Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Fri May 6, 2005; substantive revision Wed Sep 9, 2009

“What indeed has Athens to do with Jerusalem?” (246) This question of the relation between reason—here represented by Athens—and faith—represented by Jerusalem—was posed by the church father Tertullian (c.160–230 CE), and it remains a central preoccupation among contemporary philosophers of religion.

“Fideism” is the name given to that school of thought—to which Tertullian himself is frequently said to have subscribed—which answers that faith is in some sense independent of, if not outright adversarial toward, reason. In contrast to the more rationalistic tradition of natural theology, with its arguments for the existence of God, fideism holds—or at any rate appears to hold (more on this caveat shortly)—that reason is unnecessary and inappropriate for the exercise and justification of religious belief. The term itself derives from fides, the Latin word for faith, and can be rendered literally as faith-ism. “Fideism” is thus to be understood not as a synonym for “religious belief,” but as denoting a particular philosophical account of faith's appropriate jurisdiction vis-a-vis that of reason.

1. A Formal Definition

Alvin Plantinga has noted that fideism can be defined as an “exclusive or basic reliance upon faith alone, accompanied by a consequent disparagement of reason and utilized especially in the pursuit of philosophical or religious truth” (87). Correspondingly, Plantinga writes, a fideist is someone who “urges reliance on faith rather than reason, in matters philosophical and religious” and who “may go on to disparage and denigrate reason” (87). Notice, first, that what the fideist seeks, according to this account, is truth. Fideism claims that truths of a certain kind can be grasped only by foregoing rational inquiry and relying solely on faith. Insofar as fideism insists that knowledge of these truths is possible, it must be distinguished from various forms of skepticism with which it otherwise shares certain common features. Notice too that this definition is largely formal; the plausibility of fideism as a philosophical doctrine and the proper extension of the term will therefore depend on the content given to the terms “faith” and “reason.”

2. A Brief History of “Fideism”

The formality of definitions like the one cited by Plantinga is likely to conceal underlying disagreements about what counts as a concrete instance of fideism. Indeed, there is little agreement among philosophers about which thinkers can properly be subsumed under this rubric. To offer a straight “history of fideism” would thus require one to take up a particular position with respect to a series of ongoing philosophical disputes. This section thus attempts—somewhat less ambitiously, though perhaps more charitably—to sketch a brief history not of fideism but of “fideism”—i.e., of the term's (contested) usage within the philosophical literature.

2.1 Sin, Skepticism, and Kant: Theological and Philosophical Roots

The term “fideism” appears to have entered the philosophical lexicon by way of theology in the late nineteenth century. It was originally used in reference to a movement within Roman Catholic thought, also known as traditionalism, which emphasized, over against rationalism, the role of tradition as the medium by means of which divine revelation is communicated, and which was sometimes conjoined with a conservative social and political agenda. Although of late modern vintage, the term “fideism” has since been applied retrospectively to thinkers at least as far back as the second century C.E.

Tertullian is frequently cited in this connection as a textbook fideist. Developing a theme articulated by Paul in his First Letter to the Corinthians, Tertullian insisted that the truth of Christianity could be disclosed only by revelation, and that it must necessarily remain opaque to unregenerate philosophical reason.[1] In an oft-quoted passage he maintains (against Marcion) that the Biblical narrative of Christ's death and resurrection “is by all means to be believed, because it is absurd…[T]he fact is certain, because it is impossible” (525).

However, the conception of Tertullian as anti-rational is not supported by contemporary scholarship. Contrary to popular belief, what Tertullian said is not credo quia absurdum but credible est quia ineptum est. Tertullian's point seems to have been that the incarnation represents a paradox: salvation requires both that God become human and that God remain wholly other. His quarrel was not with reason per se, but with philosophical hubris. Eric Osborne writes, “Not only did he never say ‘credo quia absurdum’, but he never meant anything like it and never abandoned the claims of Athens upon Jerusalem” (28). Tertullian, Osborne concludes, was a “most improbable fideist” (29).

As the context of Tertullian's remarks suggests, this suspicion of (what passes for) reason had theological as well as philosophical roots. Of central importance in this regard is the idea that one's rational faculties can be damaged by sin. Although this idea was articulated by a variety of early Christian theologians including Tertullian and Augustine (and has obvious analogues in classical virtue theory), it came to be given special attention within the Protestant tradition. The reformers held that the human intellect had been corrupted by humanity's fall from grace, and that consequently the truth of Christianity could be apprehended only by faith. Protestant theologians from Luther and Calvin to Karl Barth have thus affirmed the priority of faith not only to “works” but also to natural theology.

Within Roman Catholicism, by contrast, greater weight has characteristically been given to the classic arguments for God's existence. This theological division thus represents part of the context for the debate over fideism. It is interesting in this connection to note that the Roman Catholic Magisterium has repeatedly condemned fideism. Absent from the documents of Vatican I, the term makes what seems to be its first appearance in a papal encyclical in 1907, in Pius X's Pascendi Dominici Gregis (see Other Internet Resources), where fideism is referenced in the context of a more sweeping critique of “modernist” theology.[2] More recently, in the 1998 encyclical Fides et Ratio (see Other Internet Resources), John Paul II warned of “a resurgence of fideism, which fails to recognize the importance of rational knowledge and philosophical discourse for the understanding of faith, indeed for the very possibility of belief in God” (§55), and in Caritas In Veritate (2009, see Other Internet Resources), his third encyclical, Benedict XVI writes, “Truth frees charity from the constraints of an emotionalism that deprives it of relational and social content, and of a fideism that deprives it of human and universal breathing-space” (§3). This emphasis on reason in general, and on natural theology in particular, may help in part to explain how the term “fideism” has come to function within Roman Catholic theology largely as a term of opprobrium.

On the other hand—and in a sort of ironic twist—the counter-Reformation also launched a defense of Catholicism that some historians have described as fideistic. The Protestant Reformation coincided with the re-discovery in Europe of the ancient skeptical arguments of Sextus Empiricus, Cicero, and Diogenes Laertius, and as Richard H. Popkin has demonstrated, these arguments were quickly appropriated by sixteenth- and seventeenth-century Catholic philosophers and theologians—including Erasmus, Montaigne, Pierre Charron, and Petrus Gassendi (as well as by Protestant thinkers like Pierre Bayle)—who deployed them in the religious controversies of the period.[3] Their contention was simple, if something of an ignoratio elenchi: since skepticism undermines any reason for becoming a Protestant, one should remain a Catholic on the basis of faith alone (Popkin 1992, 122–123).

But although the Protestant reformers and these “nouveaux Pyrrhoniens” both relied on skeptical arguments to deflate the pretensions of philosophical “reason,” they tended to draw somewhat different conclusions about the role and nature of faith. In the face of uncertainty the latter counseled their readers to remain loyal to the prevailing religious conventions of the time—in this case Roman Catholicism. But they tended to eschew the religious enthusiasm characteristic of the more pietistic Protestant sects. Theirs was thus a temperate and tentative faith, grounded in action rather than doctrine. If they were fideistic, they were nevertheless not dogmatic. According to the reformed view, by contrast, the domain of faith is characterized by fervor and passionate commitment: skepticism thus ultimately gives way to certainty and religious assurance of a kind unassailable by philosophical doubt. In his book God and Skepticism, Terence Penelhum calls the latter view “evangelical fideism,” and he distinguishes it from the “conformist fideism” that identifies faith with loyalty to a tradition (15–16).

The theological developments in the nineteenth century in reference to which the term “fideism” was first used had their philosophical inspiration not simply in the skepticism of the sixteenth and seventeenth centuries, however, but also, and more immediately, in Immanuel Kant's critical philosophy. For Kant, God's existence was a postulate of practical—rather than pure—reason. Accordingly, Kant rejected the traditional “proofs” of God's existence—the cosmological, teleological, and ontological arguments—in favor of a moral argument. Thus, although Kant famously championed the conception of a thoroughly “rational” (i.e., moral) version of Christianity—a “religion within the limits of reason alone”—he also placed religious belief outside the domain of what can be known by means of speculative philosophy. In this way, he “found it necessary to deny knowledge, in order to make room for faith” (1929, 29).

The earliest documented uses of the term “fideism” are to be found in French theology. Thomas D. Carroll has located references to fidéisme from as early as 1854 (10); however, the term appears to have entered into broader circulation in the literature a quarter-century later, when it came to be used pejoratively in reference to Catholic traditionalism by theologians seeking to revive the Thomistic synthesis of reason and faith.

At around the same time or shortly thereafter, the term appears to have originated independently in the work of the French Protestant theologians Eugèene Ménégoz (1838–1921) and Auguste Sabatier (1839–1901), who (unlike the Catholic traditionalists of whom it was predicated by their critics) applied it to themselves. Ménégoz and Sabatier both sought to distinguish faith—understood in terms of something akin to Schleiermacher's feeling of absolute dependence—from propositional belief, arguing that salvation depends on the former, rather than on assent to any particular doctrine. Because of Sabatier's emphasis on religious symbols, this view was sometimes called “symbolo-fideism.”[4]

As Carroll observes, the projection of the term “fideism” ahistorically—onto thinkers as removed from the context in which it originated as Tertullian—is potentially the source of much confusion, given that the meanings of key terms like “faith” and “reason” vary dramatically from one context to another. Moreover, the term's presently widespread pejorative connotations render “fideism” problematic as a descriptive category.

2.2 The Usual Suspects

Today the term “fideism” is perhaps most commonly associated with four philosophers: Pascal, Kierkegaard, James, and Wittgenstein. In order to assess how well the label fits, it will be helpful to discuss their respective views in slightly more detail. Note, however, that each is also treated at greater length elsewhere in this encyclopedia.

2.2.1 Pascal

Whereas Montaigne's followers, though significant theological figures in their day, “showed no particular fervor in their religious views” and practiced a “tepid, if sincere” form of Catholicism (Popkin 1992, 124), the same could not be said of Blaise Pascal (1623–1662), whose Pensées attest to a more “evangelical” brand of Pyrrhonian piety. Following a transformative mystical experience in 1654, Pascal spent much of the remainder of his life in the monasteries of Port-Royal, working out a defense of his faith.

Central to this defense, seemingly paradoxically, is the conviction that belief in God cannot be defended by means of the usual apologetic arguments. The very nature of what is believed in—namely, an “infinitely incomprehensible” being—is such as to render these arguments necessarily inadequate.

Who then will blame Christians for not being able to give reasons for their beliefs, since they profess belief in a religion which they cannot explain? They declare, when they expound it to the world, that it is foolishness, stultitiam; and then you complain because they do not prove it! If they proved it, they would not keep their word; it is through their lack of proofs that they show they are not lacking in sense (201).

The most the philosophical arguments could prove, Pascal suggests, is the “god of the philosophers”—not the “God of Abraham, Isaac, and Jacob.”

Pascal insists that faith can nevertheless be rational in the absence of proof—i.e., that it is rational in a prudential rather than an epistemic sense. It is here that he introduces his celebrated “Wager” arguments. Pascal's first move in the argument is a skeptical one. He argues that although God either exists or does not exist, we cannot settle the issue on the basis of reason alone. The proofs of God's existence are not conclusive, but neither are the proofs of God's non-existence. “Reason can determine nothing” (201).

Granting that reason is indeed neutral with respect to the question of whether or not God exists, it might at first be thought that the safest and most rational course of action would be to refuse to take a stand one way or the other—to remain agnostic about the existence of God. However, Pascal argues that this is not possible: not choosing to believe is equivalent to choosing not to believe. If you do not choose for God, you in effect choose against God. But on what basis, then, should one decide?

The solution, Pascal argues, is to weigh the potential rewards of believing in God against the potential rewards of failing to believe in God—i.e., to conduct a cost-benefit analysis of the relative merits of “wagering” for or against God's existence. The options, as Pascal construes them, can be outlined in the form of a table:

God exists God does not exist.
Believe Infinite Gain No (or Finite) Loss/Finite Gain
Disbelieve Infinite Loss Finite Gain

These options can be assessed in terms of what is known within contemporary decision theory as the Expected Value Principle (EVP). The EVP states that when one is faced with a choice among two or more competing courses of action, one should choose whichever course has the highest “expected value.” Expected value can be determined by (a) multiplying the chance of a successful outcome by the value of that outcome; (b) multiplying the chance of an unsuccessful outcome by the value of that outcome; and (c) adding together the results of (a) and (b). Given this principle, it turns out that it can be rational to bet on a rather remote outcome—e.g., on a race-horse that is not expected to win the derby—provided the potential payoff is high enough relative to other possible gambles.

Of course, in the case of God, it is hard to determine what the chances of a successful outcome might be: we cannot justifiably assume, for example, that the likelihood of God existing is equal to the likelihood of God not existing. But that is okay, Pascal argues, because the payoff if God exists is an infinite payoff. Thus, the potential for infinite gain makes it rational to bet that God exists, however slim the actual chances of this might be: as long as one is willing to grant that there is “one chance of winning against a finite number of chances of losing,” it is a better deal to bet on God (202–203).

Although Pascal's argument seems to be valid—that is, its conclusion follows logically from its premises—Pascal's critics have raised a number of other objections to it. In the first place, it has been said that any argument which seeks to justify faith entirely in such crassly prudential terms is necessarily impious or improper. To be sure, it is hard to avoid feeling, as William James put it, “that when religious faith expresses itself thus, in the language of the gaming-table, it is put to its last trumps” (6). James went on to remark that “if we were ourselves in the place of the Deity, we should probably take particular pleasure in cutting off believers of this pattern from their infinite reward” (6). In fairness, however, it should be noted that Pascal's use of the “Wager” is merely instrumental. It is intended simply as a first step toward, and not as a substitute for, genuine religious faith. Furthermore, the claim that it is somehow improper to base such a decision on prudential reasons seems to presuppose precisely what Pascal denies—namely, that there are epistemic reasons on which one's decision might more appropriately be made to rest. It is important to appreciate that Pascal is not urging his readers to believe something they otherwise have reason to doubt. As he puts it, “Your reason is not more deeply wounded by choosing one rather than the other because it is bound to choose” (202).

But can one choose to believe for purely instrumental reasons? A second worry is that Pascal's argument seems to presuppose a problematic version of doxastic voluntarism, the view that believing is subject to the will. Believing in God, unlike raising one's arm, it might be objected, is not open to direct voluntary control. However, Pascal anticipates this objection, arguing that a would-be believer should begin by imitating the motions of a believer. By, for instance, attending Mass and taking holy water, a would-be believer may succeed in cultivating genuine belief. This argument suggests that Pascal is committed to the less controversial thesis of indirect doxastic voluntarism—the view that a person can indirectly control his or her beliefs by directly controlling his or her epistemic situation. Still, the prospect of voluntarily inducing belief for purely non-epistemic reasons has struck many commentators as manipulative and self-deceptive.

A third problem is that Pascal's argument depends upon an overly narrow construal of one's religious options. It is of course the case, as Pascal claims, that the God of Abraham, Isaac, and Jacob either exists or does not exist, but the same is true of a seemingly endless number of other possible deities. If we assume the possibility of infinite reward in each case, it is no longer clear that Catholicism is any more rational than its religious alternatives. In reply, Jeff Jordan recently has argued that the “Wager” can be reconfigured to show, not that one religion is more rational than another, but simply that atheism and agnosticism are irrational.

Jordan follows Pascal in treating religious belief as a necessary prerequisite for eternal happiness. However, some critics have questioned this assumption. How do we know—it might be asked—that if he or she exists, God would make salvation contingent on correct belief? Pascal seems to vacillate between a professed ignorance of God's nature and some rather doctrinaire assumptions about it. Indeed, if one grants that there is even a small chance of achieving infinite bliss by pursuing a non-religious path, then the EVP suggests that such a path would be just as rational in light of its expected value. 

Although Pascal's “Wager” is widely regarded as having been discredited, within the past few years there has been a revival of philosophical interest in the argument, and some contemporary philosophers have attempted to rehabilitate a version of it. In Rationality and Religious Theism, for instance, Joshua L. Golding adopts a broadly Pascalian strategy in defense of what he calls “religious theism.” Whereas Pascal focused his attention on the question of whether it is rational to believe in God, Golding is primarily concerned with the question of whether it is rational to pursue a religious way of life—one in which beliefs about God's existence might play a relatively minor and non-foundational role. To qualify as a religious theist, Golding explains, one must seek to enter into a good relationship with God, and for this it is sufficient to believe simply that God's existence is not impossible (i.e., that the concept of “God” is not contradictory) and that it is at least slightly more likely that one can achieve a good relationship with God by adopting a religious way of life than by not doing so. Arguing on the basis of the EVP, Golding contends that it is rational to be a religious theist if one conceives of the value of a good relationship with God as “qualitatively superior” to any other value.

Unlike Pascal, Golding is anxious to insist that the value of a good relationship with God is finite, rather than infinite. Otherwise, as he notes, we are faced with the problem—alluded to above—that more than one path might be equally rational for an individual in light of its expected value. If, however, the value of a good relationship with God is finite, then whichever path is deemed to have the greatest chance of success at achieving this reward will have the highest expected value, other things being equal. Of course, the expected value of the good relationship with God must be high enough to make pursuing a religious path more rational than any non-religious pursuit, however high the probability that the latter will result in a mundane payoff. Thus, Golding maintains that the value of a good relationship with God is to be conceived “not merely as ‘a lot better’ or ‘vastly better’ than any other goal,” but as different in kind. Given this qualitative difference, Golding can claim that “no quantitative amount of other goods added together would equal the value” of the good relationship with God (66).

However, it is unclear whether Golding's version of the “Wager” argument is ultimately more successful than Pascal's. The problem is that the EVP requires a single scale of value in accordance with which gambles can be compared, whereas Golding's contention that the value of the good relationship with God is different in kind from other values seems to suggest the incommensurability of two different scales. Thus, although the argument purports to show that religious theism is a more rational choice, it seems ultimately to hinge not on an objective comparison of two quantities but on an apparently subjective preference for goods of a certain type.

In any event, it is worth noting that Pascal and his intellectual heirs, though frequently characterized as fideists, are not antagonistic to reason tout court. In the first place, as Pascal sees it, it is reasonable to acknowledge limits to reason. “Reason's last step is the recognition that there are an infinite number of things which are beyond it” (209). It is in this spirit that he suggests, somewhat more elliptically, that “[t]here is nothing which is so much in conformity with reason as the rejection of reason” (209). Thus, Pascal invokes reason to justify what might otherwise appear to be its antithesis. Moreover, the aim of the “Wager” argument is precisely to secure the rational respectability of faith in the face of an apparent antinomy. In this respect, Pascal's approach anticipates Kant's contention that God's existence is a question for practical—as opposed to theoretical—reason.

2.2.2 Kierkegaard

Any discussion of Søren Kierkegaard's thought is complicated by the fact that he wrote pseudonymously, attributing most of his writings to a variety of fictional authors whose “views” may or may not have corresponded to his own. In The Point of View for My Work as an Author—one of the few works to which Kierkegaard (1813–1855) was willing to append his own signature—he explains his use of the pseudonyms by noting that philosophical and religious confusion can be addressed only indirectly: “one must approach from behind the person who is under an illusion” (1848, 24–25). He adds that the illusion against which his pseudonymous writings are directed is an illusion about what Christianity requires, and that these writings, though employing philosophical tools, thus subserve a religious intent. According to this retrospective self-assessment, the whole of Kierkegaard's work “is related to Christianity, to the problem ‘of becoming a Christian,’ with a direct or indirect polemic against the monstrous illusion we call Christendom, or against the illusion that in such a land as ours all are Christians of a sort” (1848, 5–6).

Although it is a subject of debate whether to take at face value Kierkegaard's claim that his entire work serves a religious end—after all, it seems to be contradicted by other remarks of his—it is nevertheless clear that combating confusion, including illusions about faith, was central to his work.[5] Kierkegaard suggests that speculative philosophy contributes to this confusion by transforming Christianity into a sort of philosophical theory or system. (Hegel is frequently—if not always entirely fairly—parodied in this connection.) In so doing, it imports into religion modes of inquiry that distort the essential nature of faith.

It is perhaps tempting to imagine that the relation between evidence and belief is purely epistemological, a question of justification. On this account, beliefs mean what they do irrespective of their relation to “the evidence”; what a consideration of the latter reveals is whether or not they are justified. But one of the implications of Kierkegaard's thought is that entitlement is a social status, and that the various social practices within which it is conferred or withheld contribute to the meaning of the beliefs in question. There are different kinds of beliefs, logically speaking, and different ways in which entitlement to such beliefs is vindicated. The basic error to which philosophical systematizers are prone, he argues, is assuming that the criteria for evaluating a belief in one context are equally appropriate in other contexts. He writes, “in our own age everything is mixed together: the aesthetic is treated ethically, faith is dealt with intellectually, and so forth. Philosophy has answered every question; but no adequate consideration has been given the question concerning what sphere it is within which each question finds its answer” (Anthology, 229).

Within the sphere of the “intellectual”—e.g., within scientific or historical scholarship—inquiry is conceived in terms of a process of “approximation” to reality. When it comes to religion, however, what matters, according to Kierkegaard, is not the “object to which the knower relates himself” but the relationship itself: the accent falls not on “what is said” but on “how it is said” (1846, 199 and 202). For Kierkegaard, as for the so-called evangelical fideists, faith is characterized by passionate commitment and thus requires a decision or “qualitative leap” (1846, 384). His claim is not simply that having evidence is unnecessary in this context, but that it would, so to speak, destroy the whole endeavor, since it would alter the meaning of the beliefs in question and the spirit in which they could be believed. “If I am able to apprehend God objectively, I do not have faith; but because I cannot do this, I must have faith. If I want to keep myself in faith, I must continually see to it that I hold fast the objective uncertainty, see to it that in the objective uncertainty I am ‘out on 70,000 fathoms of water’ and still have faith” (1846, 204). Any belief that depended on the outcome of historical or scientific approximation—and which could be undermined by its results—would not be genuine faith, and anything whose existence could be established purely on the basis of philosophical argument—and so could be believed in “indifferently,” without this belief making a significant difference in one's life—would by definition not be God. “Anyone who wants to demonstrate the existence of God…proves something else instead, at times something that perhaps did not even need demonstrating, and in any case never anything better” (1844, 43).

Kierkegaard's point is not that it is somehow permissible to neglect one's epistemic duties where belief in God is concerned, but that one cannot separate the question of “what” is believed from the question of “how” it is believed. Here the “how” refers to “the relationship sustained by the existing individual, in his own existence, to the content of his utterance” (Anthology, 214). Religion, for Kierkegaard, is a matter of what one does with one's life, a matter of “inwardness.” In this context, to observe that religious believers lack evidence for their beliefs is not to render a negative verdict on their entitlement but to comment conceptually on the kind of beliefs they are.

Was Kierkegaard a fideist? Critics have argued that in recoiling from natural theology, Kierkegaard transformed belief into a matter of will and emotion, and that a decision as monumental as a leap of faith—made seemingly arbitrarily, in the absence of any rational assurance—might just as easily have disastrous results. J.L. Mackie, for instance, claims that “what Kierkegaard himself is advocating is a sort of intellectual Russian roulette” (216). So far, it might be argued, Kierkegaard has done little to show that a leap in the direction of Christianity is a better bet than any of its alternatives, and that a wiser tack—as Hume counseled in connection with alleged miracles—would be to proportion belief (and passion) to the available evidence. Kierkegaard's defenders might reply that it is only from the “outside”—from the point of view, e.g., of the dispassionate pseudonyms—that Christianity appears ungrounded and “absurd,” and that Kierkegaard's point is really that those already in possession of faith need not be embarrassed by the fact that it is not the ineluctable outcome of reasoning from an imagined set of neutral and uncontested premises.

Although he relentlessly criticized what he perceived as the overweening ambitions of academic philosophy and an unwarranted reliance on foundationalist tendencies in theology, Kierkegaard held that faith and reason are not mutually incompatible, and that philosophy—when practiced with respect for the “conditions of existence” within which human beings necessarily do their thinking—can ultimately help to clarify the nature of Christian commitment. For Kierkegaard, faith is incomprehensible, in the sense that it demands a willingness to venture beyond the purview of philosophical reason, but it is not unreasonable or irrational. Thus, although he describes faith as “believing against the understanding,” he is careful to distinguish the content of religious belief from mere “nonsense.” The believer “cannot believe nonsense against the understanding, which one might fear, because the understanding will penetratingly perceive that it is nonsense and hinder him in believing it”; however, the believer “uses the understanding so much that through it he becomes aware of the incomprehensible”—i.e., of the logical limits of speculative thought—“and now, believing, he relates himself to it against the understanding” (1992, 568). By discriminating between those cases in which it is competent to judge and those in which it is not, philosophy thus plays a self-critical role: mindful of its own limits, it allows religion to be itself.

2.2.3 James

Mackie's contention that fideism is intellectually irresponsible was anticipated in the nineteenth century by W.K. Clifford, who famously declared that “[i]t is wrong always, everywhere, and for every one, to believe anything upon insufficient evidence” (346). The American pragmatist William James (1842–1910) called Clifford “that delicious enfant terrible,” and in his essay “The Will to Believe” he argued that Clifford had overstated the case against faith (8). In the paper, James delineates a set of conditions under which, he argues, it can be reasonable to believe in the absence of proof.

These conditions are met whenever we are confronted by what James terms a “genuine option”—i.e., a choice between two (or more) “hypotheses” (or candidates for belief) which is “live,” “forced,” and “momentous”—and that option cannot be decided on intellectual grounds. An option is live (as opposed to dead) just in case each of the hypotheses at issue is “among the mind's possibilities” (2). Insofar as it depends upon an individual's willingness or ability to entertain it, a hypothesis' “liveliness” is an extrinsic, agent-specific property. By contrast, an option is forced (rather than avoidable) just in case the candidate hypotheses are both mutually exclusive and exhaustive of the possibilities. Finally, an option is momentous (as opposed to trivial) just in case the opportunity is unique, the stakes are significant, or the decision is irreversible.

James points out that as people who hold beliefs, we generally have two goals: to avoid error, and to believe the truth. Though related, these aims are in fact distinct: one can, for example, avoid error by suspending belief. James argues that the scientific method is oriented around the goal of avoiding error, but that in other aspects of life, the avoidance of error is inadequate.[6] For instance, in our relationships with others, we first have to believe that others will meet us half-way in order for this to be true. If we refused to interact with others until we had “sufficient evidence” of their willingness to reciprocate, we would no doubt appear stand-offish and unapproachable, thus cutting ourselves off altogether from the possibility of entering into mutually rewarding relationships.

According to James, something similar is true in the case of religion. Religion, he says, teaches two things: (1) that “the best things are the more eternal things” and (2) that we are better off now if we believe (1) (25–26). These two assertions together comprise what James refers to as the “religious hypothesis.” He contends that if the religious hypothesis is a live hypothesis, the option with which it confronts us is necessarily also a genuine option—i.e., it is momentous and forced. In cases like this, James contends, it is not enough simply to avoid error; we also have to seek truth. “We cannot escape the issue by remaining sceptical and waiting for more light, because, although we do avoid error in that way if religion be untrue, we lose the good, if it be true, just as certainly as if we positively chose to disbelieve” (26). As in the social example, the religious hypothesis must, as it were, be met half-way.

James acknowledges that choosing under such circumstances entails risk—one might, after all, be wrong—but he denies that one can avoid or reduce this risk by refusing to choose. Skepticism—i.e., the refusal to choose—is just as risky as commitment. Furthermore, all such postures are inevitably—and, indeed, completely appropriately—shaped by one's passions: not deciding is just as much a matter of emotion as deciding, insofar as it is motivated by the fear of being wrong rather than the hope of being right. But, James contends, there is no rational basis for preferring fear over hope.

Like Pascal, James insists that when it comes to religion, we cannot avoid taking sides and incurring risks. James also agrees with Pascal that faith can be rational in the absence of epistemic justification—at least in certain circumstances. However, James's argument differs from Pascal's insofar as it purports to show, not that religious belief is more rational, but only that in the absence of definitive evidence it is not less rational, than unbelief or agnosticism (at least with respect to those for whom the religious hypothesis is live).

Although he disagrees with Clifford about the justifiability of believing without conclusive proof, James appears to share Clifford's view that belief is subject to the will (hence the title of his essay). In other words, James's argument in “The Will to Believe,” like Pascal's wager argument, seems to imply some version of doxastic voluntarism. But depending on how this latter notion is understood, certain worries may here arise. If belief is understood as a function of one's total epistemic situation, rather than an independent judgment which that situation might or might not warrant, then James's analogy between believing and entering into a relationship appears problematic: only the latter is subject to direct voluntary control. Of course, believing is subject to indirect voluntary control. In other words, one can change one's beliefs by changing one's epistemic circumstances; the latter, even if not the former, are susceptible to direct control by the will.

A related objection is that James does not appear to take account of the possibility of “partial beliefs,” and that doing so undermines his notion of a forced option. If believing admits of degrees, then choices of the kind James describes seem less stark. Responding to this kind of anticipated objection to his own work (described in Section 4 below), John Bishop has argued that a forced choice is required whenever one is confronted by the rival “framing principles” of alternative doxastic practices. “One either ‘buys into’ the framework by commitment to its principles or one does not” (139).

James's essay is intended as a “defence of our right to adopt a believing attitude in religious matters, in spite of the fact that our merely logical intellect may not have been coerced” (1–2). Some critics have worried that the argument leads down a slippery slope to irrationalism. John Hick has claimed that James's conclusion “constitutes an unrestriced license for wishful thinking… If our aim is to believe what is true, and not necessarily what we like, James's universal permissiveness will not help us” (60). However, this seems unfair. James insists that in defending the “lawfulness of voluntarily adopted faith” he is not thereby opening the door to what he calls “patent superstition” (2, 29). Faith, on James's account, is not a matter of believing against the evidence; the “will to believe” is justified only when the option is genuine and the evidence is inconclusive. “In concreto,” James writes, “the freedom to believe can only cover living options which the intellect of the individual cannot by itself resolve; and living options never seem absurdities to him who has them to consider” (29).

It is important to appreciate that James is not claiming that it is morally permissible to believe something to which one is not epistemically entitled. Rather, he is claiming that there are beliefs to which one can be epistemically entitled even in the absence of definitive evidence—that, pace Clifford, entitlement is not always a function of evidential support. Although James's argument is often classified as a pragmatic argument for belief, he is not offering a prudential, as opposed to an epistemic, justification. Rather, he is comparing the relative merits of rival epistemic strategies (oriented respectively toward the goals of avoiding error and believing truth). In this respect his argument differs importantly from Pascal's “wager” arguments. It can thus be argued that James is not disparaging reason in favor of faith, but attempting rather to carve out a sphere for faith within what is rationally respectable.

2.2.4 Wittgenstein

Widely regarded as one of the greatest philosophers of the twentieth century, Ludwig Wittgenstein (1889–1951) was also one of the most controversial and difficult. Wittgenstein famously argued that “meaning is use”—that our words mean what they do by virtue of the role they play in our discourse. Moreover, he argued that words are used in more than one way, and that it is a mistake to “sublime the logic” of our language—i.e., to treat any single function of language as paradigmatic. “Think of the tools in a tool-box: there is a hammer, pliers, a saw, a screw-driver, a rule, a glue-pot, nails and screws.—The functions of words are as diverse as the functions of these objects” (1958, I, §11).

In his later writings, Wittgenstein calls these diverse phenomena language-games, in order, he explains, “to bring into prominence the fact that the speaking of language is part of an activity, or a form of life” (1958, I, §23). Renouncing his own earlier quest for a general form of propositions, his later writings suggest that these language-games “have no one thing in common which makes us use the same word for all,—but that they are related to one another in many different ways” (1958, I, §65).

Although Wittgenstein was not by conventional standards religious, his philosophical remarks and journal entries reveal what might be described as a religious sensibility and are informed by a definite sympathy toward at least certain features of religion. For Wittgenstein, as for Kierkegaard, whom he admired, religion was less a matter of theory than of practice. “I believe that one of the things Christianity says is that sound doctrines are all useless. They have to change your life. (Or the direction of your life.)…Wisdom is passionless. But faith by contrast is what Kierkegaard calls a passion” (1980, 53e).

It has been argued that Wittgenstein's later thought, though perhaps not overtly fideistic, nevertheless lends itself to fideistic interpretation. According to this interpretation, religion is a self-contained and primarily expressive enterprise, governed by its own internal logic or “grammar.” This view—commonly called Wittgensteinian Fideism—is variously characterized as entailing one or more of the following distinct (but arguably inter-related) theses: (1) that religion is logically cut off from other aspects of life; (2) that religious discourse is essentially self-referential and does not allow us to talk about reality; (3) that religious beliefs can be understood only by religious believers; and (4) that religion cannot be criticized.[7]

It is highly doubtful, however, whether Wittgenstein would have endorsed any of these claims, let alone all four of them. Their attribution to Wittgenstein seems in fact to depend on a narrowly selective reading of what he actually said. As Richard Bell has pointed out,

It is premised on the view that our language is a series of language-games rooted in a form of life each governed by its own set of rules—as if our life of speaking and acting were like a bag of marbles, separate spherical speech-worlds with their own boundaries and rules governing their size and elasticity and use—some are shooters, others decorative, all rest side by side and affect their neighbors only if they collide (217–218).

It is true that Wittgenstein cautioned against the tendency to assume a unity of logical form behind the diversity of actual usage. He writes, “Don't say: ‘There must be something common…’—but look and see” (1958, I, §66). However, it is by no means clear that he intended to advance any equally a priori thesis about the discontinuity and incommensurability of our discursive practices.

Indeed, he suggests that the result of “looking” is that “we see a complicated network of similarities overlapping and criss-crossing” (1958, I, §66). A metaphor to which he returns periodically is of language as an ancient city: “a maze of little streets and squares, of old and new houses, and of houses with additions from various periods; and this surrounded by a multitude of new boroughs with straight regular streets and uniform houses” (1958, I, §18). Remarks such as these seem to militate against the balkanized view of language implied by Wittgensteinian Fideism.

It also should be noted that the term “Wittgensteinian Fideism” appeared after Wittgenstein's death but prior to the publication in English of some of his most important writings on religion, including Lectures on Religious Belief (1967), Remarks on Frazer's Golden Bough (1979), and Culture and Value (1980) —i.e., at a time when Wittgenstein's legacy was particularly vulnerable to misinterpretation.

The origins of the term “Wittgensteinian Fideism” derive from an essay of that name by Kai Nielsen, which appeared in the July 1967 issue of Philosophy. There Nielsen suggested that Wittgensteinian Fideism might in fact constitute a misrepresentation of Wittgenstein's writings—not, interestingly enough, by his critics, but by his followers—and that “Wittgenstein might well wish to say of Wittgensteinians what Freud said of Freudians” (194). Accordingly, Nielsen directed the brunt of his critique not against Wittgenstein himself, but against Wittgensteinians like Norman Malcolm and Peter Winch. More recently, the charge of Wittgensteinian Fideism has become associated especially with the work of the philosopher of religion D.Z. Phillips.

Although it is impossible here to explore these allegations in any detail, it is worth noting that Wittgensteinians generally regard “Wittgensteinian Fideism” as a caricature not only of Wittgenstein's views but also of their own. In defending himself and other Wittgensteinian philosophers of religion against the charge of fideism, Phillips writes:

Many philosophers of religion influenced by Wittgenstein have spent much of their time denying that connections of a certain kind hold between religious beliefs and other aspects of human life. Similarly, they have denied the appropriateness of certain kinds of criticisms of religion. Those who have been criticized often react as follows: “This is what I mean by the connection between religion and other aspects of human life and this is what I mean by criticism of religion. Here [are] Phillips and others like him denying the intelligibility of such connections and criticism. Therefore Phillips and others like him hold that there is no connection between religion and other aspects of human life and that religion cannot be criticized.” Of course, all that I and others have denied is their conception of the relation between religion and other aspects of human life and their conception of criticism of religion. Sometimes, the explanation of the persistence of the critical theses concerning Wittgenstein's influence in the philosophy of religion…is as simple as that (1981, 89–90).

In the last decade of his life, Phillips in fact devoted considerable attention to what, following his teacher Rush Rhees, he called the unity—i.e., the interlocking intelligibility—of discourse. He argued that religious beliefs depend for their sense and importance on non-religious features of human existence, but that the relation between the former and the latter is not generally the relation between conclusions and their justification.

Phillips's longstanding debate with Nielsen is commonly portrayed as a modern-day contest between faith and reason, but Phillips never regarded it that way himself. Whereas Nielsen treats Wittgensteinian philosophy of religion as essentially an apologetic strategy meant to shield religion from critical assessment, Phillips contended that “it casts a liberating light on both belief and atheism. Both are rescued from philosophical distortion” (2005, 75). As Phillips saw it, his disagreement with Nielsen was a clash not between the partisans of competing first-order commitments, but between Nielsen's atheism and his own professed desire to do conceptual justice to rival points of view, both religious and anti-religious—an asymmetry that the term “fideism,” with its pietistic connotations, seemed to him to obscure.

3. Tendentious Terminology

One lesson to be gleaned from the preceding cases is that “fideism” is a term that is seldom self-applied. This is no doubt largely because it has come to function primarily as a term of abuse as opposed to a genuinely descriptive term. In this respect, its de facto role is similar to that played by terms like “relativism” and, perhaps, “anti-realism.” Such labels generally say at least as much about the philosophical commitments of those who use them as they do about the positions to which they are applied.

Popkin argues that the skepticism introduced into theology in the sixteenth century eventually led to the atheism and irreligious “free-thinking” of the Enlightenment. After all, Hume says essentially the same thing as the so-called fideists when he writes that “[o]ur most holy religion is founded on faith, not on reason” (140), except that by the eighteenth century this had been transformed into an implicit—if not-so-subtle—reproach. Thus, Hume proceeds to add that since “[m]ere reason is insufficient to convince us of its veracity…whoever is moved by faith to assent to [Christianity] is conscious of a continued miracle in his own person which subverts all the principles of his understanding and gives him a determination to believe what is most contrary to custom and experience” (141). The irony here is hard to miss.

Hence, by the time the term “fideism” entered the philosophical vocabulary, the position it denoted was already highly suspect. In an Age of Reason, faith-ism is inevitably going to sound irrational. However, the conception of reason which the putative fideist is accused of transgressing is almost invariably one the latter would reject as insufficiently robust. Thus, the opposition to reason said to characterize fideism is perhaps better conceived as a rejection of a particular account of reason—one the so-called fideist regards as overly narrow and restrictive—or of the applicability to religion of a particular way of reasoning. To be sure, the thinkers described as “fideists” have sometimes expressed their objections in ways that contribute to the impression of irrationalism. Looked at from this point of view, however, it is the critic of fideism who fails to appreciate the irony with which the putative fideist uses the term “reason.” In effect, the putative fideist can generally more charitably be interpreted as claiming that it can be rational to refuse to subject certain of one's beliefs to what is popularly (though misleadingly, from the point of view of the putative fideist) called “reason”— reason, so to speak, in “scare quotes.”

To generalize, what the thinkers labeled “fideists” have tended to find objectionable is not reason per se, but evidentialism—i.e., the doctrine (expressed forcefully by Clifford) that beliefs can be rational only if they are supported by evidence. Since evidentialism might otherwise seem to give rise to a regress problem, it is generally conjoined with some version of foundationalism which purports to delineate a criterion of “proper basicality”—i.e., a set of conditions under which beliefs can rationally be held without further evidential support. Whereas some putative fideists—like Pascal—argue that religious beliefs can be given non-evidential support, others can be interpreted as suggesting that such beliefs are themselves properly basic, or (as Plantinga has argued more recently) that no criterion of proper basicality that would exclude religious beliefs can itself be shown to be justified. Their contention in either case is that the believer can be rationally justified—or at least cannot be shown to be behaving irrationally—in holding certain beliefs, even if these beliefs themselves are not supported by evidence. Conceived of in this way, the putative fideist's position—though not uncontroversial—is hardly the brazenly paradoxical doctrine it might at first appear to be.

4. A Rational Fideism?

In recent years, a small number of philosophers of religion has embraced the term fideism and sought to reclaim its non-pejorative use. These thinkers are rare among philosophers in their willingness to take up a gauntlet that is usually refused—even by those with views in many respects similar to their own.

One of the most carefully argued contemporary defenses of fideism is C. Stephen Evans's book Faith Beyond Reason. Evans attempts to rehabilitate—or perhaps habilitate—the term by distinguishing “responsible” forms of fideism from various irrationalistic alternatives. Whereas the latter pit faith directly against reason, the former contend that faith can appropriately take over where reason leaves matters of ultimate concern unresolved. Drawing on Kierkegaard's thought, Evans contends that while there are limits to reason, they are limits which it is reasonable for reason to acknowledge.

Like the Protestant Reformers, Evans suggests that the customary exercise of human reason is limited not merely by finitude but also by pride and self-centeredness. For this reason, faith and reason can find themselves in tension. For Evans, however, “faith is against reason only in the sense that it runs into conflict with a concrete form of reason that is damaged” (153). Moreover, Evans insists that the defects in reason—though substantial—are nevertheless not such as to render us completely oblivious to them. Thus, he does not reject reason altogether. In his preferred terminology, faith is not so much against as beyond reason, since it is ultimately compatible, in his view, with a duly self-critical intellect.

Another recent defense of fideism can be found in John Bishop's important book Believing by Faith: An Essay in the Epistemology and Ethics of Religious Belief. Where Evans draws on Kierkegaard, Bishop builds on James's argument in “The Will to Believe” to develop what he terms a “modest, moral coherentist, ‘supra-evidential’ fideism” (3).

A crucial premise in Bishop's argument is what he terms the “thesis of evidential ambiguity,” which holds that, under “rational empiricist evidential practice,” our overall experience of the world is equally plausibly interpreted on either a theistic or an atheistic reading, thereby leaving open the question of God's existence (70–1). He argues that under appropriate conditions—essentially those comprising what James called a “genuine option,” together with evidential indeterminacy, on the one hand, and the satisfaction of certain moral constraints on one's passional motivations and the content of one's faith-commitment, on the other—it is morally permissible to make a “doxastic faith-venture”—that is, to take belief in God to be true in one's practical reasoning, while recognizing that it is not certified by one's total available evidence (147). The brand of fideism for which Bishop argues is thus ‘supra-evidential’ in the sense that it defends the permissibility of reasoning on the basis of commitments that outrun what is warranted on purely evidential grounds. Like Evans, and in keeping with James and Pascal, however, Bishop is careful to distinguish supra-evidential fideism from counter-evidential fideism: unlike the latter, the former, he argues, cannot be shown to violate any epistemic obligations. Although, unlike some putative fideists, Bishop does not regard evidentialism as incoherent or epistemically irresponsible, he argues that fideism of the kind he defends is preferable on broadly moral grounds, suggesting, for instance, that fideism's tolerance for passional commitments conduces to a more balanced acceptance of human nature as more than purely rational (216–220).

One difference between these two contemporary versions of fideism is that Evans focuses primarily on what is permissible in an epistemic sense, whereas Bishop begins with the ethics of fideistic belief, by considering the justifiability in moral terms of taking religious beliefs to be true in one's practical reasoning. Unlike holding beliefs to be true, taking them to be true in practical reasoning, Bishop argues, is subject to direct voluntary control and an appropriate subject for moral evaluation. Yet, insofar as such faith-ventures are not counter-evidential, he argues, they carry epistemic entitlement too.

Another difference is that Evans regards faith as justifiable in light of inherent limits to human rationality as such, whereas on Bishop's account, evidential ambiguity is a feature of the world viewed relative to what he calls “our rational empiricist evidential practice.”The latter qualification seems to leave room for other practices to which ambiguity about God's existence might be foreign. Bishop raises this possibility in a discussion of “isolationist” epistemologies (such as Wittgensteinian Fideism, if such a thing exists), which attempt to segregate questions of evidential support for religious claims from the standards of a “wider, generally prevailing, evidential practice” (79). From within what the isolationist regards as the appropriate practice, the “evidence” may seem to point incontrovertibly toward, e.g., theistic conclusions (or certain propositions about God may count as basic). However, Bishop contends that insofar as questions may still arise for the reflective believer about the justifiability of commitment to the framework principles of the theistic doxastic practice, isolationism cannot avoid the need for doxastic ventures that outrun the available evidence. Some version of fideism thus seems unavoidable for the reflective believer. But granting, for the sake of the argument, that Bishop is right about the options available to the contemporary reflective believer, it might nevertheless be argued that a very different situation obtained prior to the development of rational empiricist evidential practice (and perhaps continues to obtain where that practice has not taken root). Arguably for premodern thinkers there was no question of “isolating” belief in God from any “wider, generally prevailing, evidential practice,” and thus no existential “choice” to be made about which standards to employ. If this is right, it provides additional support for the claim that it is anachronistic to describe someone like Tertullian as a fideist. Put differently, starting from the thesis of evidential ambiguity allows for the historicizing of fideism, in a way that encourages us to view the possibility to which the descriptive use of the term refers as contingent on particular historical developments, rather than as perennially available—i.e., as a distinctively modern response to a distinctively modern problem.

Where Bishop and Evans agree is that some version of fideism is justifiable—on moral and/or rational grounds—even if what is believed by faith itself requires no external evidential support. Their quarrel is thus not with reason tout court, but with certain philosophical assumptions about belief entitlement.


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James, William | Kierkegaard, Søren | Pascal's wager | pragmatic arguments and belief in God | religion: epistemology of | Wittgenstein, Ludwig