On this tendency, each is inclined to feel as others feel, so that the ends of others become naturally our own ends. This yields common rather than conflicting ends. In this way the good of all becomes part of the good of each. Each of us thus comes to move in unity with our fellows for the good of each and all.

Our natural sympathy thus works to establish a set of social relations that unite individuals into a community. In his theory Mill may ignore social relations, implicitly denying their existence, but when he comes to consider how society actually works he clearly allows for their existence. In these respects he both looks back to the social atomism of an earlier generation of utilitarian radicals but also, when he admits those relations, makes an advance on their thought.

Sympathy is thus important in insuring that each and all work for a common good. But this common good may not in fact be the best that can be achieved. Sympathy can often be constrained by forms of social order. Greater well being can be achieved only by achieving new forms of social organization. As Mill sees it, the opportunity for such improvement comes in the critical periods of social development. It is in such contexts that moral leaders such as Socrates and Jesus can and have played a crucial role. They can captivate the overall general sympathy present in society to bring about better social structures to be consolidated into improved organic periods.

Utilitarianism is not a simplistic moral principle to be mechanically applied, it is a long term social project.

13. Social and Political Philosophy

For Mill government is not a matter of natural rights or social contract, as in many forms of liberalism. Forms of government are, rather, to be judged according to “utility in the largest sense, grounded on the permanent interest of man as a progressive being” (On Liberty, p. 224). By this he means that forms of government are to be evaluated in terms of their capacity to enable each person to exercise and develop in his or her own way their capacities for higher forms of human happiness. Such development will be an end for each individual, but also a means for society as whole to develop and to make life better for all.

Given the centrality of self development, Mill argues that liberty is the fundamental human right. “The sole end,” he proposes, “for which mankind are warranted, individually or collectively… in interfering with the liberty of action of any of their number, is self-protection” (On Liberty p. 223). This will enable each to seek his or her own best; it will liberate a diversity of interests to the benefit of the individual and of all; and it will nurture moral freedom and rationality. With the latter will come creativity and the means of social and intellectual progress. Mill's On Liberty remains the strongest and most eloquent defense of liberalism that we have. He argues in particular for freedom of thought and discussion. “We can never be sure,” he wrote, “that the opinion we are endeavoring to stifle is a false opinion, and if we were sure, stifling it would be an evil still” (On Liberty, p. 229). Our beliefs and actions are reasonable or not depending upon our capacity to critically assess them. Only through free debate can such critical skills be developed and maintained: our self-development as reasonable persons, capable of critical assessments for belief and action. And if our beliefs and actions emerge from the critical assessment such debate involves, if they survive the struggle w it were in the “marketplace of ideas”, then, and only then, will one be entitled to accept them as justified. Even so, even though that is the best guarantee that there is sufficient reason to justify accepting the belief as true or the action as right, nonetheless, as always, we are fallible: while it may be the best guarantee of truth or belief or rightness of action that we have, one must also allow that it is best only so far as our fallible judgement allows. And that fallibility means, of course, that the debate must be on-going.

The best sort of person is one who individually is responsible for his or her beliefs and actions. It is not someone whose beliefs or actions are simply those that conform to some custom, or are simply those that they have always had, or are simply those asserted to be correct by some authority. The best kind of beliefs and actions are those that emerge from the person's own critical assessments, and the best kind of person is the individual who can provide as required those critical assessments. As for why that sort of person is the best, it is because such a one will not only be happy in his or her own case but will be concerned with, and contribute to, the happiness of others. Individuality is, in other words, one of the main ingredients of human happiness, and it is for that reason to be cultivated. Here, as elsewhere, it is utility, the general welfare, that determines what is right and what is the best.

Since individuality is good, it is necessary to foster social institutions that contribute to that individuality. Free, uncensored debate is one such institution. So, more generally, is liberty, the right to do as one wants free from the interference of others, so long as what one wants does no harm to others. (And merely offending the moral sensitivities of others does not count as harm. Especially since others often confuse feelings of repugnance with feelings of moral disapprobation.) Democracy and representative government also contribute to the development of the individual, for much the same reason that free speech so contributes, and so these too are social institutions that are justified on utilitarian grounds.

Bentham and Mill's father had argued that democracy was the form of government that could best secure the happiness of all. The younger Mill did not disagree. But for him the end is not just well-being, as earlier utilitarians argued, though it is that. The end that recommends democracy is the tendency to foster self-development and individuality. Representative government, in particular, he defended as that form which best encourages individuality. It leads people to take a more active and intelligent participation in society. It provides moral training and encourages the development of natural human sympathies. The result is the habit of looking at social questions from an impersonal perspective rather than that of self-interest. But Mill's defense of democracy was much qualified. To be sure, he was, like the earlier utilitarians, sympathetic to the fall of the ancien régime and to the ends of the French Revolution. He had little use for the British aristocracy and criticizes it for its follies in its own country and in Ireland, and the vestiges, such as the Game Laws, of medieval privilege. He strove to liberalize the press still severely bound by an absurd libel law that excluded effective social criticism. But influenced by Coleridge he had come to see that there were virtues in social systems, even out-dated ones, else why would not have survived so long. He therefore came to appreciate the conservative arguments that unrestrained freedom is dangerous. The effort to achieve at year zero a new social order justified on a priori principles by means of Jacobin terror can be as great a threat to liberty and to human well-being as the most repressive tyranny.

Mill argued, reasonably on utilitarian grounds, that social institutions need to be adapted to the time and place where they operate. His work in the East India Company dealing with the governance of states in India undoubtedly had a significance influence here. Referring to the rule of Akbar in India, he allowed that despotic rule could be necessary under certain conditions for stable government. He even suggests that, since people must be properly fit if democracy is to function well, a despotic form of government, if well-run with this aim in mind, might prepare its people for the exercise of responsibilities of a free electorate. His position here had some influence on British colonial administrations.

Mill, with de Tocqueville, stressed the importance of local government. He was highly critical of the chaotic forms of local administration then present in Britain, and his influence was effective after 1871 when the central government moved to bring about reforms.

In his thinking about how best to administer a state as a whole, Mill argued that the best administration was one that relied upon professional skills. He was prepared to accept the British form of parliamentary government where the executive is responsible to an elected assembly. Naturally enough, however, he was highly critical of the unelected British House of Lords, which he saw as another vestige of a more primitive feudal society. The best form of government could be determined by the test of experience and that experience found the Lords wanting.

Individuality and even eccentricity is better than massive social uniformity. The latter is the consequence of both terror and tyranny. But it can also be the consequence of democracy. Influenced by de Tocqueville's analysis of American culture, Mill came to think that the chief danger of democracy is that of suppressing individual differences, and of allowing no genuine development of minority opinion and of minority forms of culture. Democracy might will impoverish the culture of the community by imposing a single and inflexible set of mass values. This form of government has the virtue of fostering intelligence, common moral standards, and happiness; but where the citizens are unfit and passive it can be an instrument for tyranny, perhaps of one, as with Louis Napoleon, or perhaps of the many. In general, the only reliable safeguard can be institutions, educational institutions in particular, that can ensure the development of individuals with personalities strong enough to resist such pressures. But other forms of social order are also called for. Thus, after the rebellion in 1837 in Canada he defended Lord Durham's recommendations for internal responsible self-government in the colonies, free on the whole from interference from the colonial power. But, where Lord Durham recommended a central government and the assimilation of the French population to the English, Mill defended the cultural interests of the French minority, and recommended a form of federal government as an institutional means to protect those interests. A federal form of government was finally secured with the British North America Act of 1867, which created Canada as a confederation. This Act was passed while Mill a member of Parliament.

Another means suggested by Mill for the protection of minorities in a democratic system was a system of proportional representation. Finally, one might also mention his acceptance of the principle of multiple votes, in which educated and more responsible persons would be made more influential by giving them more votes than the uneducated.

Mill is concerned to provide a form of government in which the members have as much education as is feasible, and which is selected through a process in which those who do the selecting, the electors, become themselves educated as better citizens. A properly educated electorate would be willing and able to select the best as their governors. Since those elected would be better informed and wiser on specific issues that those who elected them, it would be wrong to bind the representatives to anything but a very general agreement with the beliefs and the aims of the electors. He agrees with the rejection of populism enunciated by Burke in his speech to his electors in Bristol, accepting the principle that the representative should be expected to exercise his or her own judgement, not merely to accept blindly the views of those on whose votes his or her tenure depended. It was a principle to which Mill himself adhered in his own brief term in the House of Commons. It was much to the consternation of his own electors that he attacked colonialism in the West Indies and criticized Governor Eyre in particular for his brutality in suppressing a rebellion by blacks in Jamaica. It was what cost him his seat.

14. Status of Women

Among the things for which Mill campaigned most strongly were women's rights, women's suffrage, and equal access to education for women. His essay on the Subjection of Women (1869) is an enduring defense of gender equality. His strong views in this area led to a deep serious disagreement with his father. To be sure, as one could expect, he was not able to free himself completely from the prejudices of his age: he argued, for example, that it was undesirable that women seek employment outside the home in order to support the family; and he took for granted that he knew what women would choose when made free, arguing that “Like a man when he chooses a profession, so, when a woman marries, it may in general be understood that she makes a choice of the management of a household, and the bringing up of a family, as the first call upon her exertions” (Subjection of Women, Chapter II, p. 298); and when discussing male roles that might be assumed by women and “the capacity of women to do things now routinely done by men,” he fails to suggest (when it would seem reasonable to suggest) that men could assume a role hitherto routinely done by women and could be involved in the nuturing role of the raising of children (Subjection of Women, Chapter III, pp. 299-300). It is important that Mill, in accepting such prejudices, does not follow his own rules for generalizing on the basis of good inductive evidence, but even more important that, in accepting such prejudices as reasonable, he is contributing to the pervasive customs that enforce conformity and obscure the fact that they place limits on what women might freely choose. In accepting that the domestic role is one that women would choose if freed from their subjection he is contributing his voice to those who were working, and still are working, to prevent women from choosing as freely as men might choose their social roles and preventing them from competing on equal terms with men in the roles they choose. Mill does recognize the tyranny of custom, but does not fully recognize its impact on his own arguments.

Nonetheless, his writings, and the essay on the Subjection of Women in particular, proved, and still prove, inspiring to those working for the liberation of women.

Mill argued that in the modern age people everywhere, in Britain at least, are being freed from the bondage of custom and unnecessary regulation. Thus, for example, the essentially mediaeval apprenticeship laws, which were designed for and effective in preventing competition, were being repealed, and people freed from their shackles. Women alone remain tied to a certain role. In fact, society so educates women that they bind themselves. “Men hold women in subjection by representing to them meekness, submissiveness, and resignation of all individual will into the hands of a man, as an essential part of sexual attractiveness.” (Subjection of Women, Chapter I, p. 272) The argument for freeing people from the tyranny of custom applies here also. Women must be liberated from the shackles they are trained to voluntarily impose upon themselves. It is in their own interest and in the interests of society.

That Mill himself sometimes contributes to the tyranny of these customs does not invalidate these arguments. It merely shows that Mill, like persons everywhere, cannot always free themselves from the irrationalities of their age.

Essential to the liberation of women is securing for them the ballot: he was a strong supporter of women's suffrage. While a member of Parliament, he supported the Reform Bill of 1867. But he also moved an amendment which, if passed, would have given women the vote. Naturally, it failed.

Mill's father defended democracy, but also argued that votes for women were unnecessary, since the male could adequately represent the interests of the family and those who were parts of it. But the younger Mill points out that the interests of the male could diverge from those of the female in the family. Here he recognizes as elsewhere he does not, that the actions of individuals in an aggregate often do not result in maximizing the general welfare of the parts. The essay on the Subjection of Women can be seen in large part as a long argument on the abuse of power. While Mill does argue that not all motives are egoistic and self-interested, he nonetheless held that in most affairs of economics and government such motives are dominant. A well-intentioned power might secure the interests of the governed, but the power of egoism renders this unlikely. Male self-interest is in the subjection of women. The self-interest of women is in their own liberation. Since male self-interest clearly does conflict with the self-interest of the female, the votes of women are needed to curb the pursuit of male self-interest. Here, as elsewhere, as he says in a letter to Florence Nightingale, “political power is the only security against every form of political oppression.” (Later Letters, p. 1343-44) In fact, of course, women might not see themselves as in need of liberation: they are educated to so bind themselves that they serve the interests of men and not their own. Participation in a democratic political process, where there are free and critical debates about social means and ends can be one part of many steps through which women come to recognize how they are bound contrary to their own interests and come thereby to help secure their own freedom and develop their own individuality. Which will of course serve the utilitarian end, securing their own greater happiness and the greater welfare of their own families, including male partners, and of society as a whole.

In government hitherto the interests of the family have been subservient to the interests of the dominant male partner. If the interests of the family, as an aggregate, are to be served, and beyond that, the interests of society, as an aggregate, are to be served, then gender equality is required. Changing the social relations between men and women to ones in which they play equal roles will require each to curb their self-interests and to broaden their social sympathies to include those of the other and of the whole. Mill felt this in his own life: through his relationship with Harriet Taylor, he came to the strong conviction that women's suffrage is an essential step toward the moral improvement of humankind.

15. Views on Religion

Mill remarks in his Autobiography that he must have been one of the very few in Britain who were raised without any instruction in religion or belief in a deity; certainly, he was generally taken to be an atheist or an agnostic. During his life, however, he published little on the topic of religion; as he made clear in his correspondence with Comte his fear of alienating his readers and losing his public influence led him to be determinedly cautious—indeed cautious to the extent that he was criticized for this by those who otherwise sympathized with him. The latter were rather consternated, then, with the posthumous publication of Mill's Three Essays on Religion: in spite of the strictures that appeared in Examination of Sir William Hamilton's Philosophy, it turned out that Mill was rather more sympathetic to religion than were they. But even then, he showed no sympathy to any form of institutionalized religion: he failed to share Coleridge love for the established churches, and thought even less of Comte's proposals for a rigid and hierarchical institutional “religion of humanity.” These forms of religion and religious practice all stifled individuality and personal development.

In “On Nature” Mill argues that the maxim “Follow Nature” proposed equally by the ancient Stoics and the modern Romantics is a poor guide to action, certainly one contrary to the principle of utility. ‘Nature’ might have two meanings. On the first, ‘nature’ means ‘whatever happens’, and it recommends as right whatever happens, be it good or bad. In this case, it offers no moral guidance whatsoever. On the second meaning, ‘nature’ means ‘whatever happens without human interference’—natural as opposed to artificial in the sense of being the result of human art. In this case it is contradictory since it itself is a matter of human art. Mill argues that nature in the second sense offers us a view of as much evil as good, and so proposes more a challenge to change than an ideal for imitation. The task is not to follow nature but to improve it, especially human nature: virtue is not the consequence of nature but of nurture, of cultivation.

As for nature itself, the only rational conclusion that one can draw from contemplating the amount of ugliness and unavoidable evil that it contains is that whatever principle of good is at work in the universe, if any, cannot subdue the powers of evil: it cannot be omnipotent.

In the essay on “The Utility of Religion” Mill argues that much of the apparent social utility of religion derives not from its dogma and theology but to its inculcation of a widely accepted moral code, and to the force of public opinion guided by that code. The belief in a supernatural power may have had some utility in maintaining that code, but is no longer needed and may indeed be detrimental.

There is an unfortunate tendency in supernatural religion to hinder the development not only of our intellectual, but also our moral nature. Its appeal is to self-interest rather than to disinterested and ideal motives. As with intuitionism in ethics, it stands in the way of the critical evaluation of social norms, and thereby effectively prevents action aimed at social change for the improvement of the human lot in the community. Supernatural religion appeals to the sense of mystery about what lies outside the narrow realm of what we know. But the appeal can be made by poetry: the realm of the unknown can filled only by the imagination. “Religion and poetry address themselves, at least in one of their aspects, to the same part of the human constitution; they both supply the same want, that of ideal conceptions grander and more beautiful than we see realized in the prose of human life” (“Utility of Religion,” Three Essays, p. 419).

The power of religion to motivate derives, Mill suggests, from the human need for some sort of ideal that transcends us. To be sure, this ideal is not some supernatural being or standard, as in Christianity or Platonism. It is an idea of the good, but a human idea, a conception of being human that can move us to do our best, a standard beyond our common selfish objects of desire. Such purposes can be achieved, and better achieved, by a religion of humanity than can any supernatural religion. Given the ideal, such a religion of humanity would help us cultivate our feelings and develop our individual capacities, intellectual, moral and emotional, without burdening us with false views about a mysterious Unknowable. The contrast would be to a God of the sort Mansel proposed, one Just beyond all human justice, a principle of Goodness that creates the world in its image and therefore whose existence requires us to deny that the palpable evil that we find really is evil. The religion of humanity would draw our attention to real evil in the world, and urge us to work to overcome it.

These first two essays had been written by 1858; the third, “Theism,” was drafted more than a decade later. The first two suggest that the alternative to supernatural religion is not the acceptance of nature and the way things are but the construction of a positive religion of humanity. The third essay makes greater concessions to traditional religion. In this essay Mill evaluates the traditional arguments for the existence of God. He rejects straight out any argument based on an a priori causal principle. But he suggests that the order to be found in the universe, in particular the adjustments of organisms for the ends of survival and reproduction, provides grounds for tentatively accepting the existence of a creator. Even here, however, he allows only that it can be established with “no more than probability” that the cause of such order is the activity of some intelligent designer. He allows, too, that one might, contrary to Mansel, characterize the creator in a humanly relevant way as benevolent, though it could be neither omniscient nor omnipotent. For Mill the point about a world created by such a God is that it leaves room for the work of human beings in improving both that world and themselves as persons in it. “If man had not the power,” he indicates, “by the exercise of his own energies for the improvement both of himself and of his outward circumstances, to do for himself and other creatures vastly more than god had in the first instance done, the Being who called them into existence would deserve something very different from thanks at his hands.” (“Theism,” Three Essays, p. 458)

Mill argues in the same essay that there is no evidence for the immortality of the soul, but equally none against it. For Mill, this means that there is room for hope. Some persons at least do hope, if not for eternal life, then for a life that extends beyond their death. It is possible, he suggests, that the benevolent and powerful (though not all-powerful) creator could grant that wish. Such at least one might hope.

Defenders of religion had long appealed to miracles as support for their beliefs about the supernatural. In his essay Mill is highly critical of such appeals; there is absolutely no evidence that supports such claims. He allows only that a benevolent deity might have indicated an intention to award to those who aspire to it a life after death; if there is no rational evidence in support of that, then one might at least so hope. To this extent he allows that Jesus was indeed miraculously Christ, and that He bore such a message of “glad tidings” for the hopeful.

In spite of Mill's argument that the proper rational attitude towards supernatural religion is neither belief nor disbelief, he now concludes, in his last essay, in a way that many found rather surprising, that “the whole domain of the supernatural is thus removed from the region of Belief into that of simple Hope.” (“Theism,” Three Essays, p. 483) Indeed, such hope might be reasonably be encouraged, since its indulgence might encourage in some persons both the feeling that life is important and their sympathy for others. Further, to construct for oneself or for one's community, an image of a person of high moral excellence, such as Jesus, and from the habit of seeking approval of this person for one's own acts, may aid that “real, though purely human, religion, which sometimes calls itself the Religion of Humanity, and sometimes that of Duty.” (“Theism,” p. 488) This develops further his concept of the moral significance of cultivating the emotions and reflects the lesson he had learned early in his life, as he recovered from his bout of depression, that human beings can flourish only with the cultivation of the feelings.

In his considerations about the existence of a cause for order in the universe, Mill mentions only in passing the work of Charles Darwin, that natural selection is the cause of apparent design in the natural world. As soon became apparent, this theory removed whatever tentative support Mill had allowed for the existence of a benevolent creator. Hope alone remained the only legitimate religious sentiment, but that hope rested on the sense that there is a creator who might fulfill it. Upon the demise with Darwin's work of any expectation for the existence of such a creator all the slim hopes of religion disappeared. The later Victorians could not share Mill's optimism. They found that all that remained was to shake a fist in rage at the heavens that disappointed and stared back silently.

16. Conclusion

Mill's thought was of a whole. He was consistently empiricist in his metaphysics and epistemology, and he developed his moral thinking in this framework. At the same time that moral philosophy shaped his metaphysics. He aimed to show humans the way the world is and how they could accommodate themselves to it and to one another. His aim was the improvement of humankind. His guide was the principle of utility.

This is often missed. The principle of utility has become the object of scholastic discussion. People debate whether Mill's notion that there are some pleasures that are to be preferred to others makes good sense. The human aspect of this is ignored. Mill put it well, and makes it clear that his claims on this point are solidly based.

Few human creatures would consent to be changed into any other lower animals, for a promise of the fullest allowance of a beast's pleasures; no intelligent human being would consent to be a fool, no instructed person would be an ignoramus, no person of feeling and conscience would be selfish and base, even though they should be persuaded that the fool, the dunce, or the rascal is better satisfied with his lot than they are with theirs. (Utilitarianism, p. 211)

People also critically reject Mill's case for the principle, rejecting it on the grounds that this or that contrived counter-example shows some imperfection in Mill's formulation. But this is to miss the point of Mill's work. There may be imperfections in what was said, but the aim of the whole is clear and criticism should always try to be constructive, not merely negative. Mill himself made clear that nature of the moral imperative that he proposed.

In the golden rule of Jesus of Nazareth, we read the complete spirit of the ethics of utility. To do as one would be done by, and to love one's neighbor as oneself, constitute the ideal perfection of utilitarian morality. As the means of making the nearest approach to this ideal, utility would enjoin, first, that laws and social arrangements should place the happiness, or (as speaking practically it may be called) the interest, of every individual as nearly as possible in harmony with the interest of the whole; and secondly, that education and opinion, which have so fast a power over human character, should so use that power as to establish in the mind of every individual an indissoluble association between his own happiness and the good of the whole…. (Utilitarianism, p. 218)

We, and the world, would do well to follow Mill in these principles. All would be the better for it.

Mill aimed at the improvement of humankind. For this end, he was active in many causes. He denounced the take over by the British government of the East India Company, correctly anticipating the evils consequent upon the scramble for spoils by second rate English officials. He supported reform of the Irish land tenure system in order to relieve the poverty of the peasants. During his period in Parliament, he denounced English methods in Ireland, a move which was unfortunately denounced as support for the Fenians. In 1866 and 1867, he was active along with Herbert Spencer and many other liberals in the committee for the prosecution of Governor Eyre for atrocities in suppressing a rebellion by blacks in Jamaica. He supported attempts to preserve natural beauty and was a founder and strong supporter of the Commons Preservation Society.

In his own day Mill was immensely influential. He was never one to compromise his principles, and his pursuit of those ideals was steady and often successful.

Mill's metaphysics is perhaps less influential now than it was in his own day. Certainly, for many decades it stood in the shadow of idealism. His revival of formal logic inspired the developments that now date it. In the philosophy of science, his empiricism has for the most part stood the test of time. But his lasting influence has been in the areas of political and social philosophy. His defenses of utilitarianism and of liberty shaped the views of his own generation, and they continue to this day to inspire and to guide. There are many who might be critical of details of, say, the utilitarianism but who are moved by the same general idea of the good. Thus, for example, the philosopher and economist Amartya Sen is critical of various formulations of the utilitarian ethic in his Collective Choice and Social Welfare(1970), but equally clearly is moved by Millian ends in, say, his Inequality Reexamined (1992) or Development as Freedom (1999). Sen is hardly alone in having views for which Mill is the clear inspiration. In thought especially but also in action Mill made of the world a better place.


Mill's Works

The standard edition of Mill's writings, in thirty-three volumes, is the following:

[CW] Mill, J. S., Collected Works of John Stuart Mill, J. M. Robson (ed.), Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1963ff.

The introductions by various authors are in each case worth reading. Volume and page numbers given below for Mill's works are to this edition. Page references in the preceding article refer to this edition.

(1838) “Bentham,” CW, v. 10, pp. 75-115
(1840) “Coleridge,” CW, v. 10. pp. 117-63
(1843) System of Logic, Ratiocinative and Inductive, CW, v. 7-8
(1848) Principles of Political Economy, CW, v. 2-3
(1859) On Liberty, CW, v. 18, pp. 213-310
(1861a) Utilitarianism, CW, v. 10, pp. 203-59
(1861b) Considerations on Representative Government, CW, v. 29, pp. 371-577
(1865a) An Examination of Sir William Hamilton's Philosophy, CW, v. 9
(1865b) Auguste Comte and Positivism, CW, v. 10, pp. 261-368
(1869a) The Subjection of Women, CW, v. 21, pp. 259-340
(1869b) Notes to James Mill, Analysis of the Phaenomena of the Human Mind, 2nd edition, J. S. Mill (ed.); (1st edition, 1829; 2nd edition, London: Longman, Green, Reader and Dyer, 1869; reprinted New York: A. Keley, 1967)
(1873) Autobiography, CW, v. 1, pp. 1-290
(1874) Three Essays on Religion, CW, v. 10, pp. 369-489
Chapters on Socialism, CW, v. 5, pp. 703-53
(1963) Earlier Letters, CW, v. 12-13 [Mill's correspondence through 1848]
(1972) Later Letters, CW, v. 14-17 [Mill's correspondence after 1848]
(1988) Public and Parliamentary Speeches, CW, v. 28-29


Secondary Literature

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Bentham, Jeremy | causation: the metaphysics of | connectionism | consequentialism | feminist (interventions): history of philosophy | God: concepts of | Hartley, David | idealism: British | induction: problem of | introspection | Kuhn, Thomas | liberalism | mathematics, philosophy of | Mill, Harriet Taylor | Mill, James | motivation: moral | ontological arguments | other minds | perception: the problem of | pragmatic arguments and belief in God | rationalism vs. empiricism | representation, political | Scottish Philosophy: in the 19th century | sense-data | teleology: teleological arguments for God's existence | Whewell, William