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The Epistemology of Religion

First published Wed Apr 23, 1997; substantive revision Wed Mar 11, 2009

Contemporary epistemology of religion may conveniently be treated as a debate over whether evidentialism applies to the belief-component of religious faith, or whether we should instead adopt a more permissive epistemology. Here evidentialism is the initially plausible position that a belief is justified only if “it is proportioned to the evidence”. For example, suppose a local weather forecaster has noticed that over the two hundred years since records began a wetter than average Winter is followed in 85% of cases by a hotter than average Summer. Then, assuming for simplicity that the records are reliable, the forecaster is justified in believing with less than full confidence that this Winter, which is wetter than average, will be followed by a hotter than average Summer. But evidentialism implies that it would not be justified to have full belief, that is belief with 100% confidence. Again, consider someone who has a hunch that this Summer will be hotter than average but cannot justify that hunch further. Hunches are not considered evidence, so the belief is not considered justified. If, however, the huncher can cite a good track record of hunches about the weather that have turned out correct then the belief would be considered justified. For although hunches are not considered evidence, memories about past hunches are, as are the observations that corroborated the past hunches.

Evidentialism implies that full religious belief is justified only if there is conclusive evidence for it. It follows that if the arguments for there being a God, including any arguments from religious experience, are at best probable ones, no one would be justified in having a full belief that there is a God. And the same holds for other religious beliefs, such as the belief that God is not just good in a utilitarian fashion but loving, or the belief that there is an afterlife. Likewise it would be unjustified to believe even with less than full confidence that, say, Krishna is divine or that Mohammed is the last and most authoritative of the prophets, unless a good case can be made for these claims from the evidence.

Evidentialism, then, sets rather high standards for justification, standards that the majority do not, it would seem, meet when it comes to religious beliefs, where many rely on “faith”, which is more like the forecaster's hunch about the weather than the argument from past climate records. Many others take some body of scripture, such as the Blible or the Koran as of special authority, contrary to the evidentialist treatment of these as just like other any other books making various claims. Are these standards too high?

This century has seen a turn in the debate, with emphasis on the implications of disagreement, “How can sincere intelligent people disagree? Should not we all suspend judgement?”

1. Simplifications

Epistemology is confusing because there are several sorts of items to be evaluated and several sorts of evaluation. Since the topic of this article is the epistemology of religion not general epistemology it will be assumed that what is being evaluated is something related to faith, namely individual religious beliefs, and that the way of evaluating religious beliefs is as justified or unjustified.

This entry, therefore, concentrates on questions such as, “Is it justified for Fatima to believe in God?”, “Is it justified for Richard to believe in the Trinity?”, or “Is it justified for Ramanujan to believe that Krishna is a human incarnation of the divine?” It ignores such questions as whether these beliefs count as knowledge or whether these beliefs are scientific.It also ignores disputes between coherence theorists and foundationalists and disputes over whether belief is voluntary. Although these have some implications for the epistemology of religion they are primarily topics in general epistemology.

Finally, and more controversially, this entry concentrates on Western epistemology of religion, which is not, however, the same as the epistemology of Western religion. Note, though, that epistemological disputes between Hindu and Buddhist philosophers over a thousand years ago are much the same as those here considered.

2. The Rejection of Enlightenment Evidentialism

Most contemporary epistemology of religion may be called post modern in the sense of being a reaction to the Enlightenment, in particular to the thesis of the hegemony of evidentialism. (Compare Vanhoozer 2003.) Hegemony is discussed below, but first consider evidentialism. This is the initially plausible position that a belief is justified only if “it is proportioned to the evidence”. (Beliefs proportioned to the evidence include, as a special case, the evidence itself.) Here several sorts of evidence are allowed. One consists of beliefs in that which is “evident to the senses”, that is, beliefs directly due to sense-experience. Another sort of evidence is that which is “self-evident”, that is, obvious once you think about it. Evidence may also include the beliefs directly due to memory and introspection. Again moral convictions might count as evidence, even if not treated as “self-evident”. But in order to state the sort of evidentialism characteristic of Enlightenment thought, it is stipulated that no beliefs asserting the content of religious or mystical experiences count as evidence. For example, if Fatima had an experience that she would describe as of the presence of God she should not treat God's presence to her as a piece of evidence. That does not prevent the claim that someone has had a religious experience with a certain content from counting as evidence. For example, the fact that Fatima had an experience as if of God's presence would be a piece of evidence. Likewise the fact that various people report miracles counts as evidence.

Evidentialism implies that no full religious belief (i.e., a religious belief held with full confidence)is justified unless there is conclusive evidence for it, or it is self-evident. The content of religious experience has been stipulated not to count as evidence. Even if, as Descartes held, there the existence of God were self-evident,beliefs such as Richard's in the Trinity and Ramanujan's in the divinity of Krishna would not be. So the only available evidence for these beliefs would seem to be non-religious premisses, from which the religious beliefs are inferred. Therefore, the only way of deciding whether the religious beliefs are justified would be to examine various arguments with the non-religious beliefs as premisses and the religious beliefs as conclusions.

According to evidentialism it follows that if the arguments for there being a God, including any arguments from religious experience, are at best probable ones, and if, as most hold God's existence is not self-evident then no one would be justified in having full belief that there is a God. And the same holds for other religious beliefs, such as Richard's belief in the Trinity and Ramanujan's in the divinity of Krishna. Likewise, it would not be justified to believe even partially (i.e., with less than full confidence) if there is not a balance of evidence for belief.

In fact it seems that many religious believers combine full belief with “doubts” in the sense of some reasons for doubting, or they combine partial belief with what they take to be weighty reasons for disbelief. According to evidentialism this is not justified. Other believers consider that, on reflection, they have little reason for doubting but that they have almost no positive evidence for their religious beliefs. According to evidentialism this too is unjustified. This raises the question, how can we adjudicate between an epistemological thesis which might otherwise be believed and a religious belief which that thesis implies is unjustified? The Enlightenment thesis of the hegemony of evidentialism may be stated thus: (a) human beings can discover the correct epistemology in isolation from discovering actual human tendencies to form beliefs, (b)evidentialism is the correct epistemology, and so (c) there is an overriding reason to use evidentialism to correct the above-mentioned tendencies. If, according to evidentialism, full or even partial religious beliefs are unjustified, then, given the hegemony of epistemology there is an overriding reason to reject those beliefs. Perhaps the clearest exponent of this position is the comparatively recent Clifford whose use of moral vocabulary conveys well the overriding character of the reasons epistemology is said to provide. His position is summed up in the famous quotation: “It is wrong always, everywhere, and for anyone, to believe anything upon insufficient evidence” (Clifford 1879: 186).

At the other extreme from Clifford is the position of fideism, namely, that if an epistemological theory such as evidentialism conflicts with the holding of religious beliefs then that is so much the worse for the epistemological theory.

The rejection of the hegemony of evidentialism is quite compatible with holding a hegemony thesis for a fragment of epistemology. Such a fragment might, for instance, contain the principle of self-referential consistency, relied upon by Plantinga (1983: 60). This states that it is not justified to have a belief according to which that belief is itself not justified. Consider, for instance, the extreme case of the person who believes that no belief is justified unless it can be proven from premises everyone agrees upon.

Postmodernism implies more than being post modern in the above sense. For it is the rejection of the hegemony of even a fragment of epistemology. That might seem agreeable to fideists. Postmodernism tends, however, to trivialize fideism by obliterating any contrast between faith in divine revelation and trust in human capacities to discover the truth. (For a discussion of fideism and postmodernism see Stiver 2003.)

Much contemporary epistemology of religion seeks to avoid the extremes both of the Enlightenment evidentialism and of fideism. It is thus post modern without necessarily being postmodernist. Call the injunction to avoid these extremes the problematic of contemporary epistemology of religion.

3. Evidentialism Defended

One response to the problematic is to separate evidentialism from the hegemony of epistemology. Evidentialism may then be defended by noting how we implicitly rely upon evidentialist principles in many different areas of enquiry, or by noting which principles generalise various particular examples of justified and unjustified reasoning. Such a defence of evidentialism is part of the project of some contemporary philosophers who seek to attack theism in favour of agnosticism and/or atheism. This defence may well be implicit in Flew's famous “The Presumption of Atheism” (1972). It is more explicit in Scriven's Primary Philosophy (1966, ch 4). Scriven and Flew are relying on the Ockhamist principle that, in the absence of evidence for the existence of things of kind X, belief in Xs is not reasonable. This they can defend by means of examples in which non-Ockhamist thinking is judged not to be justified. So even if the whole of evidentialism is not defended, the Ockhamist fragment of it may be.

Not surprisingly the reliance of non-theist philosophers on evidentialism has been criticised. First there is an ad hominem. Shalkowski (1989) has pointed out that these defenders of evidentialism tend in fact to be atheists not agnostics, yet a careful examination, he says, of the examples used to support Ockham's Razor show that either they are ones in which there is independent evidence for denying the existence of Xs or ones in which suspense of judgement seems to be the appropriate response, not denial. Another criticism is Plantinga's claim that evidentialism is self-referentially inconsistent for there is no evidence for evidentialism (Plantinga 1983: 60). This might be met in either of two ways. First, it could be said that all that is being defended is the Ockhamist fragment of evidentialism and that this is not itself vulnerable to Ockham's Razor. Or it could be argued that deriving an epistemology from a wide range of examples is evidence for it. To be sure this is far from conclusive evidence. But even a less than full belief in an epistemological thesis which showed theism to be unjustified would be damaging. This may be illustrated using an example with artificial numerical precision: 80% confidence in an epistemology which showed that no degree of belief in theism greater than 60% was justified is incompatible with a degree of belief belief in theism greater than 68%. (The person in question could have a degree of belief no more than (100 − 80)% in the conjunction of theism with some alternative , theism-friendly, epistemology and a degree of belief in the conjunction of the preferred epistemology with theism no greater than 80% of 60%.)

4. Natural theology

Theistic philosophers may, of course, grant evidentialism and even grant its hegemony, but defend theism by providing the case which evidentialists demand. Here the details of the arguments are not within the scope of an article on epistemology. What is of interest is the kind of argument put forward. For a start there is the project of demonstrating God's existence, and this project is not restricted to neo-Thomists. (See Craig 1979, Braine 1988, Miller 1991.) To show the justifiability of full belief that there is a God it is sufficient (a) to have a deductively valid argument from premisses which are themselves justifiably held with full belief unless defeated by an objection and (b) to have considered and defeated all available objections to either the premisses, the conclusion or any intermediate steps. Some of the premisses of these argument are said to be self-evident, that is, obvious once you think about it. (E.g., the denial of the explanatory power of an infinite causal regress, or the principle that the existence of any composite thing needs to be explained). And that raises a further epistemological problem. Does something's being self-evident to you justify your full belief in it even if you know of those of equal or greater intellectual ability to whom it is not self-evident?

Many natural theologians have, however, abandoned the search for demonstrative arguments, appealing instead to ones which are probable, either in the sense of having weight but being inconclusive or in the sense of having a mathematical probability assigned to them. Notable in this regard are Mitchell's cumulative argument (Mitchell 1973) and Swinburne's Bayesian reliance on probability (Swinburne 1979). In a popular exposition of his argument Swinburne appeals instead to an inference to the best explanation (Swinburne 1995; see also Forrest 1996). While there are differences of approach, the common theme is that there is evidence for theism but evidence of a probable rather than a conclusive kind, justifying belief but not full belief.

5. The Relevance of Newman

Although pre-dating the current debate, Newman's rejection of Locke's and Paley's evidentialism is relevant to the problematic of contemporary epistemology of religion. First he quite clearly rejected the hegemony of epistemology. His procedure was to examine how in fact people made up their minds on non-religious issues and argue that by the same standards religious beliefs were justified. As a result he qualified evidentialism by insisting that an implicit and cumulative argument could lead to justified certainty. (See Mitchell 1990.)

Newman's position has two interpretations. One, which differs little from Swinburne's probabilistic approach to natural theology, asserts that the consilience of a number of independent pieces of probable reasoning can result in a probability so high as to be negligibly different from certainty. If, to use an example Newman would not have liked, Aquinas's five ways were independent and each had probability 75% then taken together their probability is about 99.9%. One difficulty with this interpretation is that even a highly probable argument differs from a demonstration in that the former is vulnerable to probabilistic counter-arguments. Thus a probabilistic version of the Argument from Evil might subsequently reduce the probability from 99.9% down to 75% again.

The other interpretation of Newman's position is to say that evidentialism falsely presupposes that there are fine gradations on a scale from full belief through partial belief to partial disbelief to full disbelief. Newman claims that human beings are not like that when it comes to those beliefs which form part of religious faith. In such cases the only available states are those of full belief and full disbelief or, perhaps, full belief, and lack of full belief. Of course someone can believe that theism has a probability between 90% and 60%, say, but that could be interpreted as believing that relative to the evidence theism has a probability between 90% and 60%, which, in turn, is a comment on the strength of the case for theism not the expression of a merely partial belief.

If Newman is right then evidentialism is slightly wrong. Instead of requiring belief to be proportioned to the evidence, full belief is justified if the case for it holds “on the balance of probabilities”. Hence a natural theology consisting of merely probable arguments, such as Swinburne's, can still show full religious belief to be justified.

6. Wittgensteinian Fideism

Another reaction to the problematic is Wittgensteinian fideism, the thesis that there are various different “language games”, and that while it is appropriate to ask questions about justification within a language game it is a mistake to ask about the justification of “playing” the game in question. In this way epistemology is relativised to language games, themselves related to forms of life, and the one used for assessing religious claims is less stringent than evidentialism. Here there seems to be both an autonomy thesis and an incommensurability thesis. The autonomy thesis tells us that religious utterances are only to be judged as justified or otherwise by the standards implicit in the religious form of life, and this may be further restricted to Christianity or Hinduism, or any other religion (Malcolm 1992). The incommensurability thesis tells us that religious utterances are unlike scientific or metaphysical claims and so we are confusing different uses of language if we judge religious utterances by the standards of science or metaphysics (Phillips 1992). Stress on the autonomy thesis brings Wittgensteinian fideism close to the fideism of many religious conservatives, but stress on the incommensurability thesis brings it close to the extreme liberal position of Braithwaite (1955), namely that religion is about attitudes not facts, which would, of course, be rejected by religious conservatives.

Perhaps the most obvious criticism of Wittgensteinian fideism is that even if the underlying theory of forms of life and language games is granted, it is an historical fact, itself justified by the criteria of the “game” of history, that the tradition to which the majority of Jews, Christians and Muslims belong to is a form of life with heavy metaphysical commitments, and in which such utterances as “There is a God” are intended as much like “There is a star ten times more massive than the Sun” as like “There is hope”. So Wittgensteinian fideism is only appropriate for such religions as Zen Buddhism and for some, relatively recent, liberal strands of Judaism and Christianity which have rejected the traditional metaphysical commitment (as in Cupitt 1984).

The Wittgensteinian position could be modified to allow a metaphysical “language game” with its own criteria for justification etc, and in which natural theology should be pursued. Then the Judeo-Christian-Islamic “language game” would be part of this larger, autonomous metaphysical “language game”. That modified account would cohere with the historical fact of the metaphysical commitment of that religious tradition. In that case, though, it would seem that, not just the Judeo-Christian-Islamic “language game”, but all serious intellectual enquiry should also be treated as parts of the one “game”, with one set of rules. Thus Wittgensteinian fideism would have been qualified out of existence.

Even if you reject Wittgensteinian fideism you might still take a lesson from it. For it must surely be granted that religious utterances are not made in a purely intellectual way. Their entanglement with commitment to a way of life and their emotional charge might help to explain the fact, if it is one, that those who take religion seriously, whether believers or not, do not in fact have a continuous range of degrees of confidence but operate instead with full belief or full disbelief. For, normally, emotionally charged beliefs are either full on or full off, and in abnormal cases tend to be divided rather than partial. Thus, confronted with conflicting evidence about whether your affection is reciprocated you are far less likely to suspend judgement than to oscillate between full belief and full disbelief. Likewise it seems more normal to oscillate between full belief in God in moments of crisis and full disbelief when things go well than to suspend judgement at all times. This ties in with the Newmanian modification of evidentialism, mentioned above.

7. Reformed Epistemology

An influential contemporary rejection of evidentialism is reformed epistemology, due to Wolterstorff (1976) and Plantinga (1983). As Plantinga develops it in his (1983), beliefs are warranted without Enlightenment-approved evidence provided they are (a) grounded, and (b) defended against known objections. Such beliefs may then themselves be used as evidence for other beliefs. But what grounding amounts to could be debated. More recently, Plantinga has proposed an account of warrant as proper functioning. This account seems to entail that S's belief that p is grounded in event E if (a) in the circumstances E caused S to believe that p, and (b) S's coming to believe that p was a case of proper functioning (Plantinga 1993b). It should be noted that the term “warrant” used elsewhere in philosophy as a synonym for “justified” (as in “warranted assertibility”) is used by Plantinga to mean that which has to be adjoined to a true belief for it to be knowledge. (See Plantinga 1993a). Accordingly the most pressing criticism of Plantinga's recent position is that it largely ignores the question of justification, or reasonableness which, as Swinburne explicates it (Swinburne 2001) amounts to whether the religious beliefs are probable relative to total evidence.

While the details of grounding might be controversial it may be assumed that reformed epistemologists assert that ordinary religious experiences of awe, gratitude, contrition, etc., ground the beliefs implied by the believer's sincere reports of such experiences, provided they can be said to cause those beliefs. Such grounded beliefs are warranted provided they can be defended against known objections. They can then be used as evidence for further religious beliefs. Thus if religious experience grounds the belief that God has forgiven you for doing what is wrong to other humans beings, then that is evidence for a personal God who acts in a morally upright fashion. For, it can be argued, only such a God would find anything to forgive in the wrongs you do to my fellow human beings.

One difference between reformed epistemology and fideism is that the former requires defence against known objections, such as the Argument from Evil, whereas the latter might dismiss such objections as either irrelevant or, worse, intellectual temptations.

A difference between reformed epistemology and Wittgensteinian fideism is that the former proposes a universal relaxation of the stringent conditions of evidentialism while the latter only proposes a relaxation for the case of religious beliefs.

Reformed epistemology could be correct and yet far less significant than its proponents take it to be. That would occur if in fact rather few religious beliefs are grounded in the sorts of ordinary religious experiences most believers have. For it may well be that the beliefs are part of the cause of the experience rather than the other way round (Katz 1978).

8. Religious Experience, Revelation and Tradition

Reformed epistemology might be thought of as a modification of evidentialism in which the permissible kinds of evidence are expanded. Notable in this context is Alston's work arguing that certain kinds of religious experience can be assimilated to perception (Alston 1991).

The difference between reformed epistemology and Enlightenment-style evidentialism is also shown by a consideration of revelation and inspiration. An evidentialist will consider arguments from the premiss that it is said such and such was revealed or the premiss that so and so claimed to be inspired by God, but a reformed epistemologist might allow as warranted those religious beliefs grounded in the event of revelation or inspiration. Thus Mavrodes has argued that any belief due to a genuine revelation is warranted, and has discussed several modes of revelation (Mavrodes 1988). Zagzebski argues that this would have the unacceptable consequence that warrant, and hence knowledge, becomes totally inaccessible either to the person concerned or the community (Zagzebski 1993a: 204–205). For instance, Mavrodes would probably not consider Ramanujan's belief that Krishna is divine as warranted, but even if Mavrodes is correct Ramanujan would have no access to this truth about the unwarranted character of his own beliefs. A similar criticism could be made of beliefs grounded in religious experience. In both cases, the question of whether a belief is genuinely grounded in religious experience or is genuinely grounded in inspiration is one that several religious traditions have paid attention to, with such theories as that of discernment of spirits (Murphy, 1990, ch 5).

In what might be called "counter-reformed epistemology" it could be allowed that a belief can be warranted if grounded in a religious tradition. Such a belief would have to be caused in the right sort of way by the right sort of tradition. As in the previous cases we might note that such grounding should be partially accessible to the believer. Rather little work has been done on this extension of reformed epistemology, but the social dimension of warrant has been noted (Zagzebski 1993a).

Recently Plantinga (2000) has defended a rather different account of divine inspiration, which he calls the Aquinas/Calvin model. This relies upon the doctrine of ‘original sin’ claiming that most humans suffer from a cognitive-affective disorder, but that as a result of Redemption the Holy Spirit heals us so that we are able to function properly, and come to believe the Christian revelation in an immediate, non-inferential manner. In this way the Aquinas/Calvin model supports the Christian metaphysics, which in turn supports the Aquinas/Calvin model. Presumably it will be granted that the probability, y, of the Aquinas/Calvin model given Christian metaphysics is significantly less than 100%, because there are rival Christian models. As a consequence, the probability, z, of Christian metaphysics is less than x/(1−y) where x is the probability of Christian metaphysics given the falsity of the Aquinas/Calvin model. Hence Plantinga's proposal can succeed only if either y is near 100% or x is not too small.

9. Religious Disagreement

Religious disagreement is a long-standing problem in philosophy of religion, but this century there has great interest in disagreements between theists and atheists as well as the disagreements between followers of various religions. (See Kelly 2005, Christensen 2007, Feldman 2007, Kraft 2007, Feldman and Warfield forthcoming.) The problem here is obvious: how can sincere intelligent people disagree? Should not both disputants suspend judgement? To be sure, sometimes those who disagree with you are your intellectual inferiors in some respect. Consider, for instance, someone who insisted that π was precisely 22/7. Those who know of and can follow a proof that π is an irrational number may justifiably dismiss that person as a mathematical ignoramus. The case of interest, however, is that in which no such inferiority is on public display. This is referred to as a situation of public epistemic parity. Richard Feldman criticises the relativist solution to the problem along with unargued dismissal, and reaches the conclusion that in situations of epistemic parity disputants should suspend judgement. Many, however, agree with Peter van Inwagen who, in his autobiographical ‘Quam Delicta’ (1994), implies that it is justified for both parties in a dispute to appeal to what is privately available to them. Such private assertions of epistemic superiority are often expressed by saying that someone “just does not get the point”. Typically, not getting the point requires a cognitive blind-spot. It is not that you know there is a point you cannot grasp, which reasonably requires some deference to those who claim to grasp it. You fail to see there is a point.

One obvious complication concerning religious disagreements is the appeal to divine inspiration, as a source of private epistemic superiority, as in Plantinga's “Aquinas/Calvin” model (Plantinga 2000). It is hard to see, though, how this could apply to disputes between two religions that both rely on the role of divine inspiration. Perhaps the only substitute for unargued dismissal is argued dismissal.


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