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John Buridan

First published Mon May 13, 2002; substantive revision Mon Jul 10, 2006

Perhaps the most influential Parisian philosopher of the fourteenth century, John Buridan did much to shape the way philosophy was practiced not only during his own lifetime, but throughout the later scholastic and early modern periods. He spent his entire career as a teaching master in the arts faculty at the University of Paris, lecturing on logic and the works of Aristotle, and producing many commentaries and independent treatises on logic, metaphysics, natural philosophy, and ethics. His most famous work is the Summulae de dialectica (Compendium of Dialectic), a text of astonishing breadth and originality aimed at redeeming the older tradition of Aristotelian logic using the newer, terminist logic of ‘moderns’ such as Peter of Spain and William of Ockham. Buridan applied these analytical techniques so successfully in his metaphysics, physics, and ethics that, for many of his successors, they came to be identified with the very method of philosophy, understood as a secular practice, i.e., as distinct from theology.

1. Life

John Buridan was born sometime before 1300 at or near the town of Béthune in Picardy, France. He was educated in Paris, first at the Collège Lemoine, where he was awarded a benefice or stipend for needy students, and then at the University of Paris, where he received his Master of Arts degree and formal license to teach by the mid-1320s. He enjoyed a long and illustrious career as an arts master at Paris, serving twice (in 1328 and 1340) as university rector and supporting himself with numerous benefices. He last appears alive and well in a document of 1358, which mentions him adjudicating a territorial dispute between the English and Picard nations (the Parisian student body at the time was organized according to one's place of origin). He must have died shortly thereafter because in 1361, one of his benefices was awarded to another person.[1]

Such is the historical record -- a handful of relatively minor details.[2] Buridan's fame as a teacher and philosopher, however, quickly turned his life into the stuff of legend. There are stories that he met his end when the King of France had him thrown into the Seine River in a sack because of a scandalous affair with the Queen, that he went on to found the University of Vienna after being expelled from Paris for his nominalist teachings, and that he even hit the future Pope Clement VI over the head with a shoe while competing for the affections of the wife of a German shoemaker (the blow apparently created the prodigious memory for which Clement was widely known). But none of these stories can be independently verified, and most are inconsistent with what we do know about him.[3] Nevertheless, they illustrate what the French scholar Edmond Faral called the “bruits de ville” or ‘buzz’ surrounding Buridan's name in Parisian circles, which continued for some time after his death.[4]

Buridan's academic career was unusual in two respects, both of which help to explain his philosophical outlook. First, he appears to have spent his entire career in the faculty of arts, without moving on to study for a doctoral degree in one of the higher faculties of law, medicine, or theology -- the more typical career path in medieval academia. Most of the figures we think of today as medieval philosophers were in fact trained as theologians, including Thomas Aquinas, Duns Scotus, and even William of Ockham (though he did not finish his degree). Since university statutes forbade arts masters from teaching or writing about theology, Buridan produced no theological works and no commentary on the Sentences of Peter Lombard, the principal genre of philosophical writing in the fourteenth century.

Why did Buridan remain in the faculty of arts? It is unlikely that someone of his obvious philosophical abilities would have gone unnoticed. Nor does the reason appear to have been a lack of means, for despite his impoverished background he did receive a number of bursaries and stipends, and is even listed in a document of 1349 as being among those masters capable of supporting themselves without financial assistance from the University. One possible answer -- though in the absence of concrete evidence that he never studied theology, it must remain speculative -- is that he deliberately chose to remain among the ‘artists [artistae]’. What little he does say about philosophy very clearly ties the philosophical enterprise to his office as an arts master, not to whatever it was the theologians took themselves to be doing. Rejecting the traditional picture of theological learning as the perfection or completion of philosophical wisdom, Buridan seems to articulate, perhaps sometimes in spite of himself, a new vision of philosophy as a secular enterprise based on what is evident to the senses and intellect, in contrast to theology, which begins from non-evident truths revealed in scripture and doctrine. Perhaps most tellingly, Buridan never refers to theology as constituting a ‘scientia’, or body of knowledge.[5]

Buridan is also different in that he remained for his entire life a secular cleric rather than joining a religious order such as the Dominicans or Franciscans. A papal letter of 1329 refers to him as simply, “clericus Atrebatensis diocoesis, magister in artibus [a cleric from the Diocese of Arras and Master of Arts]”.[6] By contrast, the best-known names from the period all had religious and intellectual affiliations beyond the university: Thomas Aquinas (Dominican), Duns Scotus (Franciscan), William of Ockham (Franciscan), Gregory of Rimini (Augustinian), to name a few. The benefit for Buridan was that it freed him from the obligation to enter into the doctrinal disputes that had begun to arise, with alarming frequency and intensity, between religious orders, or between an order and the church hierarchy -- e.g., the dispute between the papacy and the Franciscans over apostolic poverty. Thus, whereas Ockham spent his entire later career on political crusades, away from philosophy, and was finally excommunicated for his troubles, Buridan was bound only by the intellectual and pedagogical traditions of his university. His confessional independence also meant that he could help himself to philosophical insights from a variety of sources. This emerges in the sometimes eclectic character of his work, as we shall see below.

2. Writings

Most of Buridan's works are in the form of commentaries on Aristotle. He wrote both expositiones (expositions), or literal commentaries consisting of detailed, line-by-line explanations of the meaning of Aristotle's words, and quaestiones (questions), or longer, critical studies of the philosophical issues raised by them, usually centered on a specific lemma from the text. Both genres originated in the classroom, a fact that becomes clear in the references to student queries and student concerns that survive in the written versions. Like teachers in our own day, Buridan would lecture more than once on the same text over the course of his career, with the result that there are sometimes different versions of his commentary on the same work. For example, there are three versions of his Quaestiones on Aristotle's De anima, the last of which identifies itself as the “third or final lecture [tertia sive ultima lectura]”. Where there are multiple versions of the same commentary, their relationship is generally one of increasing length and sophistication over time.

Buridan commented on virtually all of the major works of Aristotle. In addition to the entire Organon, there are commentaries on Aristotle's Physics, On the Heavens, On Generation and Corruption, De Anima, Parva Naturalia, Metaphysics, Nicomachean Ethics, and Rhetoric.[7] He also wrote a number of shorter, independent treatises on controversial philosophical topics, such as the Tractatus de relationibus [Treatise on Relations], Tractatus de universalibus [Treatise on Universals], Tractatus de consequentiis [Treatise on Consequences], and Quaestio de puncto [Question on <the Nature of> Points]. He was a very prolific author.

But Buridan's masterwork is the Summulae de dialectica [Compendium of Dialectic], a comprehensive logic textbook that started out as a commentary on the Summulae logicales or logical compendium of the thirteenth-century dialectician, Peter of Spain,[8] but soon evolved into an independent work of astonishing breadth and originality. In it, Buridan redeems the older medieval tradition of Aristotelian logic through the via moderna [modern way] -- i.e., the newer, terminist logic that had gradually replaced it. Because the work was accessible to master and student alike, it became extremely popular at Paris and in newly founded universities such as Heidelberg, Prague, and Vienna.

Buridan's other works were almost as widely read as the Summulae. Handwritten copies and early printed editions were carried by his students and followers throughout Europe, where they were often used as primary texts in university courses on logic and Aristotelian philosophy. The via Buridani continued to shape European thought well into the Renaissance.

Like other medieval philosophers, Buridan has not been fully appreciated because of the lack of modern editions and translations of his work (see bibliography). The situation has improved recently with the appearance of Gyula Klima's mammoth translation of the entire Summulae from the (now almost complete) Latin critical edition of the text. But knowledge of Latin and the ability to read medieval manuscripts are still essential if one wishes to study Buridan's thought first-hand.

3. Language

In the medieval university, arts masters provided students with their basic education in grammar, logic or dialectic, and Aristotelian philosophy, subjects that embodied the ideals of literacy and learning in the Middle Ages. What they taught is perhaps best understood as a specialized language of rational inquiry, which became the foundation for further study in the faculties of law, medicine, and theology. Students were required to learn, in ascending order, the exposition and interpretation of authoritative texts (grammar), the structure and modes of argumentative discourse (logic), and finally, the systematic analysis and investigation of the order of nature (Aristotelian philosophy). Although he did not write grammatical treatises,[9] Buridan asserts in the very first section of the Summulae that “positive grammar [grammatica positiva] has to be learned first, by means of which the master is able to communicate with the disciple, whether it be in Latin, French, Greek, or Hebrew, or whatever else” (S 1.1.1: 6). The disciple's knowledge of logic and Aristotelian philosophy is built upon this grammatical foundation.

The importance of language in Buridan's philosophy emerges on many levels, all of which are driven by his pedagogical aims. In logic, grammatical rules are explicitly subsumed as necessary conditions of the science (scientia) of logic, so that although the logician's notion of truth and the grammarian's notion of congruence are separable in theory, in practice the complete significance of a piece of discourse cannot be determined without both. Context is crucial to interpretation:

We should also note that some might ask whether it is the composite or the divided sense that is properly expressed by ‘Every man or (a) donkey runs’, that is to say, whether only the term ‘man’ or the whole subject is distributed. And I say that we have to respond differently, in accordance with the different manners of speaking and writing. For if immediately after ‘man’ there is a sign of division, namely, a pause or a period, then the proposition will be called divided, and only ‘man’ will be distributed, but if not, then it will be called ‘composite’, and the whole subject will be distributed. (S 4.2.6: 250; cf. S 9.4, 15th sophism: 912-13).

Accordingly, logic is not about some conceptually ideal or canonical language but the practical art of interpreting actual human discourse:

an utterance [vox] does not have any proper import [virtus propria] in signifying and suppositing, except from ourselves. So by an agreement of the disputing parties, as in obligational disputes, we can impose on it a new signification and not use it according to its common signification. We can also speak figuratively [transsumptive] and ironically, according to a different signification. But we call a locution ‘proper’ when we use it according to the signification commonly and principally given to it, and we call a locution ‘improper’ when we use it otherwise, although we can legitimately use it otherwise. So it is absurd to say that a proposition of an author is false, absolutely speaking, if he puts it forth incorporating an improper locution, according to which it is true. Instead, we ought to say that it is true, since it is enunciated according to the sense in which it is true … So it absolutely seems to me that wherever it is evident that an author puts forward a proposition in a true sense, although not as a proper locution, then to deny that proposition without qualification would be cantankerous and insolent [dyscolum et protervum]. But to avoid error, it should be properly pointed out that the proposition is not true in the proper sense, or by virtue of its proper meaning, and then it has to be shown in which sense it is true. (S 4.3.2: 256; cf. QIP 5: 144-145, ll. 800-829)

In Buridan's view, the logician cannot expound the meaning of a proposition without carefully attending to its internal features, i.e., the sense of the particular locutions incorporated in it, as well as to its external features, i.e., the discourse conditions that surround it.

This willingness to take human language as it is found, with all of its ambiguities and rough edges, marks an important difference between Buridan and Ockham, the fourteenth-century philosopher with whom he is most often compared. Both make the traditional assumption that propositions, be they spoken, written, or mental, are the bearers of truth and falsity. Ockham, however, tends to see mental propositions as logically ideal or, in modern parlance, ‘canonical’.[10] The problem with spoken and written propositions is that because they depend on the meaning conventions of fallible users, they fail to be universal and logically perspicuous. Thankfully, these shortcomings can be filtered out metalinguistically once we realize that the meanings of their constituent terms depend on their corresponding mental concepts, which naturally signify the same for everyone. So in Ockham's logic, the semantic relation between these concepts and what they signify outside the mind is of paramount importance; spoken and written terms have semantic properties too, of course, but in an entirely derivative way. By contrast, Buridan never privileges conceptual discourse or suggests that the logician might use it systematically to reform spoken or written language. He holds that spoken and written utterances -- sometimes he uses the term ‘utterance [vox]’ where Ockham has ‘term [terminus]’ -- signify concepts primarily: “the capability of speaking was given to us in order that we could signify our concepts to others and also the capacity of hearing was given to us in order that the concepts of speakers could be signified to us” (S 4.1.2: 222). Accordingly, “utterances are imposed to signify things only through the mediation of the concepts by which those things are conceived” (QC 1: 4, ll. 45-6). Concepts are just the medium of signification for Buridan, the cognitive or psychological aspect of the signification of a word.

This difference helps to explain why Buridan uses paradoxes of self-reference to test the functionality of his logic, whereas Ockham avoids them by claiming that a term -- or at least a term in those circumstances -- cannot refer to itself.[11] Buridan takes seriously the fact that people can and do utter self-referential propositions, and thinks logicians should say what is going on when they do. This is really a difference of perspective. As Joël Biard has pointed out, we can divide medieval logicians into those who try to restrict the possibilities of human discourse in the direction of what is logically ideal, and those who are willing to accept a proposition because it is grammatical and because the person who utters it intends to signify something by it. Ockham, William of Sherwood, and Walter Burley belong to the former group; Buridan and Thomas Bradwardine to the latter.[12] It also explains why Buridan tells us that it is not possible to analyze contradictory propositions unless they “have the same subject and predicate in utterance and also in intention” (S 9.7, 2nd sophism: 943), and his reminding us that, when testing a proposition for contradictoriness, “it is [sometimes] necessary to add other utterances when contradicting it…. For one should primarily attend to the intention, for we use words only to express the intention” (S 9.8, 11th sophism: 979). The logician must above all be a skilled interpreter of human discourse.

For Buridan, linguistic confusion is the source of many of the traditional problems of metaphysics and natural philosophy. His approach is broadly nominalistic, but Buridan's nominalism is more of a parsimonious way of doing philosophy than a doctrine about the ontological or metaphysical status of universals. For example, when a cause is understood as being actual rather than merely potential, does our conception of it qua cause change in any way? Aristotle leaves this ambiguous in Metaphysics V.2, but some medieval philosophers thought it necessary to posit an additional state of affairs to explain the dynamic aspect of causality, i.e., the fact that a contingent state of affairs needs to be brought about by some agent. Thus, if we think of God as the cause of Socrates, there must be something else, God's-being-the-cause-of-Socrates (deum esse causam Sortis), distinct from both God and Socrates, to account for his existence. This ‘something else’ then becomes not only what is signified by the proposition ‘God is the cause of Socrates’ (complexe significabile), but also the proper object of our knowledge that God is the cause of Socrates. Buridan replies by arguing that philosophers who think this way do not know how to interpret human discourse. They take everything too literally. But we should not be misled by what a proposition literally says, or seems to say, into thinking that there must be some new kind of entity corresponding to God's being the cause of Socrates, especially since such reifying moves do not help us to understand what is happening when a cause actually causes (QM V.7-8: 30va-33ra).

The same sensitivity to questions of interpretation is evident in his treatment of propositions in natural philosophy, where he argues that we can meaningfully use propositions containing terms such as ‘infinite [infinitum]’ and ‘point [punctum]’ to express actual states of affairs without committing ourselves to the existence of infinite magnitudes or indivisible points. The key is to realize that propositions do not always wear their meanings on their sleeves. Their component terms can be differently construed (e.g., categorematically or syncategorematically), and can even perform different modal functions, which, depending on how the proposition is read (e.g., in a composite or divided sense) can change its truth conditions.[13] There will be ambiguities, of course, but Buridan is steadfast in his assumption that the rational inquirer will always be able to sort them out, given the right dialectical tools.

4. Logic

Following Aristotle and Porphyry, Buridan's logic is based on two distinct, but complementary, conceptions of its purpose: theoretical or pedagogical (logica docens) and practical (logica utens).[14] The former, he says, is so called because “it teaches [docet] us how, and from what [materials], arguments should be constructed, whether those arguments be demonstrative, dialectical, or of some other kind”. The latter takes its name from the fact that “it uses [utitur] arguments in order to prove whether some conclusion is evident, regardless of the subject matter of the conclusion” (QIP 1: 126-7, ll.176-80). But since the teaching of logic is ordained to its use, Buridan holds that logic is ultimately a practical rather than a speculative discipline.

Historians of logic usually classify Buridan among the terminists or ‘moderns’, a diverse group of thirteenth and fourteenth-century logicians who regarded the semantic properties of terms (literally, the ‘ends [termini]’, or subjects and predicates, of propositions) as the primary unit of logical analysis. As we saw above, in addition to commenting on Aristotle's Organon, he wrote a logical compendium, the Summulae de dialectica, ostensibly as a commentary on Peter of Spain's Summulae logicales, an influential terminist textbook written a century earlier. But Buridan's Summulae was essentially a new work, more that ten times longer than the original and featuring many new and completely rewritten sections. In it, Buridan leads his students and readers through an orderly progression of teachings, beginning with propositions (Treatise I), shifting down to the signification and referential function of their component terms (II-IV), then back up to terms and propositions insofar as they figure in more complex patterns of reasoning: syllogisms (V), topics (VI), fallacies (VII), and finally, demonstrations (VIII). The work concludes with a kind of exercise book on paradoxical and otherwise puzzling propositions, showing how they can be resolved using the techniques of the previous eight treatises.

No encyclopedia article can do justice to the richness and variety of Buridan's logic, but there are several moments from the text that illustrate how he practiced the dialectical art.

First, Buridan did much to streamline and better articulate the methods of terminist logic. The most important analytical tool in the Summulae is the doctrine of suppositio [supposition], which had been a feature of terminist logic for several generations by the time Buridan arrived in Paris. Terms were thought to possess two general semantic properties: signification, or what a term ‘makes known’ in the mind of the person who sees it or hears it or conceives of it, whether mediately or immediately (thus, the written term ‘Socrates’ brings to mind the concept of Socrates, which in turn signifies the actual person); and supposition, which refers to the capacity of certain substantive terms to stand for or ‘pick out’ something in a particular context, such as in a proposition. Although the analogy is not perfect, supposition performs many of the same functions as what we would call the theory of reference.[15] Traditional accounts divided supposition into proper supposition, where a term is used with its typical or standard meaning, and improper supposition, where a term is used in some metaphorical or figurative sense. Most logicians went on to distinguish three kinds of proper supposition: personal, where a term stands for what it signifies (e.g., ‘Socrates’ in ‘Socrates is a man’); material, where it stands for itself (e.g., ‘man’ in ‘Man has three letters’); and simple, where it stands for a common nature or concept (e.g., ‘man’ in ‘Man is a species’). Simple supposition appears to have been a vestige of early terminist logic,[16] whose realist practitioners needed to distinguish between referring to a universal thing and referring to a particular thing. But by the fourteenth century, the whole notion of universals had become more controversial, and nominalist logicians in particular were not about to accept any special device for referring to them through common terms such as ‘man’. So simple supposition was readapted to model reference to common concepts or intentions. Thus, Ockham holds that a term exhibits simple supposition when it supposits “for a concept in the mind [pro conceptu mentis],” and is not being used significatively.[17] What united Ockham and his terminist predecessors was their realization that if the proposition ‘Man is a species’ is to be true, then the term ‘man’ cannot supposit personally for any of the individual men it ultimately signifies, since it cannot be said of any of them that he is a species (Socrates is a man, not a species). Accordingly, the reference of ‘man’ must be to a common nature or concept.

But Buridan contends that there are only two ways a term can stand for something in a proposition, personally and materially:

Of the first [section on the divisions of supposition], we should realize that some people have posited also a third member, which they call ‘simple supposition’. For they [e.g., Peter of Spain] held that universal natures are distinct from the singulars outside of the soul. And so they said that a term supposits personally when it supposits for the singulars themselves, that it supposits simply when it supposits for that material nature, and materially when it supposits for itself. But I hold that Aristotle correctly refuted that opinion in the seventh book of the Metaphysics [VII.3.1038b1-1039a23] and so this kind of supposition has to be eliminated, at least according to this interpretation. In another manner, others [e.g., Ockham] call supposition ‘simple’ when an utterance supposits for the concept according to which it is imposed and material when it supposits for itself or another similar to itself. And this can be permitted, but I do not care [about this usage], for I call both ‘material supposition’. (S 4.3.2: 253)

Buridan sees that it is misleading to assign a special logical sense to terms being used to refer to themselves or to the concepts they express, as if this were any different from figurative or metaphorical usage, since only terms that refer to things existing per se are being used in their proper sense. Thus, terms can stand either for the things they ordinarily signify, in which case they supposit personally, or for something else, in which case they supposit materially. Material supposition applies whenever a term is used in some way that departs from the meaning imposed upon it by the linguistic community:

an utterance does not have any proper import [virtus propria] in signifying and suppositing, except from ourselves. So by an agreement of the disputing parties, as in obligational disputes, we can impose on it a new signification, and not use it according to its common signification. We can also speak figuratively [transsumptive] and ironically, according to a different signification. But we call a locution ‘proper’ when we use it according to the signification properly and principally given to it, and we call a locution ‘improper’ when we use it otherwise, although we legitimately can use it otherwise. So it is absurd to say that a proposition of an author is false, absolutely speaking, if he puts it forth incorporating an improper locution, according to which it is true. Instead, we ought to say that it is true, since it is enunciated according to the sense in which it is true. (S 4.3.2: 256)

Notice that the default interpretation of a term is its proper sense, defined as “the signification properly and principally given to it”. The proper signification of a term must be based on the fact that “utterances were primarily and principally imposed to signify so as to stand for their ultimate significata, and not for themselves” (S 4.3.2: 256);[18] that is to say, just as concepts (at least in the first instance) naturally signify those extra-mental things that just as naturally give rise to them, so spoken and written terms (at least in the first instance) are imposed to signify, via their corresponding concepts, the same ultimate significata.[19] For Buridan, this capacity is natural to us as creatures endowed with the power of cognition. It is why he insists that determining the nature of concepts pertains not to logic but to psychology or metaphysics, speculative sciences whose conclusions cannot be otherwise (QDI I.3:6, ll. 4-10).[20] So even if we say that the proposition, ‘Man is a species’ is true insofar as it is put forward in the context of Aristotle's Categories, it is not literally true, or true according to “the signification properly and principally given to it”, because of no per se existing man is it true to say that he is a species. What happens is that when we work on the Categories, we follow Aristotle's lead and depart from conventional usage in such a way that the term ‘man’ supposits not for individual men but for the universal concept according to which it was imposed to signify, in which case the proposition is true because “species and genera are universals according to predication” (S 4.3.2: 254). So it can be true that man is a species without it being literally true that man is a species.

The second way in which Buridan changed the dialectical landscape was to extend the range of traditional logic. There are numerous examples of this, not all of which are uncontroversial because it is often hard to tell what Buridan intended to achieve by a given innovation (this goes for other medieval logicians as well).[21] But a fairly uncontroversial example can be found in his use of supposition to examine the structure of certain complex terms that would remain unanalyzed on the traditional account of syllogistic inferences. Of particular importance here is the doctrine of ampliation. Thus, although the syllogism, ‘Nothing dead is an animal, some man is dead; therefore, some man is not an animal’, is an acceptable fourth-mode syllogism of the first figure (Ferio), Buridan denies that the consequence is “formally valid”. The reason is that in this syllogism, ‘man’ is an ampliative term, and “from an ampliated nondistributed term the same term does not follow nonampliated” that is, “in the minor proposition the term ‘man’ was ampliated to past [things], whereas in the conclusion it was not ampliated,” making the premises true but the conclusion false (S 5.3.2: 326; cf. QAnPr I.14). Similarly, terms referring to the divine persons sometimes generate counterexamples to the traditionally accepted modes. Thus, “the following syllogism in Barbara is invalid: ‘Every God is the son, every divine Father is God; therefore every divine Father is the Son”, for the transitivity of identity fails in cases “where the most simple unity is a trinity of really distinct persons” (S 5.3.2: 327). Buridan also urges the reader to be wary of modal contexts introduced by verbs of knowing and believing because “the verb ‘know’ ampliates the subject to supposit not only for present things, but also for future and past ones”. This means that without suitable qualification, “although I know that every man is an animal, nevertheless, it does not follow that every man is known by me to be an animal; for then it would follow that every man, whether alive or dead or yet to be born, would be known by me to be an animal, which is false” (S 5.6.8: 348). What is noteworthy in these and other examples is Buridan's use of the doctrine of supposition to extend the range of ‘truth-makers’ for modal inferences, e.g., in his assumption that “the presence of a modal copula -- any modal copula -- in a proposition ampliates the subject to stand for not only the actual things but also the possible things that fall under that term”.[22] Because it makes merely possible objects relevant to the evaluation of modal inferences, ampliation can be seen as a kind of Buridanian equivalent of possible worlds semantics, though it would be a mistake to regard it as a remarkable anticipation of that twentieth-century doctrine. Buridan's remarks on its theoretical significance are few,[23] and, despite the degree of technical sophistication involved, he probably did not see it as a radical innovation, but as part of his ongoing effort to make existing schemes for checking inferences more practicable.

Third, and finally, Buridan made major contributions to certain forms of logical inquiry that originated in the medieval period. Most modern logicians know of his solutions to alethic paradoxes such as the Liar, which are addressed in the eighth and final chapter of ninth treatise of the Summulae, which belongs to the medieval literature of sophismata or insolubilia.[24] The 7th sophism Buridan considers is ‘Every proposition is false’. The case posits “that all true propositions are annihilated while the false ones remain [in existence], and then Socrates propounds only this [proposition]: ‘Every proposition is false’” (S 9.8, 7th sophism: 965). The question is then asked whether Socrates's proposition is true or false. The arguments on each side of the question illustrate the difficulties one faces if ‘true’ and ‘false’ are interpreted strictly. The argument that it is false assumes that “it is impossible for the same proposition to be true and false when propounded in the same language and understood in the same way by everyone hearing it”, and proceeds to argue that the sophism is false because any proposition which entails its own contradictory is impossible, and therefore false. The opposite side begins by focusing on the logical form of the sophism as a universal affirmative that has no counter-instance in the case at hand, which stated that all true propositions have been annihilated with only the false ones remaining. Second, the sophism must be true because the subject and predicate terms supposit for the same things: if every proposition is false, then each and every propositional significate of the term ‘every proposition’ must be false, as it indeed is, according to the case. Finally, the sophism must be true because “it signifies only that every proposition is false; and this is how things are [ita est]”, according to the case (S 9.8, 7th sophism: 965).

Buridan writes as if this particular sophism enjoyed some notoriety among logic teachers at Paris, although all but one of the alternative solutions he mentions were discussed and criticized from the very beginning of the insolubilia literature. These involve various ad hoc proposals that either build new assumptions into the case or else make up new rules about how the terms of the sophism are to be interpreted.[25] Into the first category falls a solution known as the ‘transcasus’, which involves the bizarre suggestion that the time Socrates utters his proposition and the time referred to by the verb of the proposition are not the same. This would allow us to say that if there are no true propositions during the first hour of a certain day, Socrates could utter his proposition at the end of this hour and it would be true, where he is understood as referring “not to the time at which he speaks but to the time of that first hour”. But this is of no help if we stick to the case and assume that the times are the same. Alternatively, in a solution advocated by the ‘restringentes [restrictors]’ -- so-called because they avoided self-reference by restricting what a term can supposit for -- we could make the proposition non-reflexive by stipulating that “terms that are apt to supposit for propositions are not put in propositions to supposit for the propositions in which they are put, but for others”. But Buridan rightly rejects this second strategy as failing to take seriously our conventional understanding of terms, for when one uses the term ‘proposition’, he says, “one understands indifferently all propositions, indeed, present, past, and future ones, his own as well as those of another person”. A moment's reflection should make it obvious that “this solution is worth nothing: for what one understands, of that he can speak [quod aliquis intelligit, de hoc potest loqui]” (S 9.8, 7th sophism: 966).[26]

Buridan's quick answer to the sophism is that Socrates's proposition is false in the case at hand. But before moving on to his final answer, he first discusses a solution described as being held by some people, including himself.[27] This is that there is another condition, in addition to the requirement that its terms stand for the same thing or things, which a proposition must meet if it is to be true. A proposition must also signify or assert itself to be true (S 9.8, 7th sophism: 967).[28] In her detailed analysis of this sophism, Fabienne Pironet has shown that the text in which Buridan defends this earlier view is his question commentary on Aristotle's Posterior Analytics, where it is expressed in terms of the traditional formula that “howsoever [a proposition] signifies, so it is [qualitercumque significat, ita est]” (QAnPo I.10).[29] Now Buridan holds that all propositions satisfy this condition trivially: “every proposition by its form signifies or asserts itself to be true” (S 9.8, 7th sophism: 967). The problem with self-referential paradoxes is that they also seem to signify that they are false. Thus, although the proposition ‘I say what is false [ego dico falsum]’ “signifies itself to be true in some fashion, nevertheless this is not so entirely, or howsoever it signifies [licet aliqualiter sic significat, non tamen totaliter vel qualitercumque ita est]. Therefore it is false” (QAnPo I.10).

Unfortunately, this looks no less ad hoc than the transcasus and restriction solutions he has just criticized. Why shouldn't other propositions, besides the paradoxical ones, be able to signify that they are false? Buridan does not say in his commentary on the Posterior Analytics, and in the Summulae he rejects his earlier view for the rather different reason that it is false “that every proposition signifies or asserts itself to be true” (S 9.8, 7th sophism: 968). His argument is not exactly clear, but the problem appears to be semantic: he cannot find an interpretation of the phrase ‘itself to be true [se esse veram]’ in the supplementary condition that will permit it to function as a general principle. Consider the proposition ‘A man is an animal [homo est animal]’. If we understand it materially, i.e., as standing for a proposition, then it will signify ‘The proposition “A man is an animal” is true’, which is false because it refers to second intentions (concepts or signs by means of which we conceive of other concepts or signs as such), and the original proposition refers to things (human beings and animals), not concepts. But what if we say that a proposition signifies itself to be true if it is taken significatively for the things or first intentions, rather than materially? This will not work either, argues Buridan, because then the affirmative proposition ‘A man is a donkey [homo est asinus]’ would signify that a man is a donkey, which is false because the subject term ‘man’ does not supposit for anything (no human beings are donkeys).[30] Accordingly, we cannot base our solution to self-referential paradoxes on the idea that every proposition signifies or asserts itself to be true.[31]

The solution Buridan finally settles on receives the somewhat tepid endorsement of being “closer to the truth” than the previous solution -- a reflection, perhaps, of his awareness of the imperfectability of any formal system that tries to stick close to the facts of human language. Here, the idea that a proposition formally signifies itself to be true is replaced by the notion of implication from the doctrine of consequences. “Every proposition,” he says, “virtually implies another proposition in which the predicate ‘true’ is affirmed of the subject that supposits for [the original proposition]” (S 9.8, 7th sophism: 969).[32] Unlike the old solution, in which the second proposition is signified by the first and hence part of its meaning, the new solution assumes only that the second proposition follows logically from the first, so that its meaning can be expounded separately. In this way, for the truth of any proposition P, it is required not only (1) that the subject and predicate terms of P stand for the same thing or things,[33] but also (2) that P implies another proposition, ‘P is true’, which must also be true. Otherwise, we would have a true antecedent and a false consequent, violating Buridan's fifth theorem regarding assertoric consequences, which states, “it is impossible for what is false to follow from what is true [impossibile est ex veris sequi falsum]” (TC I.8: 34, l. 97). Applying this to the 7th sophism, the constituent terms in the proposition uttered by Socrates -- ‘Every proposition’ and ‘false’ -- stand for the same things, since in the posited case, “all true propositions are annihilated and the false ones remain, and then Socrates propounds only this: ‘Every proposition is false’”. So the first condition is satisfied. But the implied proposition, ‘P is true’ (where P is the name of ‘Every proposition is false’), is false because its constituent terms, ‘Every proposition is false’ and ‘true’, do not stand for the same thing, since ex hypothesi, P stands for the antecedent proposition ‘Every proposition is false’, not for things that are true. But this gives us a true antecedent and a false consequent, and so the consequence does not hold. Therefore, the sophism is false.

5. Metaphysics

Buridan's metaphysics is thoroughly informed by his logic. He tries wherever possible to apply the Summulae's analytical techniques to solve problems in speculative philosophy. His approach is critical in the sense that he tends to view traditional problems in metaphysics as based on confusions of logic or language. For the same reason, his solutions are not original in the modern sense of being without precedent, although they have few equals in terms of their elegance and economy of expression. Where philosophical argumentation is concerned, Buridan is a master craftsman.

Like most arts masters in fourteenth-century Paris, Buridan is careful to dissociate the metaphysical questions he asks as a philosopher from similar questions that might be asked by a theologian. Jurisdictional disputes forced Parisian arts masters to be quite clear about how they were approaching a problem,[34] although what we now identify as medieval philosophy was practiced by both sides. As far as Buridan is concerned, much of the confusion over the proper domains of metaphysics and theology stems from Aristotle himself, who identifies three kinds of speculative science: physics, mathematics, and theology.[35] In his question commentary on the Metaphysics, he provides the standard medieval interpretation of this passage, reading ‘theology’ as ‘metaphysics’ and differentiating the three sciences in terms of how they treat their respective subjects: whereas the natural philosopher considers things insofar as they are qualified by motion, and the mathematician insofar as they are quantified by number, the metaphysician considers them only insofar as they pertain to the “concept of being [ad rationem essendi]” (QM VI.2: 34ra).[36] For the difference between metaphysics and theology, however, we need to go to the very beginning of the commentary, where he offers the following gloss of Aristotle's remarks:

It should also be noted that [when we ask whether metaphysics is the same as wisdom,] we are not comparing metaphysics to theology, which proceeds from beliefs that are not known, because although these beliefs are not known per se and most evident, we hold without doubt that theology is the more principal discipline and that it is wisdom most properly speaking. In this question, however, we are merely asking about intellectual habits based on human reason, [i.e.,] those discovered by the process of reasoning, which are deduced from what is evident to us. For it is in this sense that Aristotle calls metaphysics ‘theology’ and ‘the divine science’. Accordingly, metaphysics differs from theology in the fact that although each considers God and those things that pertain to divinity, metaphysics only considers them as regards what can be proved and implied, or inductively inferred, by demonstrative reason. But theology has for its principles articles [of faith], which are believed quite apart from their evidentness, and further, considers whatever can be deduced from articles of this kind. (QM I.2: 4ra-rb)

The difference is that theologians take their principles (‘principia’ = (lit.) ‘starting points’) from articles of faith rather than, like the philosophers, from what is evident to the senses and intellect. So it is possible for the same question -- e.g., about the limits of divine omnipotence -- to be raised in both domains, though it will have a more creaturely orientation for the philosopher.[37] Buridan concedes de jure place of privilege to theology because of its subject matter, but treats philosophy and theology as de facto equivalent in the speculative realm. Metaphysics, or philosophical wisdom, cannot be ordained by theology because its methods, which are rooted in its principles, are different. Philosophy is accordingly not inferior to theology, just different.[38]

With regard to the problem of universals,[39] Buridan does not so much create a new theory as show how our theoretical commitments can be expressed with a minimum of ambiguity and fuss. Like Ockham, he is a nominalist, although this term must be used with caution in later medieval philosophy because of the modern tendency to identify it with the denial of real universals. It must be remembered that most fourteenth-century philosophers were nominalists in this sense because they associated the contrary doctrine with Plato, with whom they were familiar only secondarily as one of the authors whose views are thoroughly discredited by Aristotle in Book I of the Metaphysics.[40] But medieval nominalism involved much more than rejecting Platonic universals. Its history can be traced to twelfth-century disputes over the reading of sacred texts, in which the techniques of logicians such as Abelard were pitted against those of grammarians such as Peter Helias.[41] As these disputes evolved and matured, nominalism was gradually absorbed into the teaching of philosophers working in the faculty of arts, so that by Buridan's time, it is better to think of nominalism as a practice, or way of doing philosophy, rather than as a piece of doctrine.

When Buridan considers questions such as “whether universals actually exist outside the soul” (TDUI: 137), his remarks are almost always aimed at clarifying the meaning of the term ‘universal’ with respect to other terms such as ‘individual’, ‘particular’, and ‘singular’. His rejection of realism is expressed in the claim that universal terms have no ultimate significate, i.e., nothing outside the soul they can ‘make known’ as such.[42] Hence, an account is needed of what such terms mean. Here, it is almost as if Buridan thinks there is something ill-formed about propositions where the term ‘universal’ occurs in the subject position, for when confronted with them his first move is always to tell us how the term ‘universal’ is to be understood (QIP 3: 136, ll. 477-488).[43] He argues further that the primary signification of ‘universal’ is ‘predicable of many’, which makes it a term of second intention, or a term of terms, since only terms are predicable (QIP 3: 135-136; 4: 139; TDUI: 148).[44] The second-intentional status of the term ‘universal’ is also evident in propositions, where it does not signify a ‘what’ but a ‘how’, i.e., how we conceive of something -- in this case how the term so designated is “indifferent to many supposits,” or individuals (TDUI:59).[45] As we saw above, logic is the study of terms such as ‘proposition’ taken materially, signifying actual tokens of the type (QDI I.1: 6). Moving from propositions to arguments, Buridan insists that terms in the premises and conclusions of demonstrative arguments must be taken as standing materially, i.e., for themselves in the particular discourse conditions which surround them, rather than personally, for their extra-mental significates (QIP 1: 128, ll. 223-237). Likewise, the proximate object of scientific knowledge is the actual demonstrated or demonstrable conclusion rather than the state of affairs it signifies, although Buridan is willing to concede that “the terms of those demonstrable conclusions, or even the things signified by those conclusions” might be considered “remote”, or secondary, objects of knowledge (QIP 1: 127, l. 208-209).[46] Careful and systematic analysis is the best antidote for metaphysical perplexity because the trouble usually begins with untutored persons who use some word or concept without knowing what it means.

It should be noted that Buridan's methods do not always produce parsimonious results. Like Ockham, he has only substances and qualities in his basic ontology, but he is much more willing than Ockham to expand this in the direction of modes or ways of being when confronted with recalcitrant phenomena. Thus, he argues that we must treat the question of how something is as distinct from what it is if we are to have a coherent understanding of motion, especially since the Ockhamist view is forced to posit an infinite succession of spatial qualities (QM V.9: 32va; QP II.3:1ra-rb; QP IV.11: 77va-78rb).[47] Likewise, in a famous passage, Buridan is driven by his own experience to reject Ockham's explanation of condensation and rarefaction as kinds of locomotion. Why, he asks, does he find himself unable to compress further the air in a bellows which has been stopped up at one end? Not because of its matter, since more matter could exist in a much smaller space; nor because of the substantial form of the air, which would fill a much smaller space once it has been cooled; nor even because of the heat it possesses, since more heat could exist in a much smaller space, such as at the end of a red-hot poker. No, the air must have a distinct quantitative form or magnitude preventing it from being moved. Against those who would do away with this distinction, Buridan argues that “a magnitude of this sort has not been posited in vain, for we have been compelled to posit it by arguments that make it seem as useful or even more useful to natural philosophy than [the qualities of] whiteness or blackness” (QP.8: 11vb).[48]

6. Natural Philosophy

Medieval natural philosophy included both the rich commentary tradition on Aristotle's Physics, as well as treatises and commentaries on Aristotle's other writings about the natural world: On the Heavens, On Generation and Corruption, De anima, the short treatises on animate powers known as the ‘Parva Naturalia’, and the works on the history, parts, and generation of animals. Buridan wrote commentaries on nearly all of these texts. Like his contemporaries, he understood the speculative sub-disciplines of physics as an orderly progression of teachings. Thus, demonstration in psychology was thought to borrow its principles or starting points from physics, the higher science to which it is subordinated, with its conclusions in turn supplying principles for demonstrations in the more specialized studies of sensation and animal locomotion. The ordering metaphor is never far from Buridan's mind. He remarks to readers of his commentary on Aristotle's De motibus animalium that in this book, “we descend to the different species of motion in particular, e.g., to the fact that some animals fly, others swim, and so on” (DMA I: 535)

Besides logic, natural philosophy is the other field in which Buridan has enjoyed some recognition. This is largely due to the efforts of the pioneering historians of science Pierre Duhem and Anneliese Maier, who saw that Buridan played a key role in the demise of the Aristotelian view of the cosmos.[49] Buridan's major contribution here was to develop and popularize the theory of impetus, or impressed force, to explain projectile motion. Rejecting the discredited Aristotelian idea of antiperistasis, according to which the tendency of a thrown projectile to continue moving is due to a proximate but external moving cause (such as the air surrounding it),[50] he argues that only an internal motive force, transmitted from the mover to the projectile, could explain its continued motion. The theory of impetus probably did not originate with Buridan,[51] but his account appears to be unique in that he entertains the possibility that it might not be self-dissipating: “after leaving the arm of the thrower, the projectile would be moved by an impetus given to it by the thrower,” he says, “and would continue to be moved as long as the impetus remained stronger than the resistance, and would be of infinite duration were it not diminished and corrupted by a contrary force resisting it or by something inclining it to a contrary motion” (QM XII.9: 73ra). He also contends that impetus is a variable quality whose force is determined by the speed and quantity of the matter in the subject, so that the acceleration of a falling body can be understood in terms of its gradual accumulation of units of impetus. But despite its revolutionary implications, Buridan did not use the concept of impetus to transform the science of mechanics. He was not, as Duhem argued, a forerunner of Galileo. He remained unapologetically Aristotelian in too many other respects, continuing to hold that motion and rest are contrary states of bodies and that the world is finite in extent. Buridan seems to have been a philosopher who, though well aware of the shortcomings of the Aristotelian natural philosophy, tried to reshape as much of it as he could in the face of a rapidly mechanizing worldview.[52] His revolution was in the details. The big, decisive break was left to his successors.

Buridan's account of motion is in keeping with his approach to natural science, which is empirical in the sense that it emphasizes the evidentness of appearances, the reliability of a posteriori modes of reasoning, and the application of naturalistic tropes or models of explanation (such as the concept of impetus) to a variety of phenomena. He is inclined to dismiss purely theological assumptions as irrelevant to the practice of philosophy, as we see in the following tongue-in-cheek remark: “one might assume that there are many more separate substances than there are celestial spheres and celestial motions, viz., great legions of angels [magnae legiones angelorum], but this cannot be proved by demonstrative arguments originating from sense perception” (QM II.9: 73ra).[53] But there are some theological considerations that must be taken seriously. He concedes that divine omnipotence is such that it is always possible for God to deceive us in ways we could never detect, although this is tempered by his confidence, for which he cites empirical evidence, that our ordinary powers of perception and inductive inference are sufficiently reliable to make “the comprehension of truth with certitude possible for us” (QM II.1: 9ra). He has little patience for skeptical arguments questioning the possibility of scientific knowledge, such as those he believed to have been advanced by Nicholas of Autrecourt, arguing that it is absurd to demand that all knowledge be demonstrable by reduction to the principle of non-contradiction. Natural science is about what happens for the most part, i.e., assuming the common course of nature. For the same reason, explanatory models in one special science can be usually applied to others in a way that enhances our understanding of the phenomena. Thus, the concept of impetus recurs in Buridan's psychology to explain the difference between occurrent and dispositional thinking, as well as in his ethics, to account for the relative ease with which virtuous persons are able to do the right thing (they have acquired, or cultivated within themselves, an impetus to act virtuously).

In psychology, the study of moving beings qua animate, Buridan changed the Aristotelian paradigm in important ways. In contrast with Thomas Aquinas, who wanted to attribute metaphysically more robust qualities, such as per se subsistence, to the human soul, Buridan does not think that psychology is in a position to reveal anything about the inherent nature of its subject, and so he refuses to speculate about it. He sees the science of psychology as concerned not with some quidditative concept of the soul arrived at by a priori reasoning, but with specifying the relation between animate qualities and the soul as their proper subject: “the natural philosopher only studies substances in relation to their motion and operations. And since natural forms require for their operations a determinate matter made suitable for them by qualitative and quantitative dispositions, natural scientists must define forms through their proper matter. Therefore, in its natural definition, the soul must be defined by means of a physical, organic body” (QDA II.3: 34). This led to an even more attenuated conception of the soul in the De anima commentaries of Buridan's Parisian successors, Nicole Oresme and Peter of Ailly, for whom the soul functions as a kind of placeholder whose nature is not even relevant to psychology. Consideration of the soul's ultimate nature migrated to the faculty of theology, where it was considered along with the same Augustinian dreaming arguments that undoubtedly influenced Descartes.[54]

Buridan's resolute naturalism is even more evident in his account of human knowledge. Here he is a representationalist, but mainly because he can find no evidence to support the contrary view, defended by both Duns Scotus and William of Ockham, that humans possess an intuitive mode of knowing that gives us a direct and unmediated awareness of the existence of some subject.[55] Buridan holds that cognition can occur only when the intellect apprehends an object by means of a particular species or concept representing it. How we use the concept in our act of apprehension determines whether we cognize singularly or universally: singularly, if its object appears to us “in the manner of something existing in the presence of the person cognizing it” universally, if we focus on certain features of the concept to the exclusion of others, such as when we cognize “all human beings indifferently” via the humanity that is in the concept of Socrates (QDA III.8: 79-80; QP I.7: 8va). How do we know whether our concept of Socrates is really a concept of Socrates? As noted above, Buridan tends to regard skeptical worries as tiresome and pedantic. Like most pre-Cartesian epistemologists (if it makes sense to use that term before Descartes), he is more interested in explaining the process by which we come to have knowledge than he is in justifying knowledge claims.

7. Ethics

Buridan's commentary on Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics is one of his most influential works, though it is today perhaps the least studied. It contains significant discussions of the structure of the will and its relation to the intellect, the nature of human freedom, the phenomenon of akrasia or weakness of will, practical reason, and the unity of the virtues.[56]

In moral psychology, Buridan appears to effect a compromise between two rival views on the relation between the will and the intellect: the intellectualist or naturalist tradition associated with Aristotle and Thomas Aquinas, according to which the will is always subordinate to the intellect, and the voluntarist tradition of Augustine and Franciscan thinkers such as Duns Scotus and William of Ockham, which held that the will is sometimes capable of autonomous activity. Buridan's apparent compromise is to argue (with the intellectualists) that human happiness ultimately consists in an intellectual act, “the perfect apprehension of God”, rather than in a volitional act such as perfectly willing or perfectly loving God (QNE X.5: 213rb), although he emphasizes (with the voluntarists) the role of the will as a self-determining power in achieving that end. The compromise turns on Buridan's innovative conception of free choice, which develops Albert the Great's notion that certainty admits of degrees.[57] The idea is that even if the will lacks the power to choose evil as such, it is still able to defer its choice and do nothing if the goodness of one of the alternatives presented to it is unclear or uncertain. Of course, given our poor epistemic position in this life, it almost always has this power because it is almost always possible in practice to doubt the goodness of a proposed course of action. The compromise is only apparent, however, because it turns out that the will's act of deferment is possible only if “the intellect would judge it to be good to consider the matter further” (QNE III.5: 44va).[58] This claim, together with his assumptions that the will can only choose non-optimally through ignorance or impediment (QNE III.3-5; 9), places deferment squarely under the jurisdiction of the intellect, which must weigh the relative goodness of different possible courses of action, including deferment. It is not the case that the will can choose to defer regardless of what the intellect decides, or that the will can choose to defer even if the intellect has judged deferment to be less good than some other course of action. Accordingly, if this is a compromise between the intellectualists and the voluntarists, it is a disingenuous one. It is more likely that Buridan simply appropriated voluntarist terminology to express what is otherwise a straightforwardly intellectualist account of the will, perhaps to dispel the cloud of heterodoxy which had surrounded intellectualist moral psychology since the Condemnation of 1277.[59]

It is also in Buridan's moral psychology that we find the most plausible explanation of the example that has come down to us known as ‘Buridan's Ass’, in which a donkey starves to death because it has no reason to choose between two equidistant and equally tempting piles of hay. This particular example is nowhere to be found in Buridan's writings, although there are versions of it going back at least to Aristotle (see De Caelo 295b32).[60] The best explanation of its association with Buridan is that it originated as a parody of his account of free choice by later critics, who found absurd the idea that the will's freedom could consist in inaction, i.e., in its ability to defer or ‘send back’ for further consideration any practical judgment that is not absolutely certain.


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insolubles [= insolubilia] | medieval philosophy | medieval philosophy: literary forms of | modality: medieval theories of | Nicholas of Autrecourt [de Altricuria, Autricuria, Ultricuria, Autricort] | Ockham [Occam], William | Peter of Spain [= Petrus Hispanus] | sophismata [= sophisms] | terms, properties of: medieval theories of | universals: the medieval problem of