Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

The Free Rider Problem

First published Wed May 21, 2003

In many contexts, all of the individual members of a group can benefit from the efforts of each member and all can benefit substantially from collective action. For example, if each of us pollutes less by paying a bit extra for our cars, we all benefit from the reduction of harmful gases in the air we breathe and even in the reduced harm to the ozone layer that protects us against exposure to carcinogenic ultraviolet radiation (although those with fair skin benefit far more from the latter than do those with dark skin). If all of us or some subgroup of us prefer the state of affairs in which we each pay this bit over the state of affairs in which we do not, then the provision of cleaner air is a collective good for us. (If it costs more than it is worth to us, then its provision is not a collective good for us.)

Unfortunately, my polluting less does not matter enough for anyone -- especially me -- to notice. Therefore, I may not contribute my share toward not fouling the atmosphere. I may be a freerider on the beneficial actions of others. This is a compelling instance of the logic of collective action, an instance of such grave import that we pass laws to regulate the behavior of individuals to force them to pollute less.

1. The Logic of Collective Action

The strategic structure of the logic of collective action is that of the n-prisoner's dilemma (Hardin 1971, 1982a). If n is 2 and the two members are able to coordinate on whether they act together, there can be no freerider unless one of the members is de facto altruistic. As represented in Game 1, prisoner's dilemma for two players is essentially the model of exchange (Hardin 1982b). Suppose that, in the status quo, I have a car and you have $5000 but that both of us would prefer to have what the other has. Of course, each of us would rather have the holdings of both of us: both the money and the car. The second best outcome for both of us would be for you to have my car in exchange for my having your money. The status quo is a worse state of affairs for both of us than that in which we succeed in exchanging. In the matrix, the outcomes are ordinally ranked from best (1) to worst (4) for each player. For example, the outcome (upper right cell) in which you yield the money and I keep the car is worst (4) for you as the Row player and best (1) for me as the Column player.

    Yield car Keep car
Row Yield $5000 2,2 4,1
Keep $5000 1,4 3,3

Game 1: Prisoner's Dilemma or Exchange

As an n-prisoner's dilemma for n >> 2, collective action is therefore essentially large-number exchange. Each of us exchanges a bit of effort or resources in return for benefiting from some collective provision. The signal difference is that I can cheat in the large-number exchange by freeriding on the contributions of others, whereas such cheating in the two-person case would commonly be illegal, because it would require my taking from you without giving you something you prefer in return.

In some collective provisions, each contribution makes the overall provision larger; in some, there is a tipping point at which one or a few more contributions secure the provision -- as is true, for example, in elections, in which a difference of two more votes out of a very large number can change defeat into victory. Even in the latter case, however, the expected value of each voter's contribution is the same ex ante; there is no particular voter whose vote tips the outcome. Let us, however, neglect the tipping cases and consider only those cases in which provision is, if not an exactly linear function of the number of individual contributions or of the amount of resources contributed, at least a generally increasing function and not a tipping or step function at any point. In such cases, if n is very large and you do not contribute to our collective effort, the rest of us might still benefit from providing our collective good, so that you benefit without contributing. You are then a freerider on the efforts of the rest of us.

Unfortunately, each and every one of us might have a positive incentive to try to freeride on the efforts of others. My contribution -- say, an hour's work or a hundred dollars -- might add substantially to the overall provision. But my personal share of the increase from my own contribution alone might be vanishingly small. In any case of interest, it is true that my benefit from having all of us, including myself, contribute is far greater than the status quo benefit of having no one contribute. Still, my benefit from my own contribution may be negligible. Therefore I and possibly every one of us have incentive not to contribute and to freeride on the contributions of others. If we all attempt to freeride, however, there is no provision and no ‘ride.’

The scope for freeriding can be enormous. Suppose our large group would benefit from providing ourselves some good at cost to each of us. It is likely to be true that some subgroup, perhaps much smaller than the whole group, would already benefit if even only its own members contribute toward the larger group's good. Suppose this is true for k << n. This k-subgroup now faces its own collective action problem, one that is perhaps complicated by the sense that the large number of freeriders are getting away with something unfairly. If one person in an exchange tried to freeride, the other person would most likely refuse to go along and the attempted freeride would fail. But if n - k members of our group attempt to freeride, the rest of us cannot punish the freeriders by refusing to go along without harming our own interests.

1.1 History

The freerider problem and the logic of collective action have been recognized in specific contexts for millennia. Arguably, Glaucon in Plato's Republic (bk. 2, 360b‑c) sees the logic in his argument against obedience to the law if only one can escape sanction for violations. First-time readers of Plato are often astonished that dear old Socrates seems not to get the logic but insists that it is our interest to obey the law independently of the incentive of its sanctions.

Adam Smith's argument for the invisible hand that keeps sellers competitive rather than in collusion is a fundamentally important and benign -- indeed, beneficial -- instance of the logic of collective action. He says that each producer “intends only his own gain, and he is in this, as in many other cases, led by an invisible hand to promote an end which was no part of his intention. Nor is it always the worse for the society that it was no part of [the individual's intended end]. By pursuing his own interest he frequently promotes that of society more effectually than when he really intends to promote it” (Smith [1776] 1976, bk. 4, chap. 2, p. 456). The back of the invisible hand swats down efforts at price collusion, thereby pushing producers to be innovative.

David Hume grasps the generality of the problem clearly. He says:

Two neighbours may agree to drain a meadow, which they possess in common; because ‘tis easy for them to know each other's mind; and each must perceive, that the immediate consequence of his failing in his part, is, the abandoning the whole project. But ‘tis very difficult, and indeed impossible, that a thousand persons shou'd agree in any such action; it being difficult for them to concert so complicated a design, and still more difficult for them to execute it; while each seeks a pretext to free himself of the trouble and expence, and wou'd lay the whole burden on others. (Hume [1739-40] 1978, bk. 3, part 2, sect. 8, p. 538).

John Stuart Mill ([1848] 1965, book 5, chap. 11, sect. 12) expresses the logic very clearly in his defense of laws to require maximum hours of work. He supposes that all workers would be better off if the workday were reduced from, say ten to nine hours a day for all, but that every individual worker would be better off working the extra hour if most others do not. The only way for them to benefit from the shorter workday, therefore, would be to make it illegal to work longer than nine hours a day.

Vilfredo Pareto stated the logic fully and for the general case:

If all individuals refrained from doing A, every individual as a member of the community would derive a certain advantage. But now if all individuals less one continue refraining from doing A, the community loss is very slight, whereas the one individual doing A makes a personal gain far greater than the loss that he incurs as a member of the community. (Pareto 1935, vol. 3, sect. 1496, pp. 946-7)

Pareto's argument is framed for the negative case, such as the example of pollution above, but it fits positive provisions as well. Unfortunately, his argument is buried in a large four-volume magnum opus that is a rambling discussion of many and varied topics, and it seems to have had little or no influence on further discussion.

Finally, the logic of collective action has long been generalized in a loose way in the notion of the freerider problem. And it is captured in the popular slogan, “Let George do it,” in which George typically stands in for the rest of the world.

Despite such frequent and widespread recognition of the logic, it was finally generalized analytically by Mancur Olson only in 1965 in his Logic of Collective Action. The odd mismatch of individual incentives and what may loosely be called collective interests is the independent discovery of two game theorists who invented the prisoner's dilemma for two persons (see Hardin 1982a, 24-5) and of various philosophers and social theorists who have noted the logic of collective action in various contexts. In Olson's account, what had been a fairly minor issue for economists became a central issue for political scientists and social theorists more generally. From early in the twentieth century, a common view of collective action in pluralist group politics was that policy on any issue must be, roughly, a vector sum of the forces of all of the groups interested in the issue (Bentley 1908). In this standard vision, one could simply count the number of those interested in an issue, weight them by their intensity and the direction they want policy to take, and sum the result geometrically to say what the policy must be. Olson's analysis abruptly ended this long tradition; and group theory in politics took on, as the central task, trying to understand why some groups organize and others do not.

Among the major casualties of Olson's revision of our views of groups is Karl Marx's analysis of class conflict. Although many scholars still elaborate and defend Marx's vision, others now reject it as failing to recognize the contrary incentives that members of the working class face. (Oddly, Marx himself arguably saw the cross-cutting -- individual vs. group -- incentives of capitalists, the other major group in his account.) This problem had long been recognized in the thesis of the embourgeoisement of the working class: Once workers prosper enough to buy homes and to benefit in other ways from the current level of economic development, they may have so much to lose from revolutionary class action that they cease to be potential revolutionaries.

In essence, the theories that Olson's argument demolished were all grounded in a fallacy of composition. We commit this fallacy whenever we suppose the characteristics of a group or set are the characteristics of the members of the group or set or vice versa. In the theories that fail Olson's test the fact that it would be in the collective interest of some group to have a particular result, even counting the costs of providing the result, is turned into the assumption that it would be in the interest of each individual in the group to bear the individual costs of contributing to the group's collective provision. If the group has an interest in contributing to provision of its good, then individual members are (sometimes wrongly) assumed to have an interest in contributing. Sometimes, this assumption is merely shorthand for the recognition that all the members of a group are of the same mind on some issue. For example, a group of anti-war marchers are of one mind with respect to the issue that gets them marching. There might be many who are along for the entertainment, to join a friend or spouse, or even to spy on the marchers, but the modal motivation of the individuals in the group might well be the motivation summarily attributed to the group. But very often the move from individual to group intentions or vice versa is wrong.

This fallacious move between individual and group motivations and interests pervades and vitiates much of social theory since at least Aristotle's opening sentence in the Politics. He says,

We see that every city-state is a community of some sort, and that every community is established for the sake of some good (for everyone performs every action for the sake of what he takes to be good). (Aristotle 1998, Politics, book 1, chap. 1, p. 1)

Even if we grant his parenthetical characterization of individual reasons for action, it does not follow that the collective creation of a city-state is grounded in the same motivations, or in any collective motivation at all. Most likely, any actual city-state is the product in large part of unintended consequences.

Argument from the fallacy of composition seems to be very appealing even though completely wrong. Systematically rejecting the fallacy of composition in social theory, perhaps especially in normative theory, has required several centuries, and invocation of the fallacy is still pervasive.

2. Public Goods

Olson based his analysis on Paul Samuelson's theory of public goods. Samuelson (1954) noted that some goods, once they are made available to one person, can be consumed by others at no additional marginal cost; this condition is commonly called jointness of supply or nonrivalness of consumption, because your consumption of the good does not affect mine, as your eating a lovely dinner would block my eating it. Therefore, in standard price theory, in which price tends to equate to marginal cost, such goods should have a zero price. But if they are priced at zero, they will generally not be provided. In essence, price theory commends freeriding on the provision of such goods. This might sound like merely a cute logical problem; but standard examples include radio broadcasts, national defense, and clean air. If any of these is provided for anyone, they are de facto provided for everyone in the relevant area or group.

There is a second feature of Samuelson's public goods that would make them problematic in practice: the impossibility of exclusion. Once supplied at all, it is supposedly impossible to exclude anyone from the consumption of a public good. It is often noted that this feature is analytically interesting but empirically often beside the point. States often forcibly exclude people from enjoying such public goods as radio broadcasts. Others can be provided through the use of various devices that enable providers to charge the beneficiaries and to exclude those who do not pay, as for example, by advertising that imposes a cost on television viewers or the use of cable rather than broadcasting over the air to provide television programming at a substantial price. Exclusion is merely a problem of technology, not of logic. With present technology, however, it may be too expensive to exclude many people and we may therefore want the state to provide many goods so that we can avoid the costs of exclusion.

There are some compelling cases of goods that are both joint in supply and nonexcludable. National defense that protects cities against attack from abroad, for example, is for all practical purposes a good with both these features. But the full logic of public goods is of little practical interest for many important contexts. Indeed, what are often practically and politically interesting are goods that are in fact provided collectively, independently of whether they have either of the defining features of public goods. We can even provide purely private consumptions through collective choice. For example, most welfare programs transfer ordinary private consumption goods or resources for obtaining these. Although technically these are not public goods in Samuelson's sense, we can refer to them as collective goods and we can treat provision of them as essentially problems of collective action.

Olson notes that very many politically provided goods, such as highways and public safety, roughly have the qualities of Samuelson's public goods and therefore face the problem of freeriding that undercuts supply of the goods. Note that the supply of such goods by the state overcomes the freerider problem because voters can vote on whether everyone is required to pay toward the provision, as in the case of national defense. If I am voting whether the good is to be provided, I cannot freeride and I need not worry that anyone else can either. We can all vote our overall preferences between supply at the relevant individual cost versus no supply and no cost of provision, so that democratic choice turns our problem into a simple coordination -- if we are all in agreement that a relevant good should be collectively provided.

From the analysis of the de facto logic of collective action that would block the spontaneous provision of many fundamentally important classes of collective goods we can go on to argue for what is now often called the public-goods theory of the state (Baumol 1952, 90-93; more generally see Hardin 1997). The public-goods account gives us a clear normative justification of the state in welfarist terms: The state resolves many centrally important and potentially pervasive freerider problems. It does not give us an explanatory account of the origins of the state, although it could arguably contribute to the explanation of the maintenance of a state once it exists. It might do so through support for the state's collective provisions and, therefore, support for the state. Unfortunately, as libertarians are quick to note, giving the state power to resolve certain freerider problems also gives it the power to do many other things that could not be justified with similar normative arguments.

3. Self-Interest Theory

The modern view of the fallacy of composition in social choice is a product of the understanding of politics as self-interested. That understanding begins partially with Niccolò Machiavelli, who advised the prince to act from his own self-interest. A century later, Hobbes did not bother to advise acting from self-interest because he supposed virtually everyone naturally does so. From that assumption, he went on to give us the first modern political theory of the state, an explanatory political theory that is not merely a handbook for the prince and that is not grounded in normative assumptions of religious commitment. To some extent, therefore, one could credit Hobbes with the invention of social science and of explanatory, as opposed to hortatory, political theory.

Hobbes's argument for the state is an argument from mutual advantage. We all benefit if there is a powerful state in place to regulate behavior, thereby enabling us to invest efforts in producing things to make our lives better and to enable us to exchange with each other without fear that others will wreck our efforts. Some scholars see this resolution as a matter of mutual cooperation in a grand prisoner's dilemma. This is strategically or game theoretically wrong because putting a state in place is a matter of coordination on one or another sovereign, not a matter of exchange among us or between us and the sovereign. Once that state is in place, it might be true that I would rather freeride on the better behavior of my fellow citizens, who are generally law-abiding. But I generally cannot succeed in doing so, because there is police power to coerce me if necessary.

What I cannot freeride on is the creation of a state. I want the state, just as everyone who sees it as mutually advantageous wants it. Suppose that somehow, perhaps using the ring of Gyges to make me invisible as Glaucon proposed, I could get away with theft or other crimes. Even then, I would still want the state to have the power to coerce people into order because if they are not orderly, they will produce nothing for me to steal. If it is true, as Hobbes supposes, that having a state is mutually advantageous, it follows that we all want it; and none of us can freeride on whether there is a state. Either there is one or there is not, and if there is one, then I am potentially subject to its powers of legal coercion. On balance, I would want there to be an effective state for the protections it gives me against others despite its potential for coercing me into good behavior.

When we vote on a policy, as discussed above, we de facto change our problem from a collective-action prisoner's dilemma into a simple coordination problem by ruling out individual idiosyncrasies in our choices. We have only collective choice: provision for all or provision for none. Although the state is itself not the resolution of a giant prisoner's dilemma or collective action, as is sometimes supposed, it can be used to resolve prisoner's dilemma interactions. Suppose you and I both want cleaner air but that each of us would freeride on the efforts of others to clean the air. State policy can block freeriding, if necessary at metaphorical gunpoint. We both prefer the general effort to provide cleaner air and we both pay our share toward the cost of providing it.

4. Explaining Collective Action

The facts that there is a lot of collective action even in many large-number contexts in which the individuals do not have rich relationships with each other and that, therefore, many people are not freeriding in relevant contexts suggest at least three possibilities. First, there are ways to affect the incentives of group members to make it their interest to contribute. Second, motivations other than self-interest may be in play. Third, the actors in the seemingly successful collective actions fail to understand their own interests. Each of these possibilities is important and interesting, and the latter two are philosophically interesting. Each is also supported by extensive empirical evidence.

In the first category are the by-product theory proposed by Olson and the possibility that political entrepreneurs, at least partially acting in their own interest, can engineer provisions. In the by-product theory, I might contribute to my group's effort because the group ties my contribution to provision of some private good that I want, such as participation in the Sierra Club's outdoor activities or, in the early days of unions, low-cost group-insurance benefits not available in the market. Such private goods can commonly be provided in the market, so that their usefulness may eventually be undercut. Indeed, firms that provide insurance benefits to their employees thereby undercut one of the appeals of union membership. The general decline of American unions in recent decades is partially the result of their success in resolving problems for workers in ways that do not require continuing union effort.

When collective goods can be supplied by government or some other agency, political entrepreneurs might organize the provision. For example, Senator Howard Metzenbaum worked to get legislation on behalf of the poor and of unions, although he was certainly not poor and was not himself a working member of a union. Yet he benefited from his efforts in support of these groups if they voted to keep him in office. Because there is government, collective action of many kinds is far more likely than we might expect from the dismal logic of collective action.

Turn now to the assumption of self-interest. In generalizing from the motive of self-interest to the explanation and even justification of actions and institutions, Hobbes wished to reduce political theory to an analog of geometry or physics, so that it would be a deductive science. All of the statements of the logic of collective action above are grounded in an assumption of the self-interested incentives of the actors. When the number of members of a group that would benefit from collective action is small enough, we might expect cooperation that results from extensive interaction, mutual monitoring, and even commitments to each other that trump or block narrowly self-interested actions. But when the group is very large, freeriding is often clearly in the interest of most and perhaps all members.

Against the assumption of purely self-interested behavior, we know that there are many active, more or less well funded groups that seek collective results that serve interests other than those of their own members. For a trivial example, none of the hundreds of people who have been members of the American League to Abolish Capital Punishment is likely to have had a personal stake in whether there is a death penalty (Schattschneider 1960, 26). In our time, thousands of people are evidently willing to die for their causes (and not simply to risk dying -- we already do that when we merely drive to a restaurant for dinner). Perhaps some of these people act from a belief that they will receive an eternal reward for their actions, so that their actions are consistent with their interests.

Finally turn to the possible role of misunderstanding in leading people to act for collective provisions. Despite the fact that people regularly grasp the incentive to freeride on the efforts of others in many contexts, it is also true that the logic of collective action is hard to grasp in the abstract. The cursory history above suggests just how hard it was to come to a general understanding of the problem. Today, there are thousands of social scientists and philosophers who do understand it and maybe far more who still do not. But in the general population, few people grasp it. Those who teach these issues regularly discover that some students insist that the logic is wrong, that it is, for example, in the interest of workers to pay dues voluntarily to unions or that it is in one's interest to vote. If the latter is true, then about half of voting-age Americans evidently act against their own interests every quadrennial election year. It would be extremely difficult to assess how large is the role of misunderstanding in the reasons for action in general because those who do not understand the issues cannot usefully be asked whether they do understand. But the evidence of misunderstanding and ignorance is extensive (Hardin 2002).

5. Democracy

The logic of collective action has become one of the richest areas of research and theory in rational choice theory in the social sciences and philosophy. Much of that literature focuses on the explanation of varied social actions and outcomes, including spontaneous actions, social norms, and large institutions. One of its main areas is efforts to explain behavior in elections. In general, voting seems clearly to be a case of collective action for the mutual benefit of all those who support a particular candidate or whose interests would be furthered by that candidate's election. If voting entails costs to individuals whereas the benefit from voting is essentially a collective benefit only very weakly dependent on any individual's vote, individuals may find it in their interest not to vote (Downs 1957). When the number of voters on one side of an election is in the tens of millions, no individual's vote is likely to matter at all. Even though it is not narrowly in their own individual interest to do so if there are any costs to be borne in going to the polls to vote and in learning enough about various candidates to know which ones would further a voter's interests, millions of people vote. This is one of the most notorious failures of the rational choice literature. A standard response to the phenomenon of massive voting is to note how cheap the action is and how much public effort is expended in exhorting citizens to vote. But it seems likely that much of the voting we see is normatively motivated.

Both the voting that does happen and the non-voting or freeriding that accompanies it as well as the level of ignorance of voters call simple normative theories or views of democracy into question. “The will of the people” is a notoriously hallowed phrase that is vitiated by logical fallacy and that is generally meaningless as a supposed characterization of democracy, in which decisions are majoritarian and not unanimous (Kant [1796] 1970, 101; Maitland [1875] 2000, 101-112). It might on rare occasion be true that the people are in virtually unanimous agreement on some important policy so that they share the same will on that issue. But generally, there is a diversity of views and even deep conflict over significant policies in modern pluralist democracies. In large societies, democracy is invariably representative democracy except on issues that are put to direct popular vote in referendums. Even this term, “representative,” is gutted by logical fallacy. My representative on some governmental body is apt to work on behalf of my interests some of the time and against them some of the time. Even those for whom I vote often work against my interests; and if they should be said to represent me, they often do a very bad job of it.

Note that, as mentioned earlier, the election of a candidate is a good whose provision is a step function of the number of votes. If there are n votes cast, then half of n - 1 votes spells defeat and half of n + 1 spells victory. If, as Mayor Daley did with the Chicago votes in the US presidential election of 1960, I could withhold my vote until all others have been counted, my vote might actually tip the result to victory for my candidate. In actual fact, the typical voter casts a vote in a state of ignorance about the final count. I might readily expect the margin to be very large or I might expect it to be very narrow. But I am unlikely to expect it to be tied, so that my own vote would be decisive. Hence, although the actual provision is a step function, my vote or my freeriding must be based on some sense of the expected effect of my vote, and that must generally be minuscule for any election in a large electorate. With extremely high probability, my vote is likely to have no effect.

6. Freeriding and Morality

The fact that people do organize for collective purposes is often taken to imply the normative goodness of what they seek. If the by-product theory is correct, however, this conclusion is called into question. For example, we might join a union merely to obtain insurance at the inexpensive group rate even though we vote against all its strike proposals, would never join a picket line, and might even be hostile to the idea of unions. Or we might go to a political demonstration for varied reasons other than agreement with the ostensible object of the demonstration; for example pro-war proponents might join in a peace march on a glorious day to hear performances by outstanding singers in a large public park -- something they might happily have paid to do.

Also, freeriding on the provision of a collective good is often characterized as morally wrong. H.L.A. Hart (1955, 185-6) says that, if others are cooperating for mutual benefit and I benefit from their cooperation, then I have an obligation to do my share. John Rawls ([1971] 1999, 96) cites this argument favorably. Robert Nozick (1974, 90-95) dismisses the claim, as would anyone who thinks with Hume that we cannot deduce an ought from an is (Hume [1739-40] 1978, book 3, part 1, sect. 1, p. 469). Nozick notes that Hart's position would entail the possibility that others could impose an obligation on me merely by their acting cooperatively to provide some good from which I also benefit. One might conclude that freeriding in some instance is wrong, but this cannot follow merely from the fact that it is freeriding, as Hart and Rawls wrongly presume. Rawls ([1971] 1999, 98) also says that, unlike public officials who have taken an oath, citizens have no obligation to obey the government, although they surely can benefit substantially from its actions. This view seems to be consistent with his reading of Hart.

Some people insist, of course, that we have a moral duty to vote, although it is extremely difficult to ground that duty in any more basic and compelling set of principles. People sometimes even argue from a loose generalization argument, and ask, “What if everybody failed to vote?” or, in the language here, “What if everybody chose to freeride on the voting of others?” The practical answer to that question, of course, is that everybody does not choose to freeride, only some do, and that it is exceedingly unlikely that everyone will choose to do so. But if I think almost no one else will vote, I should probably conclude that it is therefore then in my interest to vote (that day has yet to come). Perhaps there is some number of citizens, k, such that, if fewer than k citizens vote, democracy will fail. If so, half of all citizens seems likely to be a number significantly greater than k. Local elections in the US often turn out far less than half the eligible citizens and presidential elections turn out a bit more than half. One may question just what kind of democracy the US has, but it seems in some significant ways to work.

The generalization argument here is a variant of the fallacy of composition and it is logically specious in its presumed implication. Yet many people assert such an argument in collective action contexts, and they may very well be motivated by the apparent moral authority of the argument. An alternative question here would be something like: “What if everybody failed to take into account the effect of their own vote on the election?” The answer is that roughly half of Americans may well fail to take into account the effect of their own votes on elections, and they vote. The rest ride free.


Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Related Entries

game theory | prisoner's dilemma