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Francis of Marchia

First published Fri Mar 23, 2001; substantive revision Wed Oct 22, 2008

Francis of Marchia was perhaps the most exciting theologian active at the University of Paris in the quarter century between the Franciscan Peter Auriol (fl. 1318) and the Augustinian Hermit Gregory of Rimini (fl. 1343). He had innovative and often influential ideas in philosophical theology, natural philosophy, and political theory, as much recent scholarship has shown.

1. Life and Work

Francis of Marchia (a.k.a. de Appignano, de Pignano, de Esculo, de Ascoli, Franciscus Rubeus, and the Doctor Succinctus) was born ca. 1285–1290 in the village of Appignano del Tronto in the province of Ascoli Piceno, east of Rome and near the Adriatic (unless noted, see Marchia 2003, 9–13). He became a Franciscan and rose in the order's educational hierarchy, probably studying theology at the University of Paris around 1310, then teaching at a Franciscan studium elsewhere, before returning to the Minorites' Paris studium to lecture on the Sentences of Peter Lombard as bachelor of theology, a common career path for members of the mendicant orders at the time. Manuscript Vat. lat. 943 preserves a full redaction of book II and fragments of the other three books of a commentary on the Sentences that Marchia composed outside Paris after studying at Paris, so this probably represents Marchia's early teaching, unless it belongs to his later Avignon period (Friedman-Schabel 2006, 2). Marchia's Parisian lectures on the Sentences were delivered during the 1319–20 academic year. From these lectures we have a popular commentary on all four books of the Sentences, extant in at least ten manuscripts for each book, with two distinct redactions of book I and two differing versions of book IV and perhaps book III, alongside various abbreviations (Friedman-Schabel 2001). Aside from his alleged attendance at the Franciscan General Chapter in Perugia in 1322 and perhaps a journey the previous year to the court of King Robert of Anjou, then residing in Avignon, what little information we have suggests that Marchia remained in Paris at least until 1323, by which time he had most likely been promoted to master of theology. From this period stems Marchia's short commentary on the first two books of the Metaphysics, and perhaps Marchia's more independent question commentary on the first seven books of the Metaphysics was also composed at Paris. It has recently been argued convincingly that Marchia's sole Quodlibet was probably held in this Paris period as well, rather than in Avignon as previously thought, although the first two questions in the critical edition do not belong to Marchia's text but to John Duns Scotus' Sentences commentary (Duba 2007, 2008). Marchia's literal commentary on the Physics probably belongs to his Paris or Avignon period. Marchia's stay in Avignon is commonly thought to have begun by 1324. Without contemporary documentation, later writers claimed that Marchia was elected Franciscan provincial minister of his native area, Marchia, in 1327, but Robert Lambertini has found evidence definitively refuting this assertion. A document of April 1328 places Marchia as lector at the Franciscan convent in Avignon (Nicolaus Minorita 1996, 189), the site of the papal court, but we have no solid evidence for his earlier presence. The document concerns Marchia's falling out with Pope John XXII for supporting the Franciscan Minister General Michael of Cesena on the issue of apostolic poverty. The next month Marchia fled Avignon with William of Ockham and others, first going to Pisa, where, under the protection of the Holy Roman Emperor Louis of Bavaria, Marchia and Ockham respectively were the top witnesses to a document composed against Pope John in September 1328 (Nicolaus Minorita 1996, 423, 455). Soon afterwards Marchia apparently went on a mission to France, for in February of 1329 Pope John wrote to Elias of Nabinaux, then Franciscan bachelor of the Sentences at Paris, ordering him to arrest Marchia and ship him to Avignon under guard (CUP II, no. 886). The pope had heard recently that Marchia had gone "to Paris and other parts of France to spread the worst errors and to turn the hearts of the faithful religious and others, especially our most dear children in Christ the illustrious king and queen, as well as other princes and magnates, from their devotion to the Church." The Franciscans at Paris loyal to the pope moved against the rebels in June. Marchia and his colleagues continued to write against the pope; the pope responded in the bull Quia vir reprobus of 16 November 1329. Meanwhile Marchia had taken refuge in Munich at the court of the Emperor, along with Cesena, Ockham, Marsilius of Padua, and others. It was in Munich, probably around the start of the new year, 1330, that Marchia began to write his Improbatio against John XXII's bull (Lambertini 2006a, 187–9). Marchia remained a fugitive and important papal adversary for several years, well into the reign of Pope Benedict XII, but he was eventually captured. Although there are problems with the date, a document indicates that Marchia's trial began in early 1341. He confessed and retracted his errors before the Inquisition at the end of 1343 (Wittneben-Lambertini 1999, 2000). Thus reconciled with the Church, Francis of Marchia died some time after 1344.

Until 1991 almost none of Marchia's writings were published and only Anneliese Maier devoted serious and sustained attention to his thought (Maier 1940–1958). Since then, however, Nazzareno Mariani has published five volumes of Marchia's works: the Improbatio (also in Italian: Marchia 2001a), the Physics commentary, the Quodlibet (including a transcription of roughly a quarter of the Scriptum version of book I of the Sentences commentary and two questions from book II in appendices), the four Principia and the Prologue to his Sentences lectures, and finally distinctions 1–10 of the Reportatio version of book I of the Sentences commentary (Marchia 1993, 1998, 1997b, 2003, 2006a respectively). While Mariani continues with the Reportatio of book I, Russell Friedman and Christopher Schabel have laid the foundations for the Scriptum edition (Friedman 1997, 1999; Marchia 1999, 2000, 2001b). For book II, Girard J. Etzkorn has prepared a complete edition of the Vat. lat. 943 version, and, for the critical edition of the main redaction, Tiziana Suarez-Nani is heading a team including Etzkorn, William Duba, and Emmanuel Babey (see Suarez-Nani 2003, 2005a, 2005b; Schneider 1991, 41–75). Duba has begun work on book III (Duba 2003–04), and Roberto Lambertini and Schabel have been untangling book IV (Lambertini 2004, 2006b; Marchia 2006b, 2006c; Katsoura-Papamarkou-Schabel 2006). In a 1991 monograph on Marchia's cosmological thought (Schneider 1991, 29, 76–8), Notker Schneider announced the edition of the Metaphysics commentary, building on the work of Albert Zimmermann (Zimmermann 1965, 1966; Künzle 1966), an effort that Sabine Folger-Fonfara and others are continuing (Folger-Fonfara 2005, ed. Friedman; Amerini 2006).

With the edition of several of Marchia's works thus completed and the remainder in progress, Marchia studies have taken off since the first version of this entry was published in early 2001. With the initiative of the Comune di Appignano del Tronto under the leadership of Domenico Priori, the Centro Studi Francesco d'Appignano was established in Marchia's hometown in May of 2001 during the First International Conference on Francis of Marchia. The proceedings of the third such conference appeared in 2006 (Priori 2006) and the fourth meeting is planned for 2007. Six papers on Marchia were presented at the SIEPM congress on medieval philosophy in Porto in 2002, and a special issue of Vivarium was recently devoted to Marchia and published as a book (Friedman-Schabel 2006). Finally, the journal Picenum Seraphicum, edited by Roberto Lambertini, continues to be a forum for Marchia studies. In all, some fifty new studies have appeared dealing with different aspects of Marchia's thought. As a result, the state of the research has reached a middle stage on the way to maturity. Some questions about his works have been settled, but new disagreements have arisen, for example about the relative chronology of the Vat. lat. 943 version of Marchia's Sentences commentary, the character of the main versions of book IV, or, especially, the respective dating and nature of the Scriptum and Reportatio on book I (Friedman-Schabel 2001; Mariani 2002; Friedman 2004; Schabel 2004; Lambertini 2004; Lambertini 2006b; Alliney 2006a; Katsoura-Papamarkou-Schabel 2006). More important for present purposes, there is now significant debate about Marchia's scientific thought, as will be seen below in the section on natural philosophy. In anticipation of the reaction of the scholarly community to these new studies and of the further contextualization of Marchia's ideas, the present edition of this entry will concentrate on what is already known to be distinctive and influential in Marchia's thought.

2. Philosophical Theology

Marchia's main and most popular writing, larger than all his other works combined, is the Sentences commentary. Although this genre of scholastic writing contains much material that we would call pure science, especially in Marchia's case (see Natural Philosophy below), it is primarily a vehicle for philosophical theology. Here it must be stressed at the outset that Francis of Marchia was not a faithful Scotist, contrary to a common opinion based on misconceptions from early in the twentieth century. Most recent research has proven that Marchia generally rejected or severely modified John Duns Scotus's doctrines, rather than followed them, even in the specific contexts like Trinitarian theology where he was claimed to have been a loyal Scotist (Friedman 1999). For example, Marchia was uncomfortable with Scotus's stress on and use of a strong distinction between the divine intellect and will, and this led Marchia to oppose Scotus on issues such as the procession of the Holy Spirit and the mechanism of divine foreknowledge. Indeed, it seems that Marchia was perhaps less of a Scotist than any of the other continental Franciscans active between Peter Auriol and the Black Death. Nevertheless, Scotus forms much of the backdrop for Marchia's theology. The other thinker against whose theories Marchia often developed his own doctrine was Auriol, whose Sentences commentary Marchia appears to have known in a Reportatio version.

A critical edition of one redaction of Marchia's Sentences commentary would take up about several large volumes. It is roughly equal in size to that of his contemporary and confrère Landulph Caracciolo. Whereas Caracciolo's commentary is frequently a disjointed, point-by-point refutation of Peter Auriol and defense of Scotus on many issues, however, Marchia was more selective in choosing his topics, more independent in giving his determination, and generally more eloquent. For example, Marchia asks only one brief question on the Immaculate Conception, a favorite Franciscan topic (book III, q. 8, and because of a missing quire this question is not present in the most studied manuscript, Vat. Chigi. lat. B VII 113; Duba 2004), showing himself to support the immaculatist position, but he asks a great number of questions in books I, II, and IV on the relationship between the will and intellect.

Thus, although Auriol's controversial opinions on epistemology and divine foreknowledge drew fire from Caracciolo and most other Paris theologians up to Gregory of Rimini's day, even from Oxford Franciscans, Marchia devoted much energy to foreknowledge but almost ignored the great debate over intuitive and abstractive cognition. Aside from an isolated mention of "intuitive cognition" in Scriptum I, d. 3, q. 4, and of "intuitive vision" in the very last question in book IV, Marchia merely discusses the problem in passing on two brief occasions: first, in book II, q. 25 (Marchia 1997, p. 322), while treating angelic knowledge, and second, in book III, q. 13, in the context of the beatific vision of the Word (Duba 2003–04). In the latter case, the more substantial passage, he gives a somewhat Scotistic definition: "Intuitive and abstractive cognition are not distinguished according to having a species or not, but only according to the disposition of the object, because if the object is present, the species represents it intuitively; if absent, it represents it abstractively." Therefore, "the same species that is intuitive in the presence of the object is abstractive in the absence of the object." Marchia adds in agreement with Auriol that God "can cause the act of seeing without the object," and that a species of a created object "indifferently represents" a present or absent object. Although this might provoke some epistemological questions, Marchia turns to the vision of the Essence and leaves human cognition in via aside.

In contrast, Marchia singled out divine foreknowledge for special treatment, devoting three entire distinctions (Scriptum I, dd. 35, 36, and 38) to the issue and concentrating most of his discussion on the reconcilation of foreknowledge with human free will (Marchia 1999, 2000; Schabel 2000). Here Marchia was opposed in some way to just about everyone else who had written on the issue, but mainly Auriol, who had claimed that any determination prior to the coming about of a contingent event destroyed contingency, including the truth or falsity of future-contingent propositions. Marchia's defense of the application of the Principle of Bivalence to propositions about the contingent future was the model for Gregory of Rimini. But having shown that such propositions are either determinately true or false, Marchia went on to articulate a type of prior determination that saved foreknowledge while preserving contingency. In fact, according to Marchia, there must be some determination in the causes of future contingent events prior to their actual occurrence; otherwise nothing would occur:

And I ask about that determination in the cause, was it in the cause before the placing of the effect [into reality] or not? If it was, then I have my point. If not, I ask, how is the effect determined in its cause before it is put into being, necessarily or contingently? If necessarily, then it comes about necessarily, according to this opinion. If contingently and a contingent is not determined to one side in its cause, then that determination is not determined except through some prior contingent determination. And I would ask of this just as before, will it go on infinitely, or is it necessary to stop at some contingent determination in the cause before the effect? (d. 35: Marchia 1999, p. 75)

Marchia, however, was aware that Auriol had claimed that any such prior determination was fatal for contingency, so Marchia draws a distinction between different indeterminations and determinations, perhaps expanding on isolated remarks made by Scotus. There is (1) an indetermination ‘about the possible’ (de possibili), with respect to being able to act and being able not to act. With this indetermination, we are not determined de possibili before an event, so we are free and act contingently and not necessarily. There is also (2) a posterior indetermination ‘about inhering’ (de inesse), with respect to what will be the case in reality. This indetermination toward what will inhere in reality, however, would be an obstacle to foreknowledge and, for us, to acting. Thus it must be replaced by (3) a determination in the contingent cause toward acting, both for the future to be known and for us to act. The (4) determination de possibili, toward being able to act or being able not to act, is absent from free causes until the event occurs, at which time our freedom and power with respect to that event are removed.

An obvious objection is that, for Marchia, the effect is determinate in the cause before the action of the cause, and thus that determination is ‘presupposed’ in the subsequent action of the cause. Since it is ‘presupposed’, that determination is not in the cause's power, and thus is not contingent. Marchia replies with another distinction:

‘Action’ can be taken in three ways: either it can be taken actually, namely when an agent is actually acting; or it can be taken virtually, when an agent can act although he is not acting; or it can be taken in a middle way, not purely actually nor purely virtually, but in a middle way as ‘dispositionally’ or ‘aptitudinally’, namely when an agent is not acting but is determined toward acting, although in actuality he is not acting — and he not only can act, but is determined to be acting later. Similarly there is a threefold ‘determination’ of the agent: one actual, by which an agent actually determinately puts one part of a contradiction into effect; a second is a potential determination by which an agent posits or can determine any part of a contradiction dividedly; the other is, as it were, a ‘dispositional’ or ‘aptitudinal’ determination, by which an agent is determined with respect to the future to putting one part of a contradiction [into effect]. Each determination presupposes the action corresponding to it, because an actual determination follows the action in actuality; the dispositional determination follows the action dispositionally, although it precedes the actual action; the potential determination follows the potential action, although it precedes that actual and dispositional action. (d. 35: Marchia 1999, pp. 89–90)

Thus when an agent is determined de inesse to doing something in the future, that determination is like a disposition, and neither actual, because the event has not yet occurred, nor potential, because the possibility to do otherwise is not removed. Such a determination is not ‘actually’ in the agent's power, Marchia grants, but it is in his power ‘dispositionally’, for although the agent cannot act before he acts, he can be disposed to act so that he will in fact act.

The foregoing example is representative of Marchia's thought in many ways. He frequently draws clever and original distinctions, and the de possibili/de inesse division is employed in other contexts such as predestination (book I, d. 40: Marchia 2001b). He makes similar innovative distinctions when discussing the different types of human and divine willing, where his voluntarist opinions are quite interesting (Reportatio I, dd. 45–48: see the critical edition cited below; Alliney 2006b; Robiglio 2006). Although one could argue about the cogency of Marchia's arguments, in the case of the de possibili/de inesse distinction Marchia found a favorable response among the following, who adopted the device: his Franciscan successors at Paris in the next decade Aufredo Gonteri Brito, William Rubio, and William of Brienne; the Augustinian Hermits Michael of Massa and Gregory of Rimini; the arts master John the Canon; and, in the later fifteenth century, Fernando of Cordoba and Francesco della Rovere, who was to become Pope Sixtus IV. Thus in philosophical theology one could and often did look to Marchia for an alternative to Scotus and an innovative response to Auriol.

3. Natural Philosophy

Since the time of Pierre Duhem in the early twentieth century, Francis of Marchia has been known to historians as a scientist. In fact, to a large extent Marchia had gained such a reputation in his own lifetime. It is in John the Canon's Physics commentary that we find him paraphrasing Marchia on future contingents, for example, and John's commentary is full of references to Marchia's own commentaries on the Sentences and the Metaphysics (Friedman-Schabel 2006, 8-10). Looking through the titles of Marchia's questions, one finds an abundance of scientific topics related to such things as the infinite and the psychology of willing (Friedman-Schabel, 2001). In general, Marchia displays a great interest in the causal process. One thing that helps explain his popularity among historians of medieval science, and perhaps his own interest in scientific matters, is his clear and sharp distinction between natural causation that works necessarily and the contingent causation of human and divine free will. In an influential passage containing echoes of Siger of Brabant, a passage to which Anneliese Maier first drew attention (Scriptum I, d. 36: Maier 1949; Marchia 2000), Marchia explains that there are two types of contingency in the world: first, there is contingency per se, simpliciter, positiva, and intrinseca. This is the contingency by which something is still able to occur or not occur even when all the required accidental, natural causes have been posited. There is only one source of such contingency: free will. Second, there is contingency per accidens, secundum quid, privativa, and extrinseca. This is the contingency of natural causation. A natural effect takes place as the result of many accidental causes. Some of these causes may be impeded by other natural, accidental causes, and so with respect to a small, limited number of causes a natural effect may be considered ‘contingent’. This does not mean that the natural effect is really and truly contingent without qualification in the first way, however, because if we take all of the natural effect's causes into account, the effect will necessarily follow, or not follow, as the case may be. That is, assuming God's contingent creation in the first place, and His ‘general influence’ that keeps the chain of causation in existence, natural causation works necessarily, and so with all of an effect's causes taken together, what happens in nature is necessary. Of crucial important for science is Marchia's further assertion that these ‘contingent’ effects can even be known by a created intellect. This is because the number of natural causes is not infinite. Thus a finite, created intellect can know the natural future with certainty. The only problem, says Marchia, is that we humans have a short life and an intellect that is bound with the body.

Interestingly, one of the debates that has arisen recently surrounding Marchia's scientific ideas concerns his concept of natural causation and predictability. In giving an analysis similar to the one above, one scholar remarked that "Marchia in essence is laying down one of the bases of modern science, at least before Heisenberg: predictability is theoretically obtainable in natural systems because natural causes are finite and act necessarily" (Marchia 2000, 22; Schabel 2000, 196–7). A second scholar replied that Marchia is not a natural determinist, that for him, while "generally it's possible to achieve merely the habit of foreseeing the development of causal chains, … physical events happen because causes and effects have dispositiones or aptitudines that make more probable some chains than different ones." According to this response, Marchia was more in line with "Heisenberg's principle of indetermination" than with post-Galilean physics (Zanin 2006a). It seems clear, however, that Marchia's analysis of dispositiones and aptitudines in this context is focused entirely on the problem of knowing causes that are fully contingent in themselves, that is, human free will, as outlined above in the section on Philosophical Theology. By Marchia's time, treatments of divine foreknowledge of future contingents, where Marchia's discussion occurs, had become almost exclusively concerned with the reconciliation of human free will and divine omniscience. Thus Marchia explains that the seemingly contingent effects of the natural world are not the issue here, since they are not really contingent at all, but necessary, given God's general influence and understanding all natural causes taken together. Outside of human and divine free will, there are no sources of contingency. Indeed, the only reason the natural world can be called contingent at all is because God acts freely and contingently in the world as creator and sustainer, not because there is any real contingency in natural causation:

Everything per accidens is brought back to something per se; but the contingency per accidens of natural causes cannot be brought back to their per se necessary causality, because the causality of contingency does not follow from necessary causality alone, since a contingent effect does not follow from necessary causes alone; therefore this contingency per accidens is brought back to some per se contingency. But not to the per se contingency of the human will, since it is not dependent on the human will; therefore it is brought back to the per se contingency of a separate cause. Therefore the First Cause acts contingently, because if it did not act contingently, nothing in things would come about contingently, but all things would come about necessarily. (d 36, a. 1: Marchia 2000, 34)

Accordingly, were Marchia alive today, he might very well have great confidence in the ability of scientists and their computers to predict natural phenomena, since he would see that to some extent the "imperfection of our intellect" and the "brevity of life" have been neutralized:

Therefore I maintain differently that, as was said, there are two kinds of contingent effects: one natural, one voluntary. And according to this I posit two conclusions. The first conclusion is that a contingent natural effect, given the general influence of the First Cause, can be known determinately by a created intellect, although not by a human intellect, through its contingent causes. Let me explain: every effect that is dependent on a finite number of causes necessarily bringing it about can be known determinately through its causes by some finite intellect. (This is clear, because since the causes are finite, they can all be comprehended by a finite intellect, and if they necessarily cause the effect, the effect can be concluded determinately on the basis of such causes.) But every contingent natural effect is dependent on a finite number of causes concurring and necessarily causing it in a finite number of ways, given [God's] general influence. Therefore, every contingent natural effect, given [God's] general influence, can be known determinately by some finite intellect though its contingent causes... [For] although a contingent effect compared to one particular cause can be impeded by another natural cause, compared to the entire order of natural causes that concur all at once the effect cannot be impeded by any natural cause. (d. 36, a. 2: Marchia 2000, 38)

One thing is certain: it is hard to resist comparing the scientific ideas of a medieval scholar to those of later thinkers, even when one is vehemently opposed to doing so. Another debate that has arisen over Marchia's scientific theories further illustrates this. One of the most important innovations of the mature Galileo was the assertion that the celestial and terrestial realms are made of the same fundamental matter and therefore follow the same basic natural laws. In the book that inaugurated the renaissance, or rather birth, of Marchia studies, Notker Schneider declared that Francis of Marchia put forth a hypothesis similar to Galileo's in his commentary on book II of the Sentences, qq. 29–32 (Schneider 1991). On the basis of texts he himself edited, Schneider maintained that, contrary to contemporary Aristotelian theory, Marchia argues that the heavens are not made up of matter so completely different from terrestrial matter that it radically differentiates the supralunar realm from the sublunar one. On the contrary, the basic matter is the same everywhere, and just as Marchia considers the natural world to follow predictable patterns, he also thinks that those patterns are universally applicable. These two tenets have important implications for the practice of natural philosophy (Schneider 1991).

Recently, however, it has been argued convincingly that Marchia's admittedly complicated texts could be read in a different, less radical way. Marchia may say that at the most fundamental level the matter in the celestial and the terrestial realms is the same, since they share "the same prime matter and thus the same bare potentiality," but practically speaking he drew such strong distinctions that, since their natural potencies are different, the laws applying to each are different (Thakkar 2006). In response to this reinterpretation, one could point out that, even in the post-Galilean world, we still think that the celestial and terrestrial realms are really different, just as water and air are radically different realms on earth. The search for the luminiferous ether went on until comparatively recently, and it is still common sense that objects in deep space behave differently from those in our atmosphere. All agree that the question for future research is whether and to what extent Marchia went further than his predecessors and contemporaries.

Given these fascinating debates, it is no wonder that Marchia's physical theories drew the attention of medieval and modern scholars alike. The first important study on Marchia's thought was Anneliese Maier's partial edition and analysis of book IV, q. 1, of Marchia's Sentences commentary (Maier 1940; critical edition Marchia 2006b; version from Vat. lat. 943 in Marchia 2006c). There Marchia puts forth his famous forerunner to John Buridan's impetus theory of projectile motion. Aristotle had not provided a satisfactory explanation for why, when we throw a ball, for example, the ball keeps going even after we have released it. Marchia's explanation was that we leave behind a force in the ball — a virtus derelicta — that keeps the ball in motion. The fact that this force was temporary rather than permanent meant that it was not akin to the inertia theory of classical mechanics, but, as Marchia stated explicitly, it was a simple theory and did explain the phenomena in temporary projectile motion.

As part of the recent "upsurge" in Marchia studies, his theory of virtus derelicta has also been reconsidered (Zanin 2006b; Marchia 2006b, 2006c). It is clear that the basic idea of a force left behind had been circulating for several decades, so Marchia did not develop the theory ex nihilo. Nevertheless, Marchia appears to have spent much more time and energy on projectile motion than his predecessors. Aristotle himself did not go on at great length and in much detail, which probably explains why his theory was so flawed. It seems, then, that the scientific problem only became a significant issue among natural philosophers with Francis of Marchia. Despite its obvious improvement on Aristotle, before the 1330s Marchia's theory was opposed by his Franciscan successor at Paris Francis of Meyronnes and by Meyronnes' follower Himbert of Garda, another Franciscan, although it was treated more favorably by John the Canon and the Franciscan Nicholas of Bonet. But none of them analyzed it extensively. Already in the mid-1320s, however, Gerard Odonis embraced it wholeheartedly and in detail. Therefore, although the famous theories put forth by John Buridan and Nicole Oresme in the following decades in lengthy discussions differ in some ways from Marchia's, the similarities between the theories and the mere fact that Buridan and Oresme took the issue of projectile motion so seriously surely point to Marchia's impact. In this way, Marchia most probably had an impact on the development of the theory of inertia.

Yet Marchia did not come up with the theory of inertia, Buridan's theory of impetus, or Oresme's modifications to Buridan's theory. Part of the reason for this is that Marchia presented his idea in the context of a discussion of the sacraments. This is not unusual for Marchia: in developing his doctrine on the nature of accidents, for example, the Franciscan theologian began with the miracle of the Eucharist and modified Aristotelian metaphysics accordingly (Amerini 2006). Thus for Marchia, projectile motion was just one of many instances where a force was left behind. In essence Marchia wanted a unified theory of virtus derelicta that would explain a number of phenomena, including speaking, seeing, celestial motion, and the conversation of the saints in heaven, in addition to the power of the sacraments and projectile motion. Since some of these phenomena were temporary and not permament, exhausting themselves without external resistance, Marchia applied this to the general theory: virtus derelicta is a self-expending and therefore temporary force. Accordingly, Marchia believed that celestial motion was probably not perpetual based on an initial virtus derelicta, perhaps left behind by God, although he asserted that it was at least possible that, in the heavens, without resistance, the virtus derelicta could be incorruptible. Making it a permanent force is the step that Buridan would take. But Buridan was not concerned with all those other phenomena. For all we know, Marchia would have approved of Buridan's notion. As it stands, Marchia's theory, especially in its particular details, "is neither an Aristotelian solution to the problem of projectile motion nor a new development on the road to early modern science; it belongs to a new (but subsequently undeveloped) understanding of motion" (Zanin 2006b, 81). Nevertheless, if we consider that Marchia appears to have been the first in the West to break with Aristotle so clearly, decisively, and prolixly, it is more than likely that his virtus derelicta was Buridan's inspiration.

Perhaps medieval scholars did not arrive at inertia because of their reluctance to accept and then analyze at length motion in a vacuum. One of Aristotle's arguments for the impossibility of a vacuum was the lack of resistance of the medium. If velocity was a function of the proportion of force to the resistance of the medium, then with no resistance there would be motion in an instant, something usually considered an impossibility. In book II, q. 16, a. 5 of his Sentences commentary, however, Marchia has to wonder why an angel, which is not a "corpus quantum," or bodily mass, cannot move instantaneously, i.e. from one place to another without any temporal duration. Part of the answer is simply that it is a contradiction to be two places at once, but Marchia adds that there must be some sort of internal resistance in angels that makes instantaneous motion impossible. The notion of internal resistance unrelated to natural place (even though no corpus quantum is involved) and the concept of impetus (Buridan's making the virtus derelicta permanent) appear to be primitive versions of the ingredients of a theory of inertial mass. Since Marchia's writings predate those of his more famous successors, the Oxford Calculators and Buridan and Oresme at Paris, and some of his ideas at least resemble Galileo's in some way, Marchia's possible impact on later scientists is a good topic for future research.

4. Political and Social Thought

With the progress of the critical edition of Marchia's Sentences commentary, we are beginning to appreciate more fully his thought in philosophical theology and natural philosophy. Investigating where Marchia stands in political theory has been much easier due to Mariani's publication of the Improbatio some fourteen years ago (Marchia 1993), probably written in the beginning of 1330. While the nature of the relationship between societal factors, on the one hand, and science and philosophical theology, on the other, has long been a subject of controversy, it is clear that political thought is closely tied to the circumstances of the thinker. As in the case of Ockham, circumstances drove Marchia into opposition to Pope John XXII. Unlike Ockham, however, Marchia had dealt with some issues of social and political philosophy in the early 1320s in book IV of his Sentences commentary. In the tense climate of the struggle against Pope John at the end of the decade, when Marchia's writings focused on more worldly affairs, he made some subtle modifications to serve his new aims (Lambertini 2006b). The group of scholars supporting the ex-minister general of the Franciscans Michael of Cesena gathered at Louis of Bavaria's court in Munich and collaborated on their anti-John XXII tracts. It has been shown that Marchia's Improbatio influenced Ockham's Opus nonaginta dierum (Miethke 1969; Lambertini 2000, 2003, 2006a, 2006b) and most probably the Cesena group's Appellatio magna monacensis (Lambertini 2001). Thus, as in philosophical theology and natural philosophy, Marchia had an historical impact.

The Franciscans maintained that they lived the most perfect life that was humanly possible, following the model of Christ and the apostles who, they claimed, possessed nothing either as individuals or in common. John XXII not only denied that Christ and the apostles had no possessions, but he also declared the Franciscan position to be heretical. The resulting quarrel came to touch on such issues as usury, ownership of property, disposal of property, natural and divine law and rights, papal infallibility, and ultimately the basis of sovereignty.

On the question on dominion, or possession, of property, Marchia accepted the pope's assertion that, even in the state of nature before the fall, Adam had dominion over the things he used, but Marchia denied that this type of dominion had much at all in common with post-lapsarian dominion: they are alterius generis, differing like violent and natural, like corruptible and incorruptible (Lambertini 2000, VII). Before the fall, Adam had "dominion of natural liberty and perfection," according to the "primaeval natural law"; afterwards, although Marchia admitted that there was a "remnant of natural law," basically it had to be replaced by positive law and the dominion of "servile necessity" and the "power of compulsion." This is because, if left to his own devices, post-lapsarian man would grab all he could get.

Marchia describes the situation in the state of nature thus:

In the state of nature all things had been common to all people, not only with respect to the dominion of things but also with respect to use, whether de iure or de facto — with respect to use de iure because the right of using whatever was suitable to them had been common to all and proper to none. (Marchia 1993, pp. 154–5)

Moreover, even before the creation of Eve, Adam had no dominion over things that was "proper" to him. Therefore Pope John erred in claiming that the eventual "division of things" into private possessions stemmed from divine law, since it came from human or positive law, necessitated by human iniquity. The first division, by human law, occurred already with Cain and Abel before the Flood. Of course God restored common dominion to Noah and his sons with the Deluge, but humans and human law soon reinstated the division of goods. This was not by divine will, for "when they began to build the tower [of Babel] it was by human counsel, not by divine — indeed God was not pleased." By extension, the laws of emperors and princes derive from human law, not divine, with the exception of Hebrew law in the time before Christ, a special status lost at the crucifixion.

The upshot is that private property is not divinely instituted, for Marchia: it is a human introduction. In the state of nature, by divine law, humans had a common "dominion" over goods, but this dominion is not at all the dominion of human law, of private property. Moreover, it is this common dominion that Christ and the apostles followed. It is therefore humanly possible to do so, indeed the best possible way to live, and the Franciscans approached it more closely than anyone else.

On the question of ecclesiastical power, of course, Marchia was also in disagreement with Pope John XXII (Lambertini 2000, IX). In order to defend Christ's poverty and that of the Franciscans by extension, Marchia interpreted Christ's remark to Pilate that "my kingdom is not of this world" as meaning not only that the origins of his kingdom and the source of his power are not of this world, but also that his kingdom and his power are not with respect to the things of this world. Indeed, for Marchia, Caesar had legitimate sovereignty over this world. Marchia thus denied that Christ, as a man, possessed any temporal power, and hence he rejected John XXII's claim that Christ was rex and dominus in a temporal sense. The implication is that the pope could not inherit temporal power over the entire earth, although Marchia admitted that the temporal sword could pertain to the pope indirectly and mediately.

Given that the few historical surveys that have been done demonstrate that Marchia had an impact on his successors in many areas of philosophical thought, and given that it is only in the past fifteen years that any substantial part of his works has been available in print, we can expect the flood of investigations of the ideas of this interesting and important scholastic thinker to continue.

5. Critical Editions of Texts

The following texts are critical editions, using all known manuscript witnesses, which will be published in the future with apparatus criticus and fontium. Distinctions 35–48 of book I of the Sentences concern the unified themes of divine knowledge, power, and will. Marchia's Scriptum for book I ends prematurely at distinction 40, and distinction 39 on divine ideas is much trunctated. Since distinctions 35–40 of the Scriptum have been published (Marchia 1999, 2000, 2001b), the following texts from the Reportatio for book I, distinctions 39, 42–44, and 45–48, complement the Scriptum material on these subjects.


Total Marchia Bibliography: Friedman-Schabel 2006, 15-20


Secondary Literature

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Related Entries

Auriol [Aureol, Aureoli], Peter | Buridan, John [Jean] | Duns Scotus, John | Gregory of Rimini