# Game Theory

*First published Sat Jan 25, 1997; substantive revision Fri Mar 10, 2006*

Game theory is the study of the ways in which *strategic
interactions* among *rational players* produce
*outcomes* with respect to the *preferences* (or
*utilities*) of those players, none of which might have been
intended by any of them. The meaning of this statement will not be
clear to the non-expert until each of the italicized words and phrases
has been explained and featured in some examples. Doing this will be
the main business of this article. First, however, we provide some
historical and philosophical context in order to motivate the reader
for all of this technical work ahead.

- 1. Philosophical and Historical Motivation
- 2. Basic Elements and Assumptions of Game Theory
- 2.1 Utility
- 2.2 Games and Information
- 2.3 Trees and Matrices
- 2.4 The Prisoner's Dilemma as an Example of Strategic-Form vs. Extensive-Form Representation
- 2.5 Solution Concepts and Equilibria
- 2.6 Modular Rationality and Subgame Perfection
- 2.7 On Interpreting Payoffs: Morality and Efficiency in Games
- 2.8 Trembling Hands

- 3. Uncertainty, Risk and Sequential Equilibria
- 4. Repeated Games and Coordination
- 5. Commitment
- 6. Evolutionary Game Theory
- 7. Game Theory and Behavioral Evidence
- Bibliography
- Other Internet Resources
- Related Entries

## 1. Philosophical and Historical Motivation

The mathematical theory of games was invented by John von Neumann and Oskar Morgenstern (1944). For reasons to be discussed later, limitations in their mathematical framework initially made the theory applicable only under special and limited conditions. This situation has gradually changed, in ways we will examine as we go along, over the past six decades, as the framework was deepened and generalized. Refinements are still being made, and we will review a few outstanding philosophical problems that lie along the advancing front edge of these developments towards the end of the article. However, since at least the late 1970s it has been possible to say with confidence that game theory is the most important and useful tool in the analyst's kit whenever she confronts situations in which what counts as one agent's best action (for her) depends on expectations about what one or more other agents will do, and what counts as their best actions (for them) similarly depend on expectations about her.

Despite the fact that game theory has been rendered mathematically and
logically systematic only recently, however, game-theoretic insights
can be found among philosophers and political commentators going back
to ancient times. For example, in two of Plato's texts, the
*Laches* and the *Symposium*, Socrates recalls an
episode from the Battle of Delium that involved the following
situation. Consider a soldier at the front, waiting with his comrades
to repulse an enemy attack. It may occur to him that if the defense is
likely to be successful, then it isn't very probable that his own
personal contribution will be essential. But if he stays, he runs the
risk of being killed or wounded—apparently for no point. On the
other hand, if the enemy is going to win the battle, then his chances
of death or injury are higher still, and now quite clearly to no
point, since the line will be overwhelmed anyway. Based on this
reasoning, it would appear that the soldier is better off running away
regardless of who is going to win the battle. Of course, if all of the
soldiers reason this way—as they all apparently *should*,
since they're all in identical situations—then this will
certainly *bring about* the outcome in which the battle is
lost. Of course, this point, since it has occurred to us as analysts,
can occur to the soldiers too. Does this give them a reason for
staying at their posts? Just the contrary: the greater the soldiers'
fear that the battle will be lost, the greater their incentive to get
themselves out of harm's way. And the greater the soldiers' belief
that the battle will be won, without the need of any particular
individual's contributions, the less reason they have to stay and
fight. If each soldier *anticipates* this sort of reasoning on
the part of the others, all will quickly reason themselves into a
panic, and their horrified commander will have a rout on his hands
before the enemy has even fired a shot.

Long before game theory had come along to show people how to think about this sort of problem systematically, it had occurred to some actual military leaders and influenced their strategies. Thus the Spanish conqueror Cortez, when landing in Mexico with a small force who had good reason to fear their capacity to repel attack from the far more numerous Aztecs, removed the risk that his troops might think their way into a retreat by burning the ships on which they had landed. With retreat having thus been rendered physically impossible, the Spanish soldiers had no better course of action but to stand and fight—and, furthermore, to fight with as much determination as they could muster. Better still, from Cortez's point of view, his action had a discouraging effect on the motivation of the Aztecs. He took care to burn his ships very visibly, so that the Aztecs would be sure to see what he had done. They then reasoned as follows: Any commander who could be so confident as to willfully destroy his own option to be prudent if the battle went badly for him must have good reasons for such extreme optimism. It cannot be wise to attack an opponent who has a good reason (whatever, exactly, it might be) for being sure that he can't lose. The Aztecs therefore retreated into the surrounding hills, and Cortez had his victory bloodlessly.

These situations as recalled by Plato and as vividly acted upon by
Cortez have a common and interesting underlying logic. Notice that the
soldiers are not motivated to retreat *just*, or even mainly,
by their rational assessment of the dangers of battle and by their
self-interest. Rather, they discover a sound reason to run away by
realizing that what it makes sense for them to do depends on what it
will make sense for others to do, and that all of the others can
notice this too. Even a quite brave soldier may prefer to run rather
than heroically, but pointlessly, die trying to stem the oncoming tide
all by himself. Thus we could imagine, without contradiction, a
circumstance in which an army, all of whose members are brave, flees
at top speed before the enemy makes a move. If the soldiers really
*are* brave, then this surely isn't the outcome any of them
wanted; each would have preferred that all stand and fight. What we
have here, then, is a case in which the *interaction* of many
individually rational decision-making processes—one process per
soldier—produces an outcome intended by no one. (Most armies try
to avoid this problem just as Cortez did. Since they can't usually
make retreat *physically* impossible, they make it
*economically* impossible: they shoot deserters. Then standing
and fighting is each soldier's individually rational course of action
after all, because the cost of running is sure to be at least as high
as the cost of staying.)

Another classic source that invites this sequence of reasoning is
found in Shakespeare's *Henry V*. During the Battle of
Agincourt Henry decided to slaughter his French prisoners, in full
view of the enemy and to the surprise of his subordinates, who
describe the action as being out of moral character. The reasons Henry
gives allude to parametric considerations: he is afraid that the
prisoners may free themselves and threaten his position. However, a
game theorist might have furnished him with supplementary strategic
(and similarly prudential, though perhaps not moral)
justification. His own troops observe that the prisoners have been
killed, and observe that the enemy has observed this. Therefore, they
know what fate will await them at the enemy's hand if they don't
win. Metaphorically, but very effectively, their boats have been
burnt. The slaughter of the prisoners plausibly sent a signal to the
soldiers of both sides, thereby changing their incentives in ways that
favoured English prospects for victory.

These examples might seem to be relevant only for those who find
themselves in sordid situations of cut-throat competition. Perhaps, one
might think, it is important for generals, politicians, businesspeople
and others whose jobs involve manipulation of others, but the
philosopher should only deplore its horrid morality. Such a conclusion
would be highly premature, however. The study of the *logic*
that governs the interrelationships amongst incentives, strategic
interactions and outcomes has been fundamental in modern political
philosophy, since centuries before anyone had an explicit name for this
sort of logic.

Hobbes's *Leviathan* is often regarded as the founding work
in modern political philosophy, the text that began the continuing
round of analyses of the function and justification of the state and
its restrictions on individual liberties. The core of Hobbes's
reasoning can be given quite straightforwardly as follows. The best
situation for all people is one in which each is free to do as she
pleases. Often, such free people will wish to cooperate with one
another in order to carry out projects that would be impossible for an
individual acting alone. But if there are any immoral or amoral agents
around, they will notice that their interests are best served by
getting the benefits from cooperation and not returning them. Suppose,
for example, that you agree to help me build my house in return for my
promise to help you build yours. After my house is finished, I can make
your labour free to me simply by reneging on my promise. I then
realize, however, that if this leaves you with no house, you will have
an incentive to take mine. This will put me in constant fear of you,
and force me to spend valuable time and resources guarding myself
against you. I can best minimize these costs by striking first and
killing you at the first opportunity. Of course, you can anticipate all
of this reasoning by me, and so have good reason to try to beat me to
the punch. Since I can anticipate *this* reasoning by
*you*, my original fear of you was not paranoid; nor was yours
of me. In fact, neither of us actually needs to be immoral to get this
chain of mutual reasoning going; we need only think that there is some
*possibility* that the other might try to cheat on bargains.
Once a small wedge of doubt enters any one mind, the incentive induced
by fear of the consequences of being *preempted*—hit before
hitting first—quickly becomes overwhelming on both sides. If either
of us has any resources of our own that the other might want, this
murderous logic will take hold long before we are so silly as to
imagine that we could ever actually get so far as making deals to help
one another build houses in the first place. Left to their own devices,
rational agents will never derive the benefits of cooperation, and will
instead live from the outset in a state of ‘war of all against
all’, in Hobbes's words. In these circumstances, all human life,
as he vividly and famously put it, will be "solitary, poor, nasty,
brutish and short."

Hobbes's proposed solution to this problem was tyranny. The people can hire an agent—a government—whose job is to punish anyone who breaks any promise. So long as the threatened punishment is sufficiently dire—Hobbes thought decapitation generally appropriate—then the cost of reneging on promises will exceed the cost of keeping them. The logic here is identical to that used by an army when it threatens to shoot deserters. If all people know that these incentives hold for most others, then cooperation will not only be possible, but will be the expected norm, and the war of all against all becomes a general peace.

Hobbes pushes the logic of this argument to a very strong
conclusion, arguing that it implies not only a government with the
right and the power to enforce cooperation, but an
‘undivided’ government in which the arbitrary will of a
single ruler must impose absolute obligation on all. Few contemporary
political theorists think that the particular steps by which Hobbes
reasons his way to this conclusion are both sound and valid. Working
through these issues here, however, would carry us away from our topic
into complex details of contractarian political philosophy. What is
important in the present context is that these details, as they are in
fact pursued in the contemporary debates, all involve sophisticated
interpretation of the issues using the resources of modern game theory.
Furthermore, Hobbes's most basic point, that the fundamental
justification for the coercive authority and practices of governments
is peoples' own need to protect themselves from what game theorists
call ‘social dilemmas’, is accepted by many, if not most,
political theorists. Notice that Hobbes has *not* argued that
tyranny is a desirable thing in itself. The structure of his argument
is that the logic of strategic interaction leaves only two general
political outcomes possible: tyranny and anarchy. Rational agents then
choose tyranny as the lesser of two evils.

The reasoning of Cortez, of Henry V and of Hobbes's political agents
has a common logic, one derived from their situations. In each case,
the aspect of the environment that is most important to the agents'
achievement of their preferred outcomes is the set of expectations and
possible reactions to their strategies by other agents. The distinction
between acting *parametrically* on a passive world and acting
*non-parametrically* on a world that tries to act in
anticipation of these actions is fundamental. If you wish to kick a
rock down a hill, you need only concern yourself with the rock's mass
relative to the force of your blow, the extent to which it is bonded
with its supporting surface, the slope of the ground on the other side
of the rock, and the expected impact of the collision on your foot. The
values of all of these variables are independent of your plans and
intentions, since the rock has no interests of its own and takes no
actions to attempt to assist or thwart you. By contrast, if you wish to
kick a person down the hill, then unless that person is unconscious,
bound or otherwise incapacitated, you will likely not succeed unless
you can disguise your plans until it's too late for him to take either
evasive or forestalling action. The logical issues associated with the
second sort of situation are typically much more complicated, as a
simple hypothetical example will illustrate.

Suppose first that you wish to cross a river that is spanned by three bridges. (Assume that swimming, wading or boating across are impossible.) The first bridge is known to be safe and free of obstacles; if you try to cross there, you will succeed. The second bridge lies beneath a cliff from which large rocks sometimes fall. The third is inhabited by deadly cobras. Now suppose you wish to rank-order the three bridges with respect to their preferability as crossing-points. Your task here is quite straightforward. The first bridge is obviously best, since it is safest. To rank-order the other two bridges, you require information about their relative levels of danger. If you can study the frequency of rock-falls and the movements of the cobras for awhile, you might be able to calculate that the probability of your being crushed by a rock at the second bridge is 10% and of being struck by a cobra at the third bridge is 20%. Your reasoning here is strictly parametric because neither the rocks nor the cobras are trying to influence your actions, by, for example, concealing their typical patterns of behaviour because they know you are studying them. It is quite obvious what you should do here: cross at the safe bridge. Now let us complicate the situation a bit. Suppose that the bridge with the rocks was immediately before you, while the safe bridge was a day's difficult hike upstream. Your decision-making situation here is slightly more complicated, but it is still strictly parametric. You would have to decide whether the cost of the long hike was worth exchanging for the penalty of a 10% chance of being hit by a rock. However, this is all you must decide, and your probability of a successful crossing is entirely up to you; the environment is not interested in your plans.

However, if we now complicate the situation in the direction of non-parametricity, it becomes much more puzzling. Suppose that you are a fugitive of some sort, and waiting on the other side of the river with a gun is your pursuer. She will catch and shoot you, let us suppose, only if she waits at the bridge you try to cross; otherwise, you will escape. As you reason through your choice of bridge, it occurs to you that she is over there trying to anticipate your reasoning. It will seem that, surely, choosing the safe bridge straight away would be a mistake, since that is just where she will expect you, and your chances of death rise to certainty. So perhaps you should risk the rocks, since these odds are much better. But wait … if you can reach this conclusion, your pursuer, who is just as rational and well-informed as you are, can anticipate that you will reach it, and will be waiting for you if you evade the rocks. So perhaps you must take your chances with the cobras; that is what she must least expect. But, then, no … if she expects that you will expect that she will least expect this, then she will most expect it. This dilemma, you realize with dread, is general: you must do what your pursuer least expects; but whatever you most expect her to least expect is automatically what she will most expect. You appear to be trapped in indecision. All that might console you a bit here is that, on the other side of the river, your pursuer is trapped in exactly the same quandary, unable to decide which bridge to wait at because as soon as she imagines committing to one, she will notice that if she can find a best reason to pick a bridge, you can anticipate that same reason and then avoid her.

We know from experience that, in situations such as this, people do
not usually stand and dither in circles forever. As we'll see later,
there *is* a rational solution—that is, a best rational
action—available to both players. However, until the 1940s
neither philosophers nor economists knew how to find it
mathematically. As a result, economists were forced to treat
non-parametric influences as if they were complications on parametric
ones. This is likely to strike the reader as odd, since, as our
example of the bridge-crossing problem was meant to show,
non-parametric features are often fundamental features of
decision-making problems. Part of the explanation for game theory's
relatively late entry into the field lies in the problems with which
economists had historically been concerned. Classical economists, such
as Adam Smith and David Ricardo, were mainly interested in the
question of how agents in very large markets—whole
nations—could interact so as to bring about maximum monetary
wealth for themselves. Smith's basic insight, that efficiency is best
maximized by agents freely seeking mutually advantageous bargains, was
mathematically verified in the twentieth century. However, the
demonstration of this fact applies only in conditions of
‘perfect competition,’ that is, when firms face no costs
of entry or exit into markets, when there are no economies of scale,
and when no agents' actions have unintended side-effects on other
agents' well-being. Economists always recognized that this set of
assumptions is purely an idealization for purposes of analysis, not a
possible state of affairs anyone could try (or should want to try) to
attain. But until the mathematics of game theory matured near the end
of the 1970s, economists had to hope that the more closely a market
*approximates* perfect competition, the more efficient it will
be. No such hope, however, can be mathematically or logically
justified in general; indeed, as a strict generalization the
assumption can be shown to be false.

This article is not about the foundations of economics, but it is important for understanding the origins and scope of game theory to know that perfectly competitive markets have built into them a feature that renders them susceptible to parametric analysis. Because agents face no entry costs to markets, they will open shop in any given market until competition drives all profits to zero. This implies that if costs and demand are fixed, then agents have no options about how much to produce if they are trying to maximize the differences between their costs and their revenues. These production levels can be determined separately for each agent, so none need pay attention to what the others are doing; each agent treats her counterparts as passive features of the environment. The other kind of situation to which classical economic analysis can be applied without recourse to game theory is that of monopoly. Here, quite obviously, non-parametric considerations drop out, since there is only one agent under study. However, both perfect and monopolistic competition are very special and unusual market arrangements. Prior to the advent of game theory, therefore, economists were severely limited in the class of circumstances to which they could neatly apply their models.

Philosophers share with economists a professional interest in the
conditions and techniques for the maximization of human welfare. In
addition, philosophers have a special concern with the logical
justification of actions, and often actions must be justified by
reference to their expected outcomes. Without game theory, both of
these problems resist analysis wherever non-parametric aspects are
relevant. We will demonstrate this shortly by reference to the most
famous (though not the most typical) game, the so-called *Prisoner's
Dilemma*, and to other, more typical, games. In doing this, we will
need to introduce, define and illustrate the basic elements and
techniques of game theory. To this job we therefore now turn.

## 2. Basic Elements and Assumptions of Game Theory

### 2.1 Utility

An agent is, by definition, an entity with *preferences*. Game
theorists, like economists and philosophers studying rational
decision-making, describe these by means of an abstract concept called
*utility*. This refers to the amount of ‘welfare’ an agent
derives from an object or an event. By ‘welfare’ we refer to some
normative index of relative well-being, justified by reference to some
background framework. For example, we might evaluate the relative
welfare of countries (which we might model as agents for some
purposes) by reference to their per capita incomes, and we might
evaluate the relative welfare of an animal, in the context of
predicting and explaining its behavioral dispositions, by reference to
its expected fitness. In the case of people, it is most typical in
economics and applications of game theory to evaluate their relative
welfare by reference to their own implicit or explicit judgments of
it. Thus a person who, say, adores the taste of pickles but dislikes
onions would be said to associate higher utility with states of the
world in which, all else being equal, she consumes more pickles and
fewer onions than with states in which she consumes more onions and
fewer pickles. Examples of this kind suggest that
‘utility’ denotes a measure of subjective
*psychological* fulfillment, and this is indeed how the concept
was generally (though not always) interpreted prior to the 1930s.
During that decade, however, economists and philosophers under the
influence of behaviourism objected to the theoretical use of such
unobservable entities as ‘psychological fulfillment
quotients.’ The economist Paul Samuelson
(1938)
therefore set out to define utility in such a way that it becomes a
purely technical concept. That is, when we say that an agent acts so
as to maximize her utility, we mean by ‘utility’ simply
whatever it is that the agent's behavior suggests her to consistently
desire. If this looks circular to you, it should: theorists who follow
Samuelson *intend* the statement ‘agents act so as to
maximize their utility’ as a tautology. Like other tautologies
occurring in the foundations of scientific theories, it is useful not
in itself, but because it helps to fix our contexts of inquiry.

Though we might no longer be moved by scruples derived from
*psychological* behaviorism, many theorists continue to follow
Samuelson's way of understanding utility because they think it
important that game theory apply to *any* kind of agent—a
person, a bear, a bee, a firm or a country—and not just to agents
with human minds. When such theorists say that agents act so as to
maximize their utility, they want this to be part of the
*definition* of what it is to be an agent, not an empirical
claim about possible inner states and motivations. Samuelson's
conception of utility, defined by way of *Revealed Preference
Theory* (RPT) introduced in his classic paper
(Samuelson (1938))
satisfies this demand.

Some other theorists understand the point of game theory
differently. They view game theory as providing an explanatory account
of strategic reasoning. For this idea to be applicable, we must
suppose that agents at least sometimes do what they do in
non-parametric settings *because* game-theoretic logic
recommends certain actions as the rational ones. Still other theorists
interpret game theory *normatively*, as advising agents on what
to do in strategic contexts in order to maximize their
utility. Fortunately for our purposes, all of these ways of thinking
about the possible uses of game theory are compatible with the
tautological interpretation of utility maximization. The philosophical
differences are not idle from the perspective of the working game
theorist, however. As we will see in a later section, those who hope
to use game theory to explain strategic *reasoning*, as opposed
to merely strategic *behavior*, face some special philosophical
and practical problems.

Since game theory involves formal reasoning, we must have a device
for thinking of utility maximization in mathematical terms. Such a
device is called a *utility function*. The utility-map for an
agent is called a ‘function’ because it maps *ordered
preferences* onto the real numbers. Suppose that agent *x*
prefers bundle *a* to bundle *b* and bundle *b* to
bundle *c*. We then map these onto a list of numbers, where the
function maps the highest-ranked bundle onto the largest number in the
list, the second-highest-ranked bundle onto the next-largest number in
the list, and so on, thus:

bundlea≫ 3bundle

b≫ 2bundle

c≫ 1

The only property mapped by this function is *order*. The
magnitudes of the numbers are irrelevant; that is, it must not be
inferred that *x* gets 3 times as much utility from bundle
*a* as she gets from bundle *c*. Thus we could represent
*exactly the same* utility function as that above by

bundlea≫ 7,326bundle

b≫ 12.6bundle

c≫ −1,000,000

The numbers featuring in an ordinal utility function are thus not
measuring any *quantity* of anything. A utility-function in
which magnitudes *do* matter is called ‘cardinal’.
Whenever someone refers to a utility function without specifying which
kind is meant, you should assume that it's ordinal. These are the
sorts we'll need for the first set of games we'll examine. Later, when
we come to seeing how to solve games that involve
*randomization*—our river-crossing game from Part 1
above, for example—we'll need to build cardinal utility
functions. The technique for doing this was given by von Neumann & Morgenstern (1947), and was an
essential aspect of their invention of game theory. For the moment,
however, we will need only ordinal functions.

### 2.2 Games and Information

All situations in which at least one agent can only act to maximize
his utility through anticipating (either consciously, or just
implicitly in his behavior) the responses to his actions by one or
more other agents is called a *game*. Agents involved in games
are referred to as *players*. If all agents have optimal
actions regardless of what the others do, as in purely parametric
situations or conditions of monopoly or perfect competition (see
Section 1
above) we can model this without appeal to game theory; otherwise, we
need it.

We assume that players are economically rational. That is, a player can (i) assess outcomes; (ii) calculate paths to outcomes; and (iii) choose actions that yield their most-preferred outcomes, given the actions of the other players. This rationality might in some cases be internally computed by the agent. In other cases, it might simply be embodied in behavioral dispositions built by natural, cultural or economic selection. In particular, in calling an action ‘chosen’ we imply no necessary deliberation, conscious or otherwise. We mean merely that the action was taken when an alternative action was available, in some sense of ‘available’ normally established by the context of the particular analysis.

Each player in a game faces a choice among two or more possible
*strategies*. A strategy is a predetermined ‘programme of
play’ that tells her what actions to take in response to
*every possible strategy other players might use*. The
significance of the italicized phrase here will become clear when we
take up some sample games below.

A crucial aspect of the specification of a game involves the
information that players have when they choose strategies. The
simplest games (from the perspective of logical structure) are those
in which agents have *perfect information*, meaning that at
every point where each agent's strategy tells her to take an action,
she knows everything that has happened in the game up to that point. A
board-game of sequential moves in which in which both players watch
all the action (and know the rules in common), such as chess, is an
instance of such a game. By contrast, the example of the
bridge-crossing game from Section 1 above illustrates a game of
*imperfect information*, since the fugitive must choose a
bridge to cross without knowing the bridge at which the pursuer has
chosen to wait, and the pursuer similarly makes her decision in
ignorance of the actions of her quarry. Since game theory is about
rational action given the strategically significant actions of others,
it should not surprise you to be told that what agents in games know,
or fail to know, about each others' actions makes a considerable
difference to the logic of our analyses, as we will see.

### 2.3 Trees and Matrices

The difference between games of perfect and of imperfect information
is closely related to (though certainly not identical with!) a
distinction between *ways of representing* games that is based
on *order of play*. Let us begin by distinguishing between
sequential-move and simultaneous-move games in terms of
information. It is natural, as a first approximation, to think of
sequential-move games as being ones in which players choose their
strategies one after the other, and of simultaneous-move games as ones
in which players choose their strategies at the same time. This isn't
quite right, however, because what is of strategic importance is not
the temporal *order* of events per se, but whether and when
players *know about* other players' actions relative to having
to choose their own. For example, if two competing businesses are both
planning marketing campaigns, one might commit to its strategy months
before the other does; but if neither knows what the other has
committed to or will commit to when they make their decisions, this is
a simultaneous-move game. Chess, by contrast, is normally played as a
sequential-move game: you see what your opponent has done before
choosing your own next action. (Chess *can* be turned into a
simultaneous-move game if the players each call moves while isolated
from the common board; but this is a very different game from
conventional chess.)

It was said above that the distinction between sequential-move and
simultaneous-move games is not identical to the distinction between
perfect-information and imperfect-information games. Explaining why
this is so is a good way of establishing full understanding of both
sets of concepts. As simultaneous-move games were characterized in the
previous paragraph, it must be true that all simultaneous-move games
are games of imperfect information. However, some games may contain
mixes of sequential and simultaneous moves. For example, two firms
might commit to their marketing strategies independently and in
secrecy from one another, but thereafter engage in pricing competition
in full view of one another. If the optimal marketing strategies were
partially or wholly dependent on what was expected to happen in the
subsequent pricing game, then the two stages would need to be analyzed
as a single game, in which a stage of sequential play followed a stage
of simultaneous play. Whole games that involve mixed stages of this
sort are games of imperfect information, however temporally staged
they might be. Games of perfect information (as the name implies)
denote cases where *no* moves are simultaneous (and where no
player ever forgets what has gone before).

It was said above that games of perfect information are the
(logically) simplest sorts of games. This is so because in such games
(as long as the games are finite, that is, terminate after a known
number of actions) players and analysts can use a straightforward
procedure for predicting outcomes. A rational player in such a game
chooses her first action by considering each series of responses and
counter-responses that will result from each action open to her. She
then asks herself which of the available final outcomes brings her the
highest utility, and chooses the action that starts the chain leading
to this outcome. This process is called *backward induction*
(because the reasoning works backwards from eventual outcomes to
present decision problems).

We will have much more to say about backward induction and its
properties in a later section (when we come to discuss equilibrium and
equilibrium selection). For now, we have described it just in order to
use it to introduce one of the two types of mathematical objects used
to represent games: *game-trees*. A game-tree is an example of
what mathematicians call a *directed graph*. That is, it is a
set of connected nodes in which the overall graph has a direction. We
can draw trees from the top of the page to the bottom, or from left to
right. In the first case, nodes at the top of the page are interpreted
as coming earlier in the sequence of actions. In the case of a tree
drawn from left to right, leftward nodes are prior in the sequence to
rightward ones. An unlabelled tree has a structure of the
following sort:

Figure 1

The point of representing games using trees can best be grasped by visualizing the use of them in supporting backward-induction reasoning. Just imagine the player (or analyst) beginning at the end of the tree, where outcomes are displayed, and then working backwards from these, looking for sets of strategies that describe paths leading to them. Since a player's utility function indicates which outcomes she prefers to which, we also know which paths she will prefer. Of course, not all paths will be possible because the other player has a role in selecting paths too, and won't take actions that lead to less preferred outcomes for him. We will present some examples of this interactive path-selection, and detailed techniques for reasoning through them, after we have described a situation we can use a tree to depict.

Trees are used to represent *sequential* games, because they
show the order in which actions are taken by the players. However,
games are sometimes represented on *matrices* rather than trees.
This is the second type of mathematical object used to represent games.
Matrices, unlike trees, simply show the outcomes, represented in terms
of the players' utility functions, for every possible combination of
strategies the players might use. For example, it makes sense to
display the river-crossing game from
Section 1
on a matrix, since in that game both the fugitive and the hunter have
just one move each, and each chooses their move in ignorance of what
the other has decided to do. Here, then, is *part of* the
matrix:

Figure 2

The fugitive's three possible strategies—cross at the safe
bridge, risk the rocks and risk the cobras—form the rows of the
matrix. Similarly, the hunter's three possible
strategies—waiting at the safe bridge, waiting at the rocky
bridge and waiting at the cobra bridge—form the columns of the
matrix. Each cell of the matrix shows—or, rather *would*
show if our matrix was complete—an *outcome* defined in
terms of the players' *payoffs*. A player's payoff is simply
the number assigned by her ordinal utility function to the state of
affairs corresponding to the outcome in question. For each outcome,
Row's payoff is always listed first, followed by Column's. Thus, for
example, the upper left-hand corner above shows that when the fugitive
crosses at the safe bridge and the hunter is waiting there, the
fugitive gets a payoff of 0 and the hunter gets a payoff of 1. We
interpret these by reference to their utility functions, which in this
game are very simple. If the fugitive gets safely across the river he
receives a payoff of 1; if he doesn't he gets 0. If the fugitive
doesn't make it, either because he's shot by the hunter or hit by a
rock or struck by a cobra, then the hunter gets a payoff of 1 and the
fugitive gets a payoff of 0.

We'll briefly explain the parts of the matrix that have been filled
in, and then say why we can't yet complete the rest. Whenever the
hunter waits at the bridge chosen by the fugitive, the fugitive is
shot. These outcomes all deliver the payoff vector (0, 1). You can find
them descending diagonally across the matrix above from the upper
left-hand corner. Whenever the fugitive chooses the safe bridge but
the hunter waits at another, the fugitive gets safely across, yielding
the payoff vector (1, 0). These two outcomes are shown in the second
two cells of the top row. All of the other cells are marked, *for
now*, with question marks. Why? The problem here is that if the
fugitive crosses at either the rocky bridge or the cobra bridge, he
introduces parametric factors into the game. In these cases, he takes
on some risk of getting killed, and so producing the payoff vector (0,
1), that is independent of anything the hunter does. We don't yet have
enough concepts introduced to be able to show how to represent these
outcomes in terms of utility functions—but by the time we're
finished we will, and this will provide the key to solving our puzzle
from
Section 1.

Matrix games are referred to as ‘normal-form’ or
‘strategic-form’ games, and games as trees are referred to
as ‘extensive-form’ games. The two sorts of games are not
equivalent, because extensive-form games contain
information—about sequences of play and players' levels of
information about the game structure—that strategic-form games
do not. In general, a strategic-form game could represent any one of
several extensive-form games, so a strategic-form game is best thought
of as being a *set* of extensive-form games. When order of play
is irrelevant to a game's outcome, then you should study its strategic
form, since it's the whole set you want to know about. Where order of
play *is* relevant, the extensive form *must* be
specified or your conclusions will be unreliable.

### 2.4 The Prisoner's Dilemma as an Example of Strategic-Form vs. Extensive-Form Representation

The distinctions described above are difficult to fully grasp if all
one has to go on are abstract descriptions. They're best illustrated by
means of an example. For this purpose, we'll use the most famous game:
the Prisoner's Dilemma. It in fact gives the logic of the problem faced
by Cortez's and Henry V's soldiers (see
Section 1 above),
and by Hobbes's agents before they empower the tyrant. However, for
reasons which will become clear a bit later, you should not take the
PD as a *typical* game; it isn't. We use it as an extended
example here only because it's particularly helpful for illustrating
the *relationship* between strategic-form and extensive-form
games (and later, for illustrating the relationships between one-shot
and repeated games; see
Section 4
below).

The name of the Prisoner's Dilemma game is derived from the following
situation typically used to exemplify it. Suppose that the police have
arrested two people whom they know have committed an armed robbery
together. Unfortunately, they lack enough admissible evidence to get a
jury to convict. They *do*, however, have enough evidence to
send each prisoner away for two years for theft of the getaway
car. The chief inspector now makes the following offer to each
prisoner: If you will confess to the robbery, implicating your
partner, and she does not also confess, then you'll go free and she'll
get ten years. If you both confess, you'll each get 5 years. If
neither of you confess, then you'll each get two years for the auto
theft.

Our first step in modeling your situation as a game is to represent it in terms of utility functions. Both you and your partner's utility functions are identical:

Go free ≫ 42 years ≫ 3

5 years ≫ 2

10 years ≫ 0

The numbers in the function above are now used to express your and
your partner's *payoffs* in the various outcomes possible in
your situation. We will refer to you as ‘Player I’ and to
your partner as ‘Player II’. Now we can represent your
entire situation on a matrix; this is the strategic form of your game:

Figure 3

Each cell of the matrix gives the payoffs to both players for each combination of actions. Player I's payoff appears as the first number of each pair, Player II's as the second. So, if both of you confess you each get a payoff of 2 (5 years in prison each). This appears in the upper-left cell. If neither of you confess, you each get a payoff of 3 (2 years in prison each). This appears as the lower-right cell. If you confess and your partner doesn't you get a payoff of 4 (going free) and she gets a payoff of 0 (ten years in prison). This appears in the upper-right cell. The reverse situation, in which she confesses and you refuse, appears in the lower-left cell.

You evaluate your two possible actions here by comparing your payoffs
in each column, since this shows you which of your actions is
preferable for each possible action by your partner. So, observe: If
your partner confesses than you get a payoff of 2 by confessing and a
payoff of 0 by refusing. If your partner refuses, you get a payoff of
4 by confessing and a payoff of 3 by refusing. Therefore, you're
better off confessing regardless of what she does. Your partner,
meanwhile, evaluates her actions by comparing her payoffs down each
row, and she comes to exactly the same conclusion that you
do. Wherever one action for a player is superior to her other actions
for each possible action by the opponent, we say that the first action
*strictly dominates* the second one. In the PD, then,
confessing strictly dominates refusing for both players. Both players
know this about each other, thus entirely eliminating any temptation
to depart from the strictly dominated path. Thus both players will
confess, and both will go to prison for 5 years.

The players, and analysts, can predict this outcome using a mechanical
procedure, known as iterated elimination of strictly dominated
strategies. You, as Player 1, can see by examining the matrix that
your payoffs in each cell of the top row are higher than your payoffs
in each corresponding cell of the bottom row. Therefore, it can never
be rational for you to play your bottom-row strategy, viz., refusing
to confess, *regardless of what your opponent does*. Since
your bottom-row strategy will never be played, we can simply
*delete* the bottom row from the matrix. Now it is obvious that
Player II will not refuse to confess, since his payoff from confessing
in the two cells that remain is higher than his payoff from refusing.
So, once again, we can delete the one-cell column on the right from
the game. We now have only one cell remaining, that corresponding to
the outcome brought about by mutual confession. Since the reasoning
that led us to delete all other possible outcomes depended at each
step only on the premise that both players are economically rational
— that is, prefer higher payoffs to lower ones — there is
very strong grounds for viewing joint confession as the
*solution* to the game, the outcome on which its play
*must* converge. You should note that the order in which
strictly dominated rows and columns are deleted doesn't matter. Had we
begun by deleting the right-hand column and then deleted the bottom
row, we would have arrived at the same solution.

It's been said a couple of times that the PD is not a typical game in many respects. One of these respects is that all its rows and columns are either strictly dominated or strictly dominant. In any strategic-form game where this is true, iterated elimination of strictly dominated strategies is guaranteed to yield a unique solution. Later, however, we will see that for many games this condition does not apply, and then our analytic task is less straightforward.

You will probably have noticed something disturbing about the outcome
of the PD. Had you both refused to confess, you'd have arrived at the
lower-right outcome in which you each go to prison for only 2 years,
thereby *both* earning higher utility than you receive when you
confess. This is the most important fact about the PD, and its
significance for game theory is quite general. We'll therefore return
to it below when we discuss equilibrium concepts in game theory. For
now, however, let us stay with our use of this particular game to
illustrate the difference between strategic and extensive forms.

When people introduce the PD into popular discussions, you will sometimes hear them say that the police inspector must lock his prisoners into separate rooms so that they can't communicate with one another. The reasoning behind this idea seems obvious: if you could communicate, you'd surely see that you're both better off refusing, and could make an agreement to do so, no? This, one presumes, would remove your conviction that you must confess because you'll otherwise be sold up the river by your partner. In fact, however, this intuition is misleading and its conclusion is false.

When we represent the PD as a strategic-form game, we implicitly assume that the prisoners can't attempt collusive agreement since they choose their actions simultaneously. In this case, agreement before the fact can't help. If you are convinced that your partner will stick to the bargain then you can seize the opportunity to go scot-free by confessing. Of course, you realize that the same temptation will occur to her; but in that case you again want to make sure you confess, as this is your only means of avoiding your worst outcome. Your agreement comes to naught because you have no way of enforcing it; it constitutes what game theorists call ‘cheap talk’.

But now suppose that you do *not* move simultaneously. That is,
suppose that one of you can choose *after* observing the
other's action. This is the sort of situation that people who think
non-communication important must have in mind. Now you can see that
your partner has remained steadfast when it comes to your choice, and
you need not be concerned about being suckered. However, this doesn't
change anything, a point that is best made by re-representing the game
in extensive form. This gives us our opportunity to introduce
game-trees and the method of analysis appropriate to them.

First, however, here are definitions of some concepts that will be helpful in analyzing game-trees:

Node: A point at which a player takes an action.

Initial node: The point at which the first action in the game occurs.

Terminal node: Any node which, if reached, ends the game. Each terminal node corresponds to anoutcome.

Subgame: Any set of nodes and branches descending uniquely from one node.

Payoff: an ordinal utility number assigned to a player at an outcome.

Outcome: an assignment of a set of payoffs, one to each player in the game.

Strategy: a program instructing a player which action to take at every node in the tree where she could possibly be called on to make a choice.

These quick definitions may not mean very much to you until you follow them being put to use in our analyses of trees below. It will probably be best if you scroll back and forth between them and the examples as we work through them. By the time you understand each example, you'll find the concepts and their definitions quite natural and intuitive.

To make this exercise maximally instructive, let's suppose that you and your partner have studied the matrix above and, seeing that you're both better off in the outcome represented by the lower-right cell, have formed an agreement to cooperate. You are to commit to refusal first, at which point she will reciprocate. We will refer to a strategy of keeping the agreement as ‘cooperation’, and will denote it in the tree below with ‘C’. We will refer to a strategy of breaking the agreement as ‘defection’, and will denote it on the tree below with ‘D’. As before, you are I and your partner is II. Each node is numbered 1, 2, 3, … , from top to bottom, for ease of reference in discussion. Here, then, is the tree:

Figure 4

Look first at each of the terminal nodes (those along the bottom).
These represent possible outcomes. Each is identified with an
assignment of payoffs, just as in the strategic-form game, with I's
payoff appearing first in each set and II's appearing second. Each of
the structures descending from the nodes 1, 2 and 3 respectively is a
sub-game. We begin our backward-induction analysis—using a
technique called *Zermelo's algorithm*—with the sub-games
that arise last in the sequence of play. If the subgame descending
from node 3 is played, then Player II will face a choice between a
payoff of 4 and a payoff of 3. (Consult the second number,
representing her payoff, in each set at a terminal node descending
from node 3.) II earns her higher payoff by playing D. We may
therefore replace the entire subgame with an assignment of the payoff
(0,4) directly to node 3, since this is the outcome that will be
realized if the game reaches that node. Now consider the subgame
descending from node 2. Here, II faces a choice between a payoff of 2
and one of 0. She obtains her higher one, 2, by playing D. We may
therefore assign the payoff (2,2) directly to node 2. Now we move to
the subgame descending from node 1. (This subgame is, of course,
identical to the whole game; all games are subgames of themselves.)
You (Player I) now face a choice between outcomes (2,2) and
(0,4). Consulting the first numbers in each of these sets, you see
that you get your higher payoff—2—by playing D. D is, of
course, the option of confessing. So you confess, and then your
partner also confesses, yielding the same outcome as in the
strategic-form representation.

What has happened here is that you realize that if you play C (refuse to confess) at node 1, then your partner will be able to maximize her utility by suckering you and playing D. (On the tree, this happens at node 3.) This leaves you with a payoff of 0 (ten years in prison), which you can avoid only by playing D to begin with. You therefore defect from the agreement.

We have thus seen that in the case of the Prisoner's Dilemma, the simultaneous and sequential versions yield the same outcome. This will often not be true, however. In particular, only finite extensive-form (sequential) games of perfect information can be solved using Zermelo's algorithm.

As noted earlier in this section, sometimes we must represent
simultaneous moves *within* games that are otherwise sequential.
(As we said above, in all such cases the game as a whole will be one of
imperfect information, so we won't be able to solve it using Zermelo's
algorithm.) We represent such games using the device of *information
sets*. Consider the following tree:

Figure 5

The oval drawn around nodes *b* and *c* indicates that
they lie within a common information set. This means that at these
nodes players cannot infer back up the path from whence they came; II
does not know, in choosing her strategy, whether she is at *b*
or *c*. (For this reason, what properly bear numbers in
extensive-form games are information sets, conceived as ‘action
points’, rather than nodes themselves; this is why the nodes
inside the oval are labelled with letters rather than numbers.) Put
another way, II, when choosing, does not know what I has done at node
*a*. But you will recall from earlier in this section that this
is just what defines two moves as simultaneous. We can thus see that
the method of representing games as trees is entirely general. If no
node after the initial node is alone in an information set on its
tree, so that the game has only one subgame (itself), then the whole
game is one of simultaneous play. If at least one node shares its
information set with another, while others are alone, the game
involves both simultaneous and sequential play, and so is still a game
of imperfect information. Only if all information sets are inhabited
by just one node do we have a game of perfect information.

### 2.5 Solution Concepts and Equilibria

In the Prisoner's Dilemma, the outcome we've represented as (2,2),
indicating mutual defection, was said to be the ‘solution’
to the game. Following the general practice in economics, game
theorists refer to the solutions of games as *equilibria.*
Philosophically minded readers will want to pose a conceptual question
right here: What is ‘equilibrated’ about some game
outcomes such that we are motivated to call them
‘solutions’? When we say that a physical system is in
equilibrium, we mean that it is in a *stable* state, one in
which all the causal forces internal to the system balance each other
out and so leave it ‘at rest’ until and unless it is
perturbed by the intervention of some exogenous (that is,
‘external’) force. This what economists have traditionally
meant in talking about ‘equilibria’; they read economic
systems as being networks of causal relations, just like physical
systems, and the equilibria of such systems are then their
endogenously stable states. As we will see after discussing
evolutionary game theory
in a later section, it is
possible to maintain this understanding of equilibria in the case of
game theory. However, as we noted in Section 2.1, some people interpret
game theory as being an explanatory theory of strategic reasoning. For
them, a solution to a game must be an outcome that a rational agent
would predict *using the mechanisms of rational computation
alone*. Such theorists face some puzzles about solution concepts
that aren't so important for the behaviorist. We will be visiting such
puzzles and their possible solutions throughout the rest of this
article.

It's useful to start the discussion here from the case of the
Prisoner's Dilemma because it's unusually simple from the perspective
of these puzzles. What we referred to as its ‘solution’ is
the unique *Nash equilibrium* of the game. (The
‘Nash’ here refers to John Nash, the Nobel Laureate
mathematician who in
Nash (1950)
did most to extend and generalize von Neumann & Morgenstern's
pioneering work.) Nash equilibrium (henceforth ‘NE’)
applies (or fails to apply, as the case may be) to whole *sets*
of strategies, one for each player in a game. A set of strategies is a
NE just in case no player could improve her payoff, given the
strategies of all other players in the game, by changing her
strategy. Notice how closely this idea is related to the idea of
strict dominance: no strategy could be a NE strategy if it is strictly
dominated. Therefore, if iterative elimination of strictly dominated
strategies takes us to a unique outcome, we know we have found the
game's unique NE. Now, almost all theorists agree that avoidance of
strictly dominated strategies is a *minimum* requirement of
rationality. This implies that *if* a game has an outcome that
is a unique NE, as in the case of joint confession in the PD, that
must be its unique solution. This is one of the most important
respects in which the PD is an ‘easy’ (and atypical)
game.

We can specify one class of games in which NE is always not only
necessary but *sufficient* as a solution concept. These are
finite perfect-information games that are also *zero-sum*. A
zero-sum game (in the case of a game involving just two players) is
one in which one player can only be made better off by making the
other player worse off. (Tic-tac-toe is a simple example of such a
game: any move that brings me closer to winning brings you closer to
losing, and vice-versa.) We can determine whether a game is zero-sum
by examining players' utility functions: in zero-sum games these will
be mirror-images of each other, with one player's highly ranked
outcomes being low-ranked for the other and vice-versa. In such a
game, if I am playing a strategy such that, given your strategy, I
can't do any better, and if you are *also* playing such a
strategy, then, since any change of strategy by me would have to make
you worse off and vice-versa, it follows that our game can have no
solution compatible with our mutual rationality other than its unique
NE. We can put this another way: in a zero-sum game, my playing a
strategy that maximizes my minimum payoff if you play the best you
can, and your simultaneously doing the same thing, is just
*equivalent* to our both playing our best strategies, so this
pair of so-called ‘maximin’ procedures is guaranteed to
find the unique solution to the game, which is its unique NE. (In
tic-tac-toe, this is a draw. You can't do any better than drawing, and
neither can I, if both of us are trying to win and trying not to
lose.)

However, most games do not have this property. It won't be possible,
in this one article, to enumerate *all* of the ways in which
games can be problematic from the perspective of their possible
solutions. (For one thing, it is highly unlikely that theorists have
yet discovered all of the possible problems!) However, we can try to
generalize the issues a bit.

First, there is the problem that in most non-zero-sum games, there is more than one NE, but not all NE look equally plausible as the solutions upon which strategically rational players would hit. Consider the strategic-form game below (taken from Kreps (1990), p. 403):

Figure 6

This game has two NE: s1-t1 and s2-t2. (Note that no rows or columns
are strictly dominated here. But if Player I is playing s1 then Player
II can do no better than t1, and vice-versa; and similarly for the
s2-t2 pair.) If NE is our only solution concept, then we shall be
forced to say that either of these outcomes is equally persuasive as a
solution. However, if game theory is regarded as an explanatory and/or
normative theory of strategic reasoning, this seems to be leaving
something out: surely rational players with perfect information would
converge on s1-t1? (Note that this is *not* like the situation
in the PD, where the socially superior situation is unachievable
because it is not a NE. In the case of the game above, both players
have every reason to try to converge on the NE in which they are
better off.)

This illustrates the fact that NE is a relatively (logically)
*weak* solution concept, often failing to predict intuitively
sensible solutions because, if applied alone, it refuses to allow
players to use principles of equilibrium selection that, if not
*demanded* by rationality, are at least not *irrational*.
Consider another example from
Kreps (1990),
p.
397:

Figure 7

Here, no strategy strictly dominates another. However, Player I's top
row, s1, *weakly* dominates s2, since I does *at least as
well* using s1 as s2 for any reply by Player II, and on one reply
by II (t2), I does better. So should not the players (and the analyst)
delete the weakly dominated row s2? When they do so, column t1 is then
strictly dominated, and the NE s1-t2 is selected as the unique
solution. However, as Kreps goes on to show using this example, the
idea that weakly dominated strategies should be deleted just like
strict ones has odd consequences.
Suppose
we change the payoffs of the game just a bit, as follows:

Figure 8

s2 is still weakly dominated as before; but of our two NE, s2-t1 is
now the most attractive for both players; so why should the analyst
eliminate its possibility? (Note that this game, again, does
*not* replicate the logic of the PD. There, it makes sense to
eliminate the most attractive outcome, joint refusal to confess,
because both players have incentives to unilaterally deviate from it,
so it is not an NE. This is not true of s2-t1 in the present game. You
should be starting to clearly see why we called the PD game
‘atypical’.) The argument *for* eliminating weakly
dominated strategies is that Player 1 may be nervous, fearing that
Player II is not completely *sure* to be rational (or that
Player II fears that Player I isn't completely rational, or that
Player II fears that Player I fears that Player II isn't completely
rational, and so on ad infinitum) and so might play t2 with some
positive probability. If the possibility of departures from
rationality is taken seriously, then we have an argument for
eliminating weakly dominated strategies: Player I thereby insures
herself against her worst outcome, s2-t2. Of course, she pays a cost
for this insurance, reducing her expected payoff from 10 to 5. On the
other hand, we might imagine that the players could communicate before
playing the game and agree play *correlated strategies* so as
to *coordinate* on s2-t1, thereby removing some, most or all of
the uncertainty that encourages elimination of the weakly dominated
row s1, and eliminating s1-t2 as a viable NE instead!

Any proposed principle for solving games that may have the effect of
eliminating one or more NE from consideration is referred to as a
*refinement* of NE. In the case just discussed, elimination of
weakly dominated strategies is one possible refinement, since it
refines away the NE s2-t1, and correlation is another, since it
refines away the other NE, s1-t2, instead. So which refinement is more
appropriate as a solution concept? People who think of game theory as
an explanatory and/or normative theory of strategic rationality have
generated a substantial literature in which the merits and drawbacks
of a large number of refinements are debated. In principle, there
seems to be no limit on the number of refinements that could be
considered, since there may also be no limits on the set of
philosophical intuitions about what principles a rational agent might
or might not see fit to follow or to fear or hope that other players
are following.

Behaviorists take a dim view of much of this activity. They see the
job of game theory as being to predict outcomes *given* some
distribution of strategic dispositions, and some distribution of
expectations about the strategic dispositions of others, that have
been shaped by institutional processes and / or evolutionary
selection.
(See
Section 7
for further discussion.) On this view, which NE are viable in a game
is determined by the underlying dynamics that equipped players with
dispositions *prior to* the commencement of a game. The
strategic natures of players are thereby treated as a set of exogenous
inputs to the game, just as utility functions are. Behaviorists are
thus less inclined to seek *general* refinements of the
equilibrium concept itself, at least insofar as these involve the
modeling of *more sophisticated* expressions of rationality
over and above merely consistent maximization of utility. Behaviorists
are often inclined to doubt that the goal of seeking a
*general* theory of rationality makes sense as a
project. Institutions and evolutionary processes build many
environments, and what counts as rational procedure in one environment
may not be favoured in another. Economic rationality requires only
that agents have consistent preferences, that is, that they not prefer
*a* to *b* and *b* to *c*
**and** *c* to *a*. A great many
arrangements of strategic dispositions are compatible with this
minimal requirement, and evolutionary or institutional processes might
generate games in any of them. On this view, NE is a robust
equilibrium concept because if players evolve their strategic
dispositions in settings that are competitive, those who don't do
what's optimal given the strategies of others *in that specific
environment* will be outcompeted, and so selection will either
eliminate them or encourage the learning of new dispositions. There is
no more ‘refined’ concept of rationality of which this can
be argued to be true *in general*; and so, according to
behaviorists, refinements of NE based on refinements of rationality
are likely to be of merely occasional interest.

This does not imply that behaviorists abjure all ways of restricting sets of NE to plausible subsets. In particular, they tend to be sympathetic to approaches that shift emphasis from rationality itself onto considerations of the informational dynamics of games. We should perhaps not be surprised that NE analysis alone often fails to tell us much of interest about strategic-form games (e.g., Figure 6 above), in which informational structure is suppressed. Equilibrium selection issues are often more fruitfully addressed in the context of extensive-form games.

### 2.6 Modular Rationality and Subgame Perfection

In order to deepen our understanding of extensive-form games, we need an example with more interesting structure than the PD offers.

Consider the game described by this tree:

Figure 9

This game is not intended to fit any preconceived situation; it is simply a mathematical object in search of an application. (L and R here just denote ‘left’ and ‘right’ respectively.)

Now consider the strategic form of this game:

Figure 10

(If you are confused by this, remember that a strategy must tell a
player what to do at *every* information set where that player
has an action. Since each player chooses between two actions at each
of two information sets here, each player has four strategies in
total. The first letter in each strategy designation tells each
player what to do if he or she reaches their first information set,
the second what to do if their second information set is
reached. I.e., LR for Player II tells II to play L if information set
5 is reached and R if information set 6 is reached.) If you examine
this matrix, you will discover that (LL, RL) is among the NE. This is
a bit puzzling, since if Player I reaches her second information set
(7) in the extensive-form game, I would hardly wish to play L there;
she earns a higher payoff by playing R at node 7. Mere NE analysis
doesn't notice this because NE is insensitive to what happens *off
the path of play*. Player I, in choosing L at node 4, ensures that
node 7 will not be reached; this is what is meant by saying that it is
‘off the path of play’. In analyzing extensive-form
games, however, we *should* care what happens off the path of
play, because consideration of this is crucial to what happens
*on* the path. For example, it is the fact that Player I
*would* play R if node 7 were reached that *would* cause
Player II to play L if node 6 were reached, and this is why Player I
won't choose R at node 4. We are throwing away information relevant to
game solutions if we ignore off-path outcomes, as mere NE analysis
does. Notice that this reason for doubting that NE is a wholly
satisfactory equilibrium concept in itself has nothing to do with
intuitions about rationality, as in the case of the refinement
concepts discussed in Section 2.5.

Now apply Zermelo's algorithm to the extensive form of our current example. Begin, again, with the last subgame, that descending from node 7. This is Player I's move, and she would choose R because she prefers her payoff of 5 to the payoff of 4 she gets by playing L. Therefore, we assign the payoff (5, -1) to node 7. Thus at node 6 II faces a choice between (-1, 0) and (5, -1). He chooses L. At node 5 II chooses R. At node 4 I is thus choosing between (0, 5) and (-1, 0), and so plays L. Note that, as in the PD, an outcome appears at a terminal node—(4, 5) from node 7—that is Pareto superior to the NE. Again, however, the dynamics of the game prevent it from being reached.

The fact that Zermelo's algorithm picks out the strategy vector (LR,
RL) as the unique solution to the game shows that it's yielding
something other than just an NE. In fact, it is generating the game's
*subgame perfect equilibrium* (SPE). It gives an outcome that
yields a NE not just in the *whole* game but in every subgame
as well. This is a persuasive solution concept because, again unlike
the refinements of Section 2.5, it does not demand ‘more’
rationality of agents, but *less*. (It does, however, assume
that players not only know everything strategically relevant to their
situation but also *use* all of that information; we must be
careful not to confuse rationality with computational power.) The
agents, at every node, simply choose the path that brings them the
highest payoff *in the subgame emanating from that node*; and,
then, in solving the game, they foresee that they will all do that.
Agents who proceed in this way are said to be *modular
rational*, that is, short-run rational at each step. They do not
imagine themselves, by some fancy processes of hyper-rationality,
acting against their local preferences for the sake of some wider
goal. Note that, as in the PD, this can lead to outcomes which might
be regretted from the social point of view. In our current example,
Player I would be better off, and Player II no worse off, at the
left-hand node emanating from node 7 than at the SPE outcome. But
Player I's very modular rationality, and Player II's awareness of
this, blocks the socially efficient outcome. If our players wish to
bring about the more equitable outcome (4,5) here, they must do so by
redesigning their institutions so as to change the structures of the
games they play. Merely wishing that they could be hyper-rational in
some way does not seem altogether coherent as an approach.

### 2.7 On Interpreting Payoffs: Morality and Efficiency in Games

Many readers might suppose that the conclusion of the previous section
has been asserted on the basis of no adequate defense. Surely, the
players might be able to just *see* that outcome (4,5) is
socially and morally superior; and since we know they can also see the
path of actions that leads to it, who is the game theorist to announce
that, within the game they're playing, it's unattainable? In fact, to
suggest that hyper-rationality is a will o’ the wisp *is*
philosophically tendentious, though it is indeed what behaviorists
about game theory believe. The reader who seeks a thorough
justification for this belief is referred to
Binmore (1994,
1998).
However, before we just leave matters at a stand-off (here), we must
be careful not to confuse what is controversial with the consequences
of a simple technical mistake. Consider the Prisoner's Dilemma
again. We have seen that in the unique NE of the PD, both players get
less utility than they could have through mutual cooperation. This may
strike you (as it has struck many commentators) as perverse. Surely,
you may think, it simply results from a combination of selfishness and
paranoia on the part of the players. To begin with they have no regard
for the social good, and then they shoot themselves in the feet by
being too untrustworthy to respect agreements.

This way of thinking leads to serious misunderstandings of game
theory, and so must be dispelled. Let us first introduce some
terminology for talking about outcomes. Welfare economists typically
measure social good in terms of *Pareto efficiency*. A
distribution of utility β is said to be *Pareto dominant*
over another distribution δ just in case from state δ
there is a possible redistribution of utility to β such that at
least one player is better off in β than in δ and no player
is worse off. Failure to move to a Pareto-dominant redistribution is
*inefficient* because the existence of β as a logical
possibility shows that in δ some utility is being wasted. Now,
the outcome (3,3) that represents mutual cooperation in our model of
the PD is clearly Pareto dominant over mutual defection; at (3,3)
*both* players are better off than at (2,2). So it is true that
PDs lead to inefficient outcomes. This was true of our example in
Section 2.6 as well.

However, inefficiency should not be associated with immorality. A
utility function for a player is supposed to represent *everything
that player cares about*, which may be anything at all. As we have
described the situation of our prisoners they do indeed care only about
their own relative prison sentences, but there is nothing essential in
this. What makes a game an instance of the PD is strictly and only its
payoff structure. Thus we could have two Mother Theresa types here,
both of whom care little for themselves and wish only to feed starving
children. But suppose the original Mother Theresa wishes to feed the
children of Calcutta while Mother Juanita wishes to feed the children
of Bogota. And suppose that the international aid agency will maximize
its donation if the two saints nominate the same city, will give the
second-highest amount if they nominate each others' cities, and the
lowest amount if they each nominate their own city. Our saints are in a
PD here, though hardly selfish or unconcerned with the social good.

To return to our prisoners, suppose that, contrary to our
assumptions, they *do* value each other's well-being as well as
their own. In that case, this must be reflected in their utility
functions, and hence in their payoffs. If their payoff structures are
changed, they will no longer be in a PD. But all this shows is that not
every possible situation is a PD; it does *not* show that the
threat of inefficient outcomes is a special artifact of selfishness. It
is the *logic* of the prisoners' situation, not their
psychology, that traps them in the inefficient outcome, and if that
really *is* their situation then they are stuck in it (barring
further complications to be discussed below). Agents who wish to avoid
inefficient outcomes are best advised to prevent certain games from
arising; the defender of the possibility of hyper-rationality is really
proposing that they try to dig themselves out of such games by turning
themselves into different kinds of agents.

In general, then, a game is partly *defined* by the payoffs
assigned to the players. If a proposed solution involves tacitly
changing these payoffs, then this ‘solution’ is in fact a
disguised way of changing the subject.

### 2.8 Trembling Hands

Our last point above opens the way to a philosophical puzzle, one of several that still preoccupy those concerned with the logical foundations of game theory. It can be raised with respect to any number of examples, but we will borrow an elegant one from C. Bicchieri (1993), who also provides the most extensive treatment of the problem found in the literature. Consider the following game:

Figure 11

The NE outcome here is at the single leftmost node descending from
node 8. To see this, backward induct again. At node 10, I would play L
for a payoff of 3, giving II a payoff of 1. II can do better than this
by playing L at node 9, giving I a payoff of 0. I can do better than
this by playing L at node 8; so that is what I does, and the game
terminates without II getting to move. But, now, notice the reasoning
required to support this prediction. I plays L at node 8 because she
knows that II is rational, and so would, at node 9, play L because II
knows that I is rational and so would, at node 10, play L. But now we
have the following paradox: I must suppose that II, at node 9, would
predict I's rational play at node 10 despite having arrived at a node
(9) that could only be reached if I is not rational! If I is not
rational then II is not justified in predicting that I will not play R
at node 10, in which case it is not clear that II shouldn't play R at
9; and if II plays R at 9, then I is guaranteed of a better payoff then
she gets if she plays L at node 8. Both players must use backward
induction to solve the game; backward induction requires that I know
that II knows that I is rational; but II can solve the game only by
using a backward induction argument that takes as a premise the
irrationality of I. This is the *paradox of backward
induction*.

A standard way around this paradox in the literature is to invoke the so-called ‘trembling hand’ due to Selten (1975). The idea here is that a decision and its consequent act may ‘come apart’ with some nonzero probability, however small. That is, a player might intend to take an action but then slip up in the execution and send the game down some other path instead. If there is even a remote possibility that a player may make a mistake—that her ‘hand may tremble’—then no contradiction is introduced by a player's using a backward induction argument that requires the hypothetical assumption that another player has taken a path that a rational player could not choose. In our example, II could reason about what to do at node 9 conditional on the assumption that I rationally chose L at node 8 but then slipped.

There is a substantial technical literature on this
backward-induction paradox, of which
Bicchieri (1993)
is the most comprehensive source. (Bicchieri, it should be noted,
does *not* endorse an appeal to trembling hands as the
appropriate solution. Discussing her particular proposal here would,
however, take us too far afield into technicalities. The interested
reader should study her book.) The puzzle has been introduced here
just in order to point out that refinements of the type discussed in
Section 2.6 can be encouraged by more than mere intuitions about the
concept of rationality. For if hands may tremble then merely
economically rational players *will* be motivated to worry
about the probabilities with which apparent departures from rational
play will be observed. For example, if my opponent's hand may tremble,
then this gives me good reason to avoid the weakly dominated strategy
s2 in
the third example from Section 2.5.
After all, my opponent might promise to play t1 in that game, and I
may believe his promise; but if his hand then trembles and a play of
t2 results, I get my worst payoff. If I'm risk-averse, then in such
situations it would seem that I should stick to weakly dominant
strategies.

The paradox of backward induction, like the puzzles raised by
equilibrium refinement, is mainly a problem for those who view game
theory as contributing to a normative theory of rationality
(specifically, as contributing to that larger theory the theory of
*strategic* rationality). The behaviorist can give a different
sort of account of apparently irrational play and the prudence it
encourages. This involves appeal to the empirical fact that actual
agents, including people, must *learn* the equilibrium
strategies of games they play, at least whenever the games are at all
complicated. Research shows that even a game as simple as the
Prisoner's Dilemma requires learning by people
(Ledyard 1995,
Sally 1995,
Camerer 2003,
p. 265). What it means to say that people must learn equilibrium
strategies is that we must be a bit more sophisticated than was
indicated earlier in constructing utility functions from behavior in
application of Revealed Preference Theory. Instead of constructing
utility functions on the basis of single episodes, we must do so on
the basis of observed runs of behavior *once it has
stabilized*, signifying maturity of learning for the subjects in
question and the game in question. Once again, the Prisoner's Dilemma
makes a good example. People encounter few one-shot Prisoner's
Dilemmas in everyday life, but they encounter many *repeated*
PD's with non-strangers. As a result, when set into what is intended to
be a one-shot PD in the experimental laboratory, people tend to
initially play as if the game were a single round of a repeated
PD. The repeated PD has many Nash equilibria that involve cooperation
rather than defection. Thus experimental subjects tend to cooperate at
first in these circumstances, but learn after some number of rounds to
defect. The experimenter cannot infer that she has successfully
induced a one-shot PD with her experimental setup until she sees this
behavior stabilize. (As noted in
Section 2.7
above, if it does *not* so stabilize, she must infer that she
has failed to induce a one-shot PD and that her subjects are playing
some other game.)

The paradox of backward induction now dissolves. Unless players have experienced play at equilibrium with one another in the past, even if they are all rational, and all believe this about one another, we should predict that they will attach some positive probability to the conjecture that interaction partners have not yet learned all equilibria. This then explains why rational agents, unless they enjoy risk, may play as if they believe in trembling hands.

Learning of equilibria by rational agents may take various forms for different agents and for games of differing levels of complexity and risk. Incorporating it into game-theoretic models of interactions thus introduces an extensive new set of technicalities. For the most fully developed general theory, the reader is referred to Fudenberg and Levine (1998).

## 3. Uncertainty, Risk and Sequential Equilibria

The games we've modeled to this point have all involved players
choosing from amongst *pure strategies*, in which each seeks a
single optimal course of action at each node that constitutes a best
reply to the actions of others. Often, however, a player's utility is
optimized through use of a *mixed* strategy, in which she flips
a weighted coin amongst several possible actions. (We will see later
that there is an alternative interpretation of mixing, not involving
randomization at a particular information set; but we will start here
from the coin-flipping interpretation and then build on it in
Section 3.1.)
Mixing is necessary whenever no pure strategy maximizes the player's
utility against all opponent strategies. Our river-crossing game from
Section 1
exemplifies this. As we saw, the puzzle in that game consists in the
fact that if the fugitive's reasoning selects a particular bridge as
optimal, his pursuer must be assumed to be able to duplicate that
reasoning. Thus the fugitive can escape only if his pursuer cannot
reliably predict which bridge he'll use. Symmetry of logical reasoning
power on the part of the two players ensures that the fugitive can
surprise the pursuer only if it is possible for him to surprise
*himself*.

Suppose that we ignore rocks and cobras for a moment, and imagine that
the bridges are equally safe. Suppose also that the fugitive has no
special knowledge about his pursuer that might lead him to venture a
specially conjectured probability distribution over the pursuer's
available strategies. In this case, the fugitive's best course is to
roll a three-sided die, in which each side represents a different
bridge (or, more conventionally, a six-sided die in which each bridge
is represented by two sides). He must then pre-commit himself to using
whichever bridge is selected by this *randomizing device*. This
fixes the odds of his survival regardless of what the pursuer does;
but since the pursuer has no reason to prefer any available pure or
mixed strategy, and since in any case we are presuming her epistemic
situation to be symmetrical to that of the fugitive, we may suppose
that she will roll a three-sided die of her own. The fugitive now has
a 2/3 probability of escaping and the pursuer a 1/3 probability of
catching him. The fugitive cannot improve on these odds if the pursuer
is rational, so the two randomizing strategies are in Nash
equilibrium.

Now let us re-introduce the parametric factors, that is, the falling
rocks at bridge #2 and the cobras at bridge #3. Again, suppose that
the fugitive is sure to get safely across bridge #1, has a 90% chance
of crossing bridge #2, and an 80% chance of crossing bridge #3. We can
solve this new game if we make certain assumptions about the two
players' utility functions. Suppose that Player 1, the fugitive, cares
only about living or dying (preferring life to death) while the
pursuer simply wishes to be able to report that the fugitive is dead,
preferring this to having to report that he got away. (In other words,
neither player cares about *how* the fugitive lives or dies.)
In this case, the fugitive simply takes his original randomizing
formula and weights it according to the different levels of parametric
danger at the three bridges. Each bridge should be thought of as a
*lottery* over the fugitive's possible outcomes, in which each
lottery has a different *expected payoff* in terms of the items
in his utility function.

Consider matters from the pursuer's point of view. She will be using her NE strategy when she chooses the mix of probabilities over the three bridges that makes the fugitive indifferent among his possible pure strategies. The bridge with rocks is 1.1 times more dangerous for him than the safe bridge. Therefore, he will be indifferent between the two when the pursuer is 1.1 times more likely to be waiting at the safe bridge than the rocky bridge. The cobra bridge is 1.2 times more dangerous for the fugitive than the safe bridge. Therefore, he will be indifferent between these two bridges when the pursuer's probability of waiting at the safe bridge is 1.2 times higher than the probability that she is at the cobra bridge. Suppose we use s1, s2 and s3 to represent the fugitive's parametric survival rates at each bridge. Then the pursuer minimizes the net survival rate across any pair of bridges by adjusting the probabilities p1 and p2 that she will wait at them so that

s1 (1 − p1) = s2 (1 − p2)

Since p1 + p2 = 1, we can rewrite this as

s1 × p2 = s2 × p1

so

p1/s1 = p2/s2.

Thus the pursuer finds her NE strategy by solving the following simultaneous equations:

1 (1 − p1) = 0.9 (1 − p2) = 0.8 (1 − p3) p1 + p2 + p3 = 1.

Then

p1 = 49/121 p2 = 41/121 p3 = 31/121

Now let f1, f2, f3 represent the probabilities with which the fugitive chooses each respective bridge. Then the fugitive finds his NE strategy by solving

s1 × f1 = s2 × f2 = s3 × f3

so

1 × f1 = 0.9 × f2 = 0.8 × f3

simultaneously with

f1 + f2 + f3 = 1.

Then

f1 = 36/121 f2 = 40/121 f3 = 45/121

These two sets of NE probabilities tell each player how to weight his
or her die before throwing it. Note the — perhaps surprising
— result that the fugitive uses riskier bridges with * higher
* probability. This is the only way of making the pursuer
indifferent over which bridge she stakes out, which in turn is what
maximizes the fugitive's probability of survival.

We were able to solve this game straightforwardly because we set the
utility functions in such a way as to make it *zero-sum*, or
*strictly competitive*. That is, every gain in expected utility
by one player represents a precisely symmetrical loss by the other.
However, this condition may often not hold. Suppose now that the
utility functions are more complicated. The pursuer most prefers an
outcome in which she shoots the fugitive and so claims credit for his
apprehension to one in which he dies of rockfall or snakebite; and she
prefers this second outcome to his escape. The fugitive prefers a
quick death by gunshot to the pain of being crushed or the terror of
an encounter with a cobra. Most of all, of course, he prefers to
escape. We cannot solve this game, as before, simply on the basis of
knowing the players' ordinal utility functions, since the
*intensities* of their respective preferences will now be
relevant to their strategies.

Prior to the work of
von Neumann & Morgenstern (1947),
situations of this sort were inherently baffling to analysts. This is
because utility does not denote a hidden psychological variable such
as *pleasure*. As we discussed in
Section 2.1,
utility is merely a measure of relative behavioural dispositions
given certain consistency assumptions about relations between
preferences and choices. It therefore makes no sense to imagine
comparing our players' *cardinal*—that is,
intensity-sensitive—preferences with one another's, since there
is no independent, interpersonally constant yardstick we could
use. How, then, can we model games in which cardinal information is
relevant? After all, modeling games requires that all players'
utilities be taken simultaneously into account, as we've seen.

A crucial aspect of
von Neumann & Morgenstern's (1947)
work was the solution to this problem. Here, we will provide a brief
outline of their ingenious technique for building cardinal utility
functions out of ordinal ones. It is emphasized that what follows is
merely an *outline*, so as to make cardinal utility
non-mysterious to you as a student who is interested in knowing about
the philosophical foundations of game theory, and about the range of
problems to which it can be applied. Providing a manual you could
follow in *building* your own cardinal utility functions would
require many pages. Fortunately, such manuals are available in many
textbooks. In any case, if you are a philosophy student you may not
wish to attempt this until you've taken a course in probability
theory.

Suppose we have an agent whose ordinal utility function is known. Indeed, suppose that it's our river-crossing fugitive. Let's assign him the following ordinal utility function:

Escape ≫ 4Death by shooting ≫ 3

Death by rockfall ≫ 2

Death by snakebite ≫ 1

Now, we know that his preference for escape over *any* form of
death is likely to be stronger than his preference for, say, shooting
over snakebite. This should be reflected in his choice behaviour in
the following way. In a situation such as the river-crossing game, he
should be willing to run greater risks to increase the relative
probability of escape over shooting than he is to increase the
relative probability of shooting over snakebite. This bit of logic is
the crucial insight behind
von Neumann & Morgenstern's (1947)
solution to the cardinalization problem.

Begin by asking our agent to pick, from the available set of outcomes,
a *best* one and a *worst* one. ‘Best’ and
‘worst’ are defined in terms of rational choice: a
rational agent always chooses so as to maximize the probability of the
best outcome—call this **W**—and to minimize
the probability of the worst outcome—call this
**L**. Now consider prizes intermediate between
**W** and **L**. We find, for a set of
outcomes containing such prizes, a lottery over them such that our
agent is indifferent between that lottery and a lottery including only
**W** and **L**. In our example, this would
be a lottery having shooting and rockfall as its possible outcomes.
Call this lottery **T** . We define a utility function
*q* = *u*(**T**) such that if *q* is
the expected prize in **T** , the agent is indifferent
between winning **T** and winning a lottery in which
**W** occurs with probability
*u*(**T**) and **L** occurs with
probability
1 − *u*(**T**).

We now construct a *compound lottery* **T*** over
the outcome set {**W**, **L**} such that the
agent is indifferent between **T** and
**T***. A compound lottery is one in which the prize in
the lottery is another lottery. This makes sense because, after all,
it is still **W** and **L** that are at
stake for our agent in both cases; so we can then analyze
**T*** into a simple lottery over **W** and
**L**. Call this lottery **r**. It follows
from transitivity that **T** is equivalent to
**r**. (Note that this presupposes that our agent does
not gain utility from the complexity of her gambles.) The rational
agent will now choose the action that maximizes the probability of
winning **W**. The mapping from the set of outcomes to
*u*(**r**) is a *von Neumann-Morgenstern
utility function* (VNMuf).

What exactly have we done here? We've simply given our agent choices
over lotteries, instead of over prizes directly, and observed how much
extra risk he's willing to run to increase the chances of winning
escape over snakebite relative to getting shot or clobbered with a
rock. A VNMuf yields a *cardinal*, rather than an ordinal,
measure of utility. Our choice of endpoint-values, **W**
and **L**, is arbitrary, as before; but once these are
fixed the values of the intermediate points are determined. Therefore,
the VNMuf *does* measure the relative preference intensities of
a single agent. However, since our assignment of utility values to
**W** and **L** *is* arbitrary, we
can't use VNMufs to compare the cardinal preferences of one agent with
those of another. Furthermore, since we are using a
*risk-metric* as our measuring instrument, the construction of
the new utility function depends on assuming that our agent's
*attitude to risk itself* stays constant from one comparison of
lotteries to another. This seems reasonable for a single agent in a
single game-situation. However, two agents in one game, or one agent
under different sorts of circumstances, may display very different
attitudes to risk. Perhaps in the river-crossing game the pursuer,
whose life is not at stake, will enjoy gambling with her glory while
our fugitive is cautious. In general, a *risk-averse* agent
prefers a guaranteed prize to its equivalent expected value in a
lottery. A *risk-loving* agent has the reverse preference. A
*risk-neutral* agent is indifferent between these options. In
analyzing the river-crossing game, however, we don't *have to*
be able to compare the pursuer's cardinal utilities with the
fugitive's. Both agents, after all, can find their NE strategies if
they can estimate the probabilities each will assign to the actions of
the other. This means that each must know both VNMufs; but neither
need try to comparatively value the outcomes over which they're
gambling.

We can now fill in the rest of the matrix for the bridge-crossing game
that we started to draw in Section 2. If all that the fugitive cares
about is life and death, but not the manner of death, and if all the
hunter cares about is preventing the fugitive from escaping, then we
can now interpret both utility functions cardinally. This permits us
to assign expected utilities, expressed by multiplying the original
payoffs by the relevant probabilities, as outcomes in the matrix.
Suppose that the hunter waits at the cobra bridge with probability
*x* and at the rocky bridge with probability *y*. Since
her probabilities across the three bridges must sum to 1, this implies
that she must wait at the safe bridge with probability 1 −
(*x* + *y*). Then, continuing to assign the fugitive a
payoff of 0 if he dies and 1 if he escapes, and the hunter the reverse
payoffs, our complete matrix is as follows:

Figure 12

We can now read the following facts about the game directly from the matrix. No rows or columns strictly or weakly dominate any others. Therefore, the game's NE must be in mixed strategies.

### 3.1 Beliefs

How should we interpret the processes being modeled by computations of
NE strategy mixes in games like the river-crossing one? One possible
kind of interpretation is an * evolutionary * one. If the
hunter and the fugitive have regularly played games that structurally
*resemble* this river-crossing game, then selection pressures
will have encouraged habits in them that lead them both to play its NE
strategies *and to sincerely rationalize doing so* by means of
some satisfying story or other. If neither party has ever been in a
situation like this, and if their biological and/or cultural ancestors
haven't either, and if neither is concerned with revealing information
to opponents in expected future situations of this sort (because they
don't expect them to arise again),and if both parties aren't trained
game theorists, then their behavior should be predicted not by a game
theorist but by friends of theirs who are familiar with their personal
idiosyncrasies. Behaviorists are happy to recognize that game theory
isn't useful for modelling every possible empirical circumstance that
comes along.

However, the philosopher who wants game theory to serve as a
descriptive and/or normative theory of strategic rationality cannot
rest content with this answer. He must find a satisfying line of
advice for the players even when their game is alone in the universe
of strategic problems. No such advice can be given that is
*uncontroversially* satisfactory—behaviorists, after all,
are often behaviorists *because* they aren't satisfied by any
available approach here—but there is a way of handling the
matter that many game theorists have found worthy of detailed
pursuit. This involves the computation of *equilibria in
beliefs*.

In fact, the behaviorist needs the concept of equilibrium in beliefs too, but for different purposes. As we've seen, the concept of NE sometimes doesn't go deep enough as an analytical instrument to tell us all that we think might be important in a game. Thus even behaviorists who aren't impressed with the project of refinements might make use of the concept of subgame-perfect equilibrium (SPE), as discussed in Section 2.6, if they think they're dealing with agents who are very well informed (say, because they're in a familiar institutional setting). But now consider the three-player imperfect-information game below known as ‘Selten's horse’ (for its inventor, Nobel Laureate Reinhard Selten, and because of the shape of its tree; taken from Kreps (1990), p. 426):

Figure 13

One of the NE of this game is Lr_{2}l_{3}. This is
because if Player I plays L, then Player II playing r_{2} has
no incentive to change strategies because her only node of action, 12,
is off the path of play. But this NE seems to be purely technical; it
makes little sense as a solution. This reveals itself in the fact that
if the game beginning at node 14 could be treated as a subgame,
Lr_{2}l_{3} would not be an SPE. Whenever she
*does* get a move, Player II should play l_{2}. But if
Player II is playing l_{2} then Player I should switch to
R. In that case Player III should switch to r_{3}, sending
Player II back to r_{2}. And here's a new,
‘sensible’, NE: Rr_{2}r_{3}. I and II in
effect play ‘keepaway’ from III.

This NE is ‘sensible’ in just the same way that a SPE outcome in a perfect-information game is more sensible than other non-SPE NE. However, we can't select it by applying Zermelo's algorithm. Because nodes 13 and 14 fall inside a common information set, Selten's Horse has only one subgame (namely, the whole game). We need a ‘cousin’ concept to SPE that we can apply in cases of imperfect information, and we need a new solution procedure to replace Zermelo's algorithm for such games.

Notice what Player III in Selten's Horse is wondering about as he
selects his strategy. "Given that I get a move," he asks himself, "was
my action node reached from node 11 or from node 12?" What, in other
words, are the *conditional probabilities* that III is at node
13 or 14 given that he has a move? Now, if conditional probabilities
are what III wonders about, then what Players I and II must make
conjectures about when they select *their* strategies are III's
*beliefs* about these conditional probabilities. In that case,
I must conjecture about II's beliefs about III's beliefs, and III's
beliefs about II's beliefs and so on. The relevant beliefs here are
not merely strategic, as before, since they are not just about what
players will *do* given a set of payoffs and game structures,
but about what they think makes sense given some understanding or
other of conditional probability.

What beliefs about conditional probability is it reasonable for
players to expect from each other? The normative theorist might insist
on whatever the best mathematicians have discovered about the subject.
Clearly, however, if this is applied then a theory of games that
incorporated it would not be descriptively true of most people. The
behaviorist will insist on imposing only behavioral habits that a
process of natural selection might build into its products. Perhaps
some actual or possible creatures might observe habits that respect
*Bayes's rule*, which is the minimal true generalization about
conditional probability that an agent could know if it knows any such
generalizations at all. Adding more sophisticated knowledge about
conditional probability amounts to refining the concept of
equilibrium-in-belief, just as some game theorists like to refine NE.
You can imagine what behaviorists think of *that* project!

Here, we will restrict our attention to the least refined equilibrium-in-belief concept, that obtained when we require players to reason in accordance with Bayes's rule. Bayes's rule tells us how to compute the probability of an event F given information E (written ‘pr(F/E)’):

pr(F/E) = [pr(E/F) × pr(F)] / pr(E)

We will henceforth assume that players do not hold beliefs inconsistent with this equality.

We may now define a *sequential equilibrium*. A SE has two
parts: (1) a strategy profile § for each player, as before, and
(2) a *system of beliefs* μ for each player. μ assigns
to each information set *h* a probability distribution over the
nodes *x* in *h*, with the interpretation that these are
the beliefs of player *i*(*h*) about where in his
information set he is, given that information set *h* has been
reached. Then a sequential equilibrium is a profile of strategies
§ and a system of beliefs μ consistent with Bayes's rule such
that starting from every information set *h* in the tree player
*i*(*h*) plays optimally from then on, given that what
he believes to have transpired previously is given by μ(*h*)
and what will transpire at subsequent moves is given by §.

We now demonstrate the concept by application to Selten's
Horse. Consider again the uninteresting NE
Lr_{2}l_{3}. Suppose that Player III assigns pr(1) to
her belief that if she gets a move she is at node 13. Then Player II,
given a consistent μ(II), must believe that III will play
l_{3}, in which case her only SE strategy is l_{2}. So
although Lr_{2}l_{3} is a NE, it is not a SE. This is
of course what we want.

The use of the consistency requirement in this example is somewhat trivial, so consider now a second case (also taken from Kreps (1990), p. 429):

Figure 14

Suppose that I plays L, II plays l_{2} and III plays
l_{3}. Suppose also that μ(II) assigns pr(.3) to node
16. In that case, l_{2} is not a SE strategy for II, since
l_{2} returns an expected payoff of .3(4) + .7(2) = 2.6, while
r_{2} brings an expected payoff of 3.1. Notice that if we
fiddle the strategy profile for player III while leaving everything
else fixed, l_{2} could *become* a SE strategy for
II. If §(III) yielded a play of l_{3} with pr(.5) and
r_{3} with pr(.5), then if II plays r_{2} his expected
payoff would now be 2.2, so Ll_{2}l_{3} would be a SE.
Now imagine setting μ(III) back as it was, but change μ(II) so
that II thinks the conditional probability of being at node 16 is
greater than .5; in that case, l_{2} is again not a SE
strategy.

The idea of SE is hopefully now clear. We can apply it to the river-crossing game in a way that avoids the necessity for the hunter to flip any coins of we modify the game a bit. Suppose now that II can change bridges twice during the fugitive's passage, and will catch him just in case she meets him as he leaves the bridge. Then the hunter's SE strategy is to divide her time at the three bridges in accordance with the proportion given by the equation in the third paragraph of Section 3 above.

It must be noted that since Bayes's rule cannot be applied to events
with probability 0, its application to SE requires that players assign
non-zero probabilities to all actions available in trees. This
requirement is captured by supposing that all strategy profiles be
*strictly mixed*, that is, that every action at every
information set be taken with positive probability. You will see that
this is just equivalent to supposing that all hands sometimes tremble.
A SE is said to be *trembling-hand perfect* if all strategies
played at equilibrium are best replies to strategies that are strictly
mixed. You should also not be surprised to be told that no weakly
dominated strategy can be trembling-hand perfect, since the
possibility of trembling hands gives players the most persuasive
reason for avoiding such strategies.

## 4. Repeated Games and Coordination

So far we've restricted our attention to *one-shot* games, that
is, games in which players' strategic concerns extend no further than
the terminal nodes of their single interaction. However, games are
often played with *future* games in mind, and this can
significantly alter their outcomes and equilibrium strategies. Our
topic in this section is *repeated games*, that is, games in
which sets of players expect to face each other in similar situations
on multiple occasions. We approach these first through the limited
context of repeated prisoner's dilemmas.

We've seen that in the one-shot PD the only NE is mutual defection. This may no longer hold, however, if the players expect to meet each other again in future PDs. Imagine that four firms, all making widgets, agree to maintain high prices by jointly restricting supply. (That is, they form a cartel.) This will only work if each firm maintains its agreed production quota. Typically, each firm can maximize its profit by departing from its quota while the others observe theirs, since it then sells more units at the higher market price brought about by the almost-intact cartel. In the one-shot case, all firms would share this incentive to defect and the cartel would immediately collapse. However, the firms expect to face each other in competition for a long period. In this case, each firm knows that if it breaks the cartel agreement, the others can punish it by underpricing it for a period long enough to more than eliminate its short-term gain. Of course, the punishing firms will take short-term losses too during their period of underpricing. But these losses may be worth taking if they serve to reestablish the cartel and bring about maximum long-term prices.

One simple, and famous (but *not*, contrary to widespread
myth, necessarily optimal) strategy for preserving cooperation in
repeated PDs is called *tit-for-tat*. This strategy tells each
player to behave as follows:

- Always cooperate in the first round.
- Thereafter, take whatever action your opponent took in the previous round.

A group of players *all* playing tit-for-tat will never see any
defections. Since, in a population where others play tit-for-tat,
tit-for-tat is the rational response for each player, everyone playing
tit-for-tat is a NE. You may frequently hear people who know a
*little* (but not enough) game theory talk as if this is the end
of the story. It is not.

There are two complications. First, the players must be uncertain as to when their interaction ends. Suppose the players know when the last round comes. In that round, it will be rational for players to defect, since no punishment will be possible. Now consider the second-last round. In this round, players also face no punishment for defection, since they know they will defect in the last round anyway. So they defect in the second-last round. But this means they face no threat of punishment in the third-last round, and defect there too. We can simply iterate this backwards through the game tree until we reach the first round. Since cooperation is not rational in that round, tit-for-tat is no longer a rational strategy, and we get the same outcome—mutual defection—as in the one-shot PD. Therefore, cooperation is only possible in repeated PDs where the expected number of repetitions is indeterminate. (Of course, this does apply to many real-life games.)

But now we introduce a second complication. Suppose that players'
ability to distinguish defection from cooperation is imperfect.
Consider our case of the widget cartel. Suppose the players observe a
fall in the market price of widgets. Perhaps this is because a cartel
member cheated. Or perhaps it has resulted from an exogenous drop in
demand. If tit-for-tat players mistake the second case for the first,
they will defect, thereby setting off a chain-reaction of mutual
defections from which they can *never* recover, since every
player will reply to the first encountered defection with defection,
thereby begetting further defections, and so on.

If players know that such miscommunication is possible, they must
resort to more sophisticated strategies. In particular, they must be
prepared to sometimes risk following defections with cooperation in
order to test their inferences. However, they mustn't be *too*
forgiving, lest other players find it rationally optimal to exploit
them through deliberate defections. In general, sophisticated
strategies have a problem. Because they are more difficult for other
players to infer, their use increases the probability of
miscommunication. But miscommunication is what causes repeated-game
cooperative equilibria to unravel in the first place! The moral of this
is that PDs, even repeated ones, are very difficult to escape from.
Rational players do best trying to *avoid* situations that are
PDs, rather than relying on cunning stratagems for trying to get out of
them.

Real, complex, social and political dramas are seldom
straightforward instantiations of simple games such as PDs.
Hardin (1995)
offers an analysis of two recent, very real (and very tragic)
political cases, the Yugoslavian civil war of 1991-95, and the 1994
Rwandan genocide, as PDs that were nested inside *coordination
games*. A coordination game occurs whenever the utility of two or
more players is maximized by their doing the same thing, and where
such correspondence is more important to them than *what*, in
particular, they both do. A standard example arises with rules of the
road: ‘All drive on the left’ and ‘All drive on the
right’ are both outcomes that are NEs, and neither is more
efficient than the other. In games of ‘pure’ coordination,
it doesn't even help to use more selective equilibrium criteria. For
example, suppose that we require our players to reason in accordance
with Bayes's rule (see Section 3 above). In these circumstances, any
strategy that is a best reply to any vector of mixed strategies
available in NE is said to be *rationalizable*. That is, a
player can find a set of systems of beliefs for the other players such
that any history of the game along an equilibrium path is consistent
with that set of systems. Pure coordination games are characterized by
non-unique vectors of rationalizable strategies. In such situations,
players may try to predict equilibria by searching for *focal
points*, that is, features of some strategies that they believe
will be salient to other players, and that they believe other players
will believe to be salient to them. (For example, if two people want
to meet on a given day in a big city but can't contact each other to
arrange a specific time and place, both might sensibly go to the
city's most prominent downtown plaza at noon.) Unfortunately, in many
of the social and political games played by people (and some other
animals), the biologically shallow properties by which people sort
themselves into racial and ethnic groups serve highly efficiently as
such features. Hardin's analysis of recent genocides relies on this
fact.

According to Hardin, neither the Yugoslavian nor the Rwandan
disasters were PDs to begin with. That is, in neither situation, on
either side, did most people begin by preferring the destruction of
the other to mutual cooperation. However, the deadly logic of
coordination, deliberately abetted by self-serving politicians,
dynamically *created* PDs. Some individual Serbs (Hutus) were
encouraged to perceive their individual interests as best served
through identification with Serbian (Hutu) group-interests. That is,
they found that some of their circumstances, such as those involving
competition for jobs, had the form of coordination games. They thus
acted so as to create situations in which this was true for other
Serbs (Hutus) as well. Eventually, once enough Serbs (Hutus)
identified self-interest with group-interest, the identification
became almost universally *correct*, because (1) the most
important goal for each Serb (Hutu) was to do roughly what every other
Serb (Hutu) would, and (2) the most distinctively *Serbian*
thing to do, the doing of which permitted coordination, was to exclude
Croats (Tutsi). That is, strategies involving such exclusionary
behavior were selected as a result of having efficient focal
points. This situation made it the case that an individual—and
individually threatened—Croat's (Tutsi's) self-interest was best
maximized by coordinating on assertive Croat (Tutsi) group-identity,
which further increased pressures on Serbs (Hutus) to coordinate, and
so on. Note that it is not an aspect of this analysis to suggest that
Serbs or Hutus started things; the process could have been (even if it
wasn't in fact) perfectly reciprocal. But the outcome is ghastly:
Serbs and Croats (Hutus and Tutsis) seem progressively more
threatening to each other as they rally together for self-defense,
until both see it as imperative to preempt their rivals and strike
before being struck. If Hardin is right—and the point here is
not to claim that he *is*, but rather to point out the worldly
importance of determining which games agents are in fact
playing—then the mere presence of an external enforcer (NATO?)
would not have changed the game, pace the Hobbesian analysis, since
the enforcer could not have threatened either side with anything worse
than what each feared from the other. What was needed was
recalibration of evaluations of interests, which (arguably) happened
in Yugoslavia when the Croatian army began to decisively win, at which
point Bosnian Serbs decided that their self/group interests were best
served by the arrival of NATO peacekeepers. The Rwandan conflict,
meanwhile, drags on in the neighbouring country (the Congo) to which
military and political developments have shifted it.

Of course, it is not the case that most repeated games lead to
disasters. The biological basis of friendship in people and other
animals is probably *partly* a function of the logic of
repeated games. The importance of payoffs achievable through
cooperation in future games leads those who expect to interact in them
to be less selfish than temptation would suggest in present
games. Furthermore, cultivating shared interests and sentiments
provides networks of focal points around which coordination can be
facilitated.

## 5. Commitment

In some games, players can improve their outcomes by taking actions
that makes it impossible for them to take what would be her best
actions in the corresponding simultaneous-move games. Such actions are
referred to as *commitments*, and they can serve as
alternatives to external enforcement in games which would otherwise
settle on Pareto-inefficient equilibria.

Consider the following hypothetical example (which is *not* a
PD). Suppose you own a piece of land adjacent to mine, and I'd like to
buy it so as to expand my lot. Unfortunately, you don't want to sell
at the price I'm willing to pay. If we move simultaneously—you
post a selling price and I independently give my agent an asking
price—there will be no sale. So I might try to change your
incentives by playing an opening move in which I announce that I'll
build a putrid-smelling sewage disposal plant on my land beside yours
unless you sell, thereby lowering your price. I've now turned this
into a sequential-move game. However, this move so far changes
nothing. If you refuse to sell in the face of my threat, it is then
not in my interest to carry it out, because in damaging you I also
damage myself. Since you know this you should ignore my threat. My
threat is *incredible*, a case of cheap talk.

However, I could make my threat credible by *committing*
myself*.* I could sign a contract with some farmers promising
to supply them with treated sewage (fertilizer) from my plant, but
including an escape clause in the contract releasing me from my
obligation only if I can double my lot size and so put it to some
other use. Now my threat is credible: if you don't sell, I'm committed
to building the sewage plant. Since you know this, you now have an
incentive to sell me your land in order to escape its ruination.

This sort of case exposes one of many fundamental differences between the logic of non-parametric and parametric maximization. In parametric situations, an agent can never be made worse off by having more options. But where circumstances are non-parametric, one agent's strategy can be influenced in another's favour if options are visibly restricted. Cortez's burning of his boats (see Section 1) is, of course, an instance of this, one which serves to make the usual metaphor literal.

Another example will illustrate this, as well as the applicability of
principles across game-types. Here we will build an imaginary
situation that is not a PD—since only one player has an
incentive to defect—but which is a social dilemma insofar as its
NE in the absence of commitment is Pareto-inferior to an outcome that
is achievable *with* a commitment device. Suppose that two of
us wish to poach a rare antelope from a national park in order to sell
the trophy. One of us must flush the animal down towards the second
person, who waits in a blind to shoot it and load it onto a truck. You
promise, of course, to share the proceeds with me. However, your
promise is not credible. Once you've got the buck, you have no reason
not to drive it away and pocket the full value from it. After all, I
can't very well complain to the police without getting myself arrested
too. But now suppose I add the following opening move to the
game. Before our hunt, I rig out the truck with an alarm that can be
turned off only by punching in a code. Only I know the code. If you
try to drive off without me, the alarm will sound and we'll both get
caught. You, knowing this, now have an incentive to wait for me. What
is crucial to notice here is that you *prefer* that I rig up
the alarm, since this makes your promise to give me my share
credible. If I don't do this, leaving your promise
*in*credible, we'll be unable to agree to try the crime in the
first place, and both of us will lose our shot at the profit from
selling the trophy. Thus, you benefit from my binding you.

We may now combine our analysis of PDs and commitment devices in discussion of the application that first made game theory famous outside of the academic community. The nuclear stand-off between the superpowers during the Cold War was exhaustively studied by the first generation of game theorists, many of whom worked for the US military. (See Poundstone 1992 for historical details.) Both the USA and the USSR maintained the following policy. If one side launched a first strike, the other threatened to answer with a devastating counter-strike. This pair of reciprocal strategies, which by the late 1960s would effectively have meant blowing up the world, was known as ‘Mutually Assured Destruction’, or ‘MAD’. Game theorists objected that MAD was mad, because it set up a Prisoner's Dilemma as a result of the fact that the reciprocal threats were incredible. Suppose the USSR launches a first strike against the USA. At that point, the American President faces the following situation. His country is already destroyed. He doesn't bring it back to life by now blowing up the world, so he has no incentive to carry out his threat, which has now manifestly failed to achieve its point. Since the Russians know this, they should ignore the threat and strike first! Of course, the Americans are in exactly the same position. Each power will recognize this incentive on the part of the other, and so will anticipate an attack if they don't preempt it. What we should therefore expect, because it is the only NE of the game, is a race between the two powers to be the first to attack.

This game-theoretic analysis caused genuine consternation and fear on
both sides during the Cold War, and is reputed to have produced some
striking attempts at setting up strategic commitment devices. Some
anecdotes, for example, allege that President Nixon had the CIA try to
convince the Russians that he was insane or frequently drunk, so that
they'd believe that he'd launch a retaliatory strike even when it was
no longer in his interest to do so. Similarly, the Soviet KGB leaked
is claimed to have fabricated medical reports exaggerating Brezhnev's
senility with the same end in mind. Ultimately, the strategic symmetry
that concerned the Pentagon's analysts was complicated and perhaps
broken by changes in American missle deployment tactics. They equipped
a worldwide fleet of submarines with enough missiles to destroy the
USSR. This made the reliability of their communications network less
straightforward, and in so doing introduced an element of
strategically relevant uncertainty. The President probably could be
less sure to be able to reach the submarines and cancel their orders
to attack if any Soviet missile crossed the radar trigger line in
Northern Canada. Of course, the value of this in breaking symmetry
depended on the Russians being aware of the potential problem. In
Stanley Kubrick's classic film *Dr. Strangelove*, the world is
destroyed by accident because the Russians build a doomsday machine
that will automatically trigger a retaliatory strike regardless of
their leadership's resolve to follow through on the implicit MAD
threat *but then keep it a secret*! As a result, when an
unequivocally mad American colonel launches missiles at Russia on his
own accord, and the American President tries to convince his Soviet
counterpart that the attack was unintended, the Russian Premier
sheepishly tells him about the secret doomsday machine. Now the two
leaders can do nothing but watch in dismay as the world is blown
up—due to a game-theoretic mistake.

(A responsible discussion of the famous Cold War standoff example should note that the early game theorists were almost certainly mistaken in modeling the Cold War as a one-shot Prisoner's Dilemma in the first place. For one thing, the nuclear balancing game was enmeshed in larger games of great complexity. For another, it is far from clear that, for either superpower, annihilating the other while avoid self-annihilation was in fact the highest-ranked outcome. If it wasn't, in either or both cases, then the game wasn't a PD.)

Commitment can sometimes be secured through the value to a player of
her own *reputation*. For example, a government tempted to
negotiate with terrorists to secure the release of hostages on a
particular occasion may commit to a ‘line in the sand’
strategy for the sake of maintaining a reputation for toughness
intended to reduce terrorists' incentives to launch future attacks. A
different sort of example is provided by Qantas Airlines of Australia.
Qantas has never suffered an accident, and makes much of this in its
advertising. This means that its planes probably *are* safer
than average even if the initial advantage was merely a statistical
artifact, because the value of its ability to claim a perfect record
rises the longer it lasts, and so gives the airline continuous
incentives to incur greater costs in safety assurance.

Certain conditions must hold if reputation effects are to underwrite
commitment. First, the game must be repeated, with uncertainty as to
which round is the last one. The repeated PD can be used to illustrate
the importance of this principle. Cooperation can be the dominant
strategy in a repeated PD because a player can gain more from his
reputation for cooperation, through inducing expectations of
cooperation in others, than he can gain through defection in a single
round. However, if the players know in advance which round will be
their last, this equilibrium unravels. In the last round reputation no
longer has a value, and so both players will defect. In the
second-last round, the players know they will defect in the last
round, so reputation becomes worthless here too and they will again
defect. This makes reputation worthless in the third-last round, and
so on. The process iterates back to the first round, so no cooperation
ever occurs. This point can be generalized to state the most basic
condition on the possibility for using reputation effects as
commitment devices: the value of the reputation must be greater to its
cultivator than the value to him of sacrificing it in *any*
particular round. Thus players may establish commitment by reducing
the value of each round so that the temptation to defect in any round
never gets high enough to make it rational. For example, parties to a
contract may exchange their obligations in small increments to reduce
incentives on both sides to renege. Thus builders in construction
projects may be paid in weekly or monthly installments. Similarly, the
International Monetary Fund often dispenses loans to governments in
small tranches, thereby reducing governments' incentives to violate
loan conditions once the money is in hand; and governments may
actually prefer such arrangements in order to remove domestic
political pressure for non-compliant use.

## 6. Evolutionary Game Theory

Gintis (2000)
has recently felt justified in stating baldly that "game theory is a
universal language for the unification of the behavioral sciences."
This may seem an extraordinary thing to say, but it is entirely
plausible.
Binmore (1998,
2005a)
has modeled social history as a series of convergences on
increasingly efficient equilibria in commonly encountered transaction
games, interrupted by episodes in which some people try to shift to
new equilibria by moving off stable equilibrium paths, resulting in
periodic catastrophes. (Stalin, for example, tried to shift his
society to a set of equilibria in which people cared more about the
future industrial, military and political power of their state than
they cared about their own lives. He was not successful; however, his
efforts certainly created a situation in which, for a few decades,
many Soviet people attached far less importance to *other
people's* lives than usual.) Furthermore, applications of game
theory to behavioral topics extend well beyond the political arena.

In 1969, for example, the philosopher
David Lewis (1969)
published *Convention*, in which the conceptual framework of
game-theory was applied to one of the fundamental issues of
twentieth-century epistemology, the nature and extent of conventions
governing semantics and their relationship to the justification of
propositional beliefs. This book stands as one of the classics of
analytic philosophy, and its stock is presently rising still further
as we become more aware of the significance of the trail it
blazed. The basic insight can be captured using a simple example. The
word ‘chicken’ denotes chickens and ‘ostrich’
denotes ostriches. We would not be better or worse off if
‘chicken’ denoted ostriches and ‘ostrich’
denoted chickens; however, we *would* be worse off if half of
us used the pair of words the first way and half the second, or if all
of us randomized between them to refer to flightless birds
generally. This insight, of course, well preceded Lewis; but what he
recognized is that this situation has the logical form of a
coordination game. Thus, while particular conventions may be
arbitrary, the interactive structures that stabilize and maintain them
are not. Furthermore, the equilibria involved in coordinating on
noun-meanings appear to have an arbitrary element only because we
cannot Pareto-rank them; but
Millikan (1984)
shows implicitly that in this respect they are atypical of linguistic
coordinations. In general, the various NE in coordination games can
very often be ranked.
Ross & LaCasse (1995)
present the following example. In a city, drivers must coordinate on
one of two NE with respect to their behaviour at traffic
lights. Either all must rush yellows and pause on shifts to green, or
slow down on yellows and jump forward on shifts to green. Both
patterns are NE, in that once a community has coordinated on one of
them no individual has an incentive to deviate: those who slow down on
yellows while others are rushing them will get rear-ended, while those
who rush yellows in the other equilibrium will risk collision with
those who jump forward quickly on greens. Therefore, once a city's
traffic pattern settles on one of these equilibria it will tend to
stay there. However, the two states are not Pareto-indifferent, since
the second NE allows more cars to turn left on each cycle (in a
right-hand-drive jurisdiction), which reduces the extent of
bottlenecks and allows all drivers to expect greater efficiency in
getting about. Conventions on standards of evidence and rationality
are likely to be of this character. While various arrangements might
be NE in the social game of science, as followers of Thomas Kuhn like
to remind us, it is highly improbable that all of these lie on a
single Pareto-indifference curve. These themes, strongly represented
in contemporary epistemology, philosophy of science and philosophy of
language, are all bequests of game theory by way (at least indirectly)
of Lewis. (The reader can find a broad sample of applications, and
references to the large literature, in
Nozick (1998).)
However, Lewis restricted his attention to static game theory, in
which agents *choose* strategies given exogenously fixed
utility-functions. As a result of this restriction, his account is
able to show us why conventions are important and stable, but it
invites a difficult and perhaps ultimately fruitless quest for a
general theory of rationality. This is because, as we saw in Section 3
above, in coordination (and other) games with multiple NE, what counts
as a solution is highly sensitive to conjectures made by players about
one another's beliefs and computational ability. This has excited a
good deal of attention, especially from philosophers, on the
implications of many subtle variations in the norms of strategic
rationality. However, if game theory is to explain actual, natural
behavior and its history in the way suggested by
Gintis (2000)
above, then we need some account of what is attractive about
equilibria in games even when no analysts or rational calculators are
around to identify them. To make reference again to Lewis's topic,
when human language developed there was no external referee to care
about and arrange for Pareto-efficiency. In order to understand
Gintis's optimism about the reach of game theory, we must therefore
extend our attention to *evolutionary* games.

Game theory has been fruitfully applied in evolutionary biology,
where species and/or genes are treated as players, since pioneering
work by
Maynard Smith (1982)
and his collaborators. Evolutionary (or *dynamic*) game theory
now constitutes a significant new mathematical extension applicable to
many settings apart from the biological. Thus
Skyrms (1996)
uses evolutionary game theory to try to answer questions Lewis could
not even ask, about the conditions under which language, concepts of
justice, the notion of private property, and other non-designed,
general phenomena of interest to philosophers would be likely to
arise. What is novel about evolutionary game theory is that moves are
not chosen by rational agents. Instead, agents are typically
hard-wired with particular strategies, and success for a strategy is
defined in terms of the number of copies that a strategy will leave of
itself to play in the games of succeeding generations. The strategies
themselves are therefore the players, and the games they play are
dynamic rather than static.

The discussion here will closely follow Skyrms's. We begin by
introducing *the replicator dynamics*. Consider first how
natural selection works to change lineages of animals, modifying,
creating and destroying species. The basic mechanism is
*differential reproduction*. Any animal with *heritable*
features that increase its *expected number of offspring* in a
given environment will tend to leave more offspring than others so
long as the environment remains relatively stable. These offspring
will be more likely to inherit the features in question. Therefore,
the proportion of these features in the population will gradually
increase as generations pass. Some of these features may *go to
fixation*, that is, eventually take over the entire population
(until the environment changes).

How does game theory enter into this? Often, one of the most important aspects of an organism's environment will be the behavioural tendencies of other organisms. We can think of each lineage as ‘trying’ to maximize its reproductive fitness (= expected number of grandchildren) through finding strategies that are optimal given the strategies of other lineages. So evolutionary theory is another domain of application for non-parametric analysis.

In dynamic game theory, we no longer think of individuals as choosing
strategies as they move from one game to another. This is because our
interests are different. We're now concerned less with finding the
equilibria of single games than with discovering which equilibria are
stable, and how they will change over time. So we now model *the
strategies themselves* as playing against each other. One
strategy is ‘better’ than another if it is likely to leave
more copies of itself in the next generation, when the game will be
played again. We study the changes in distribution of strategies in
the population as the sequence of games unfolds.

For dynamic game theory, we introduce a new equilibrium concept, due
to
Maynard Smith (1982).
A set of strategies, in some particular proportion (e.g., 1/3:2/3,
1/2:1/2, 1/9:8/9, 1/3:1/3:1/6:1/6—always summing to 1) is at an
*ESS* (Evolutionary Stable Strategy) equilibrium just in case
(1) no individual playing one strategy could improve its reproductive
fitness by switching to one of the other strategies in the proportion,
and (2) no mutant playing a different strategy altogether could
establish itself (‘invade’) in the population.

The principles of evolutionary game theory are best explained through examples. Skyrms begins by investigating the conditions under which a sense of justice—understood as a disposition to view equal divisions of resources as fair unless efficiency considerations suggest otherwise in special cases—might arise. He asks us to consider a population in which individuals regularly meet each other and must bargain over resources. Begin with three types of individuals:

*Fairmen*always demand exactly half the resource.*Greedies*always demand more than half the resource. When a greedy encounters another greedy, they waste the resource in fighting over it.*Modests*always demand less than half the resource. When a modest encounters another modest, they take less than all of the available resource and waste some.

Each *single* encounter where the total demands sum to 100% is a
NE of that individual game. Similarly, there can be many dynamic
equilibria. Suppose that Greedies demand 2/3 of the resource and
Modests demand 1/3. Then the following two proportions are ESS's:

- Half the population is greedy and half is modest. We can calculate the average payoff here. Modest gets 1/3 of the resource in every encounter. Greedy gets 2/3 when she meets Modest, but nothing when she meets another Greedy. So her average payoff is also 1/3. This is an ESS because Fairman can't invade. When Fairman meets Modest he gets 1/2. But when Fairman meets Greedy he gets nothing. So his average payoff is only 1/4. No Modest has an incentive to change strategies, and neither does any Greedy. A mutant Fairman arising in the population would do worst of all, and so selection will not encourage the propagation of any such mutants.
- All players are Fairmen. Everyone always gets half the resource, and no one can do better by switching to another strategy. Greedies entering this population encounter Fairmen and get an average payoff of 0. Modests get 1/3 as before, but this is less than Fairman's payoff of 1/2.

Notice that equilibrium (i) is inefficient, since the average payoff across the whole population is smaller. However, just as inefficient outcomes can be NE of static games, so they can be ESS's of dynamic ones.

We refer to equilibria in which more than one strategy occurs as
*polymorphisms*. In general, in Skyrms's game, any polymorphism
in which Greedy demands *x* and Modest demands
1−*x* is an ESS. The question that interests the student
of justice concerns the relative likelihood with which these different
equilibria arise.

This depends entirely on the proportions of strategies in the original
population state. If the population begins with more than one Fairman,
then there is some probability that Fairmen will encounter each other,
and get the highest possible average payoff. Modests by themselves do
not inhibit the spread of Fairmen; only Greedies do. But Greedies
themselves depend on having Modests around in order to be viable. So
the more Fairmen there are in the population relative to
*pairs* of Greedies and Modests, the better Fairmen do on
average. This implies a threshold effect. If the proportion of Fairmen
drops below 33%, then the tendency will be for them to fall to
extinction because they don't meet each other often enough. If the
population of Fairmen rises above 33%, then the tendency will be for
them to rise to fixation because their extra gains when they meet each
other compensates for their losses when they meet Greedies. You can
see this by noticing that when each strategy is used by 33% of the
population, all have an expected average payoff of 1/3. Therefore, any
rise above this threshold on the part of Fairmen will tend to push
them towards fixation.

This result shows that and how, given certain relatively general
conditions, justice as we have defined it *can* arise
dynamically. The news for the fans of justice gets more cheerful still
if we introduce *correlated play*.

The model we just considered assumes that strategies are not
*correlated*, that is, that the probability with which every
strategy meets every other strategy is a simple function of their
relative frequencies in the population. We now examine what happens in
our dynamic resource-division game when we introduce correlation.
Suppose that Fairmen have a slight ability to distinguish and seek out
other Fairmen as interaction partners. In that case, Fairmen on average
do better, and this must have the effect of lowering their threshold
for going to fixation.

A dynamic-game modeler studies the effects of correlation and other
parametric constraints by means of running large computer simulations
in which the strategies compete with one another, round after round, in
the virtual environment. The starting proportions of strategies, and
any chosen degree of correlation, can simply be set in the programme.
One can then watch its dynamics unfold over time, and measure the
proportion of time it stays in any one equilibrium. These proportions
are represented by the relative sizes of the *basins of
attraction* for different possible equilibria. Equilibria are
attractor points in a dynamic space; a basin of attraction for each
such point is then the set of points in the space from which the
population will converge to the equilibrium in question.

In introducing correlation into his model, Skyrms first sets the degree of correlation at a very small .1. This causes the basin of attraction for equilibrium (i) to shrink by half. When the degree of correlation is set to .2, the polymorphic basin reduces to the point at which the population starts in the polymorphism. Thus very small increases in correlation produce large proportionate increases in the stability of the equilibrium where everyone plays Fairman. A small amount of correlation is a reasonable assumption in most populations, given that neighbours tend to interact with one another and to mimic one another (either genetically or because of tendencies to deliberately copy each other), and because genetically similar animals are more likely to live in common environments. Thus if justice can arise at all it will tend to be dominant and stable.

Much of political philosophy consists in attempts to produce deductive
normative arguments intended to convince an unjust agent that she has
reasons to act justly. Skyrms's analysis suggests a quite different
approach. Fairman will do best of all in the dynamic game if he takes
active steps to preserve correlation. Therefore, there is evolutionary
pressure for both *moral approval of justice* and *just
institutions* to arise. Most people may think that 50-50 splits
are ‘fair’, and worth maintaining by moral and
institutional reward and sanction, *because* we are the
products of a dynamic game that promoted our tendency to think this
way.

The topic that has received most attention from evolutionary game
theorists is *altruism*, defined as any behaviour by an
organism that decreases its own expected fitness in a single
interaction but increases that of the other interactor. It is common
in nature. How can it arise, however, given Darwinian competition?

Skyrms studies this question using the dynamic Prisoner's Dilemma as his example. This is simply a series of PD games played in a population, some of whose members are defectors and some of whom are cooperators. Payoffs, as always in dynamic games, are measured in terms of expected numbers of copies of each strategy in future generations.

Let **U**(*A*) be the average fitness of strategy
*A* in the population. Let **U** be the average
fitness of the whole population. Then the proportion of strategy
*A* in the next generation is just the ratio
**U**(*A*)/**U**. So if *A*
has greater fitness than the population average *A*
increases. If *A* has lower fitness than the population average
then *A* decreases.

In the dynamic PD where interaction is random (i.e., there's no correlation), defectors do better than the population average as long as there are cooperators around. This follows from the fact that, as we saw in Section 2.4, defection is always the dominant strategy in a single game. 100% defection is therefore the ESS in the dynamic game without correlation, corresponding to the NE in the one-shot static PD.

However, introducing the possibility of correlation radically changes
the picture. We now need to compute the average fitness of a strategy
*given its probability of meeting each other possible
strategy*. In the dynamic PD, cooperators whose probability of
meeting other cooperators is high do better than defectors whose
probability of meeting other defectors is high. Correlation thus
favours cooperation.

In order to be able to say something more precise about this
relationship between correlation and cooperation (and in order to be
able to relate evolutionary game theory to issues in decision theory,
a matter falling outside the scope of this article), Skyrms introduces
a new technical concept. He calls a strategy *adaptively
ratifiable* if there is a region around its fixation point in the
dynamic space such that from anywhere within that region it will go to
fixation. In the dynamic PD, both defection and cooperation are
adaptively ratifiable. The relative sizes of basins of attraction are
highly sensitive to the particular mechanisms by which correlation is
achieved. To illustrate this point, Skyrms builds several
examples.

One of Skyrms's models introduces correlation by means of a
*filter* on pairing for interaction. Suppose that in round 1 of
a dynamic PD individuals inspect each other and interact, or not,
depending on what they find. In the second and subsequent rounds, all
individuals who didn't pair in round 1 are randomly paired. In this
game, the basin of attraction for defection is large *unless*
there is a high proportion of cooperators in round one. In this case,
defectors fail to pair in round 1, then get paired mostly with each
other in round 2 and drive each other to extinction. A model which is
more interesting, because its mechanism is less artificial, does not
allow individuals to choose their partners, but requires them to
interact with those closest to them. Because of genetic relatedness
(or cultural learning by copying) individuals are more likely to
resemble their neighbours than not. If this (finite) population is
arrayed along one dimension (i.e., along a line), and both cooperators
and defectors are introduced into positions along it at random, then
we get the following dynamics. Isolated cooperators have lower
expected fitness than the surrounding defectors and are driven locally
to extinction. Members of groups of two cooperators have a 50%
probability of interacting with each other, and a 50% probability of
each interacting with a defector. As a result, their average expected
fitness remains smaller than that of their neighbouring defectors, and
they too face probable extinction. Groups of three cooperators form an
unstable point from which both extinction and expansion are equally
likely. However, in groups of four or more cooperators at least one
encounter of a cooperator with a cooperator sufficient to at least
replace the original group is guaranteed. Under this circumstance, the
cooperators as a group do better than the surrounding defectors and
increase at their expense. Eventually cooperators go *almost*
to fixation—but nor quite. Single defectors on the periphery of
the population prey on the cooperators at the ends and survive as
little ‘criminal communities’. We thus see that altruism
can not only be maintained by the dynamics of evolutionary games, but,
with correlation, can even spread and colonize originally
non-altruistic populations.

Darwinian dynamics thus offers qualified good news for cooperation.
Notice, however, that this holds only so long as individuals are stuck
with their natural or cultural programming and can't re-evaluate their
utilities for themselves. If our agents get too smart and flexible,
they may notice that they're in PDs and would each be best off
defecting. In that case, they'll eventually drive themselves to
extinction — unless they develop stable, and effective, moral
norms that work to reinforce cooperation. But, of course, these are
just what we would expect to evolve in populations of animals whose
average fitness levels are closely linked to their capacities for
successful social cooperation. Even given this, these populations will
go extinct unless they care about future generations for some
reason. But there's no rational reason as to why agents
*should* care about future generations if each new generation
wholly replaces the preceding one at each change of cohorts. For this
reason, economists use ‘overlapping generations’ models
when modeling distribution games. Individuals in generation 1 who will
last until generation 5 save resources for the generation 3
individuals with whom they'll want to cooperate; and by generation 3
the new individuals care about generation 6; and so on.

## 7. Game Theory and Behavioral Evidence

In earlier sections, we reviewed some problems that arise from treating classical (non-evolutionary) game theory as a normative theory that tells people what they ought to do if they wish to be rational in strategic situations. The difficulty, as we saw, is that there seems to be no one solution concept we can unequivocally recommend for all situations. (There is also,in extensive form games with perfect information, the problem of the paradox of backward induction.) We noted, however, that this objection doesn't apply to game theory considered as a body of mathematics that can be applied to the description of actual behavior. It is then natural to ask: has game theory indeed helped empirical researchers make new discoveries about behavior (human or otherwise)? If so, what in general has the content of these discoveries been?

In addressing these questions, an immediate epistemological issue
confronts us. There is no way of applying game theory ‘all by
itself’, independently of other modelling technologies. Using
terminology standard in the philosophy of science, one can test a
game-theoretic model of a phenomenon only in tandem with
‘auxiliary assumptions’ about the phenomenon in
question. At least, this follows if one is strict about treating game
theory purely as mathematics, with no empirical content of its own. In
one sense, a theory with no empirical content is never open to testing
at all; one can only worry about whether the axioms on which the
theory is based are mutually consistent. A mathematical theory can
nevertheless be evaluated with respect to empirical
*usefulness*. One kind of philosophical criticism that has
sometimes been made of game theory, interpreted as a mathematical tool
for modelling behavioral phenomena, is that its application always or
usually requires resort to false, misleading or badly simplistic
assumptions about those phenomena. We would expect this criticism to
have different degrees of force in different contexts of application,
as the auxiliary assumptions vary.

So matters turn out. There is no interesting domain in which applications of game theory have been completely uncontroversial. However, there has been generally easier consensus on how to use game theory (both classical and evolutionary) to understand non-human animal behavior than on how to deploy it for explanation and prediction of people. Let us first briefly consider philosophical and methodological issues that have arisen around application of game theory in non-human biology, before devoting fuller attention to game-theoretic social science.

The least controversial game-theoretic modelling has been that applying the classical form of the theory to consideration of strategies by which non-human animals seek to acquire the basic resource relevant to their evolutionary tournament: opportunities to produce offspring that are themselves likely to reproduce. In order to thereby maximize their expected fitness, animals must find optimal trade-offs among various intermediate goods, such as nutrition, security from predation and ability to out-compete rivals for mates. Efficient trade-off points among these goods can often be estimated for particular species in particular environmental circumstances, and, on the basis of these estimations, both parametric and non-parametric equilibria can be derived. Models of this sort have an impressive track record in predicting and explaining independent empirical data on such strategic phenomena as competitive foraging, mate selection, nepotism, sibling rivalry,herding, collective anti-predator vigilance and signaling, reciprocal grooming, and interspecific mutuality (symbiosis). (For examples see Krebs and Davies 1984, Bell 1991, Dugatkin and Reeve 1998, Dukas 1998, and Noe, van Hoof and Hammerstein 2001.)

Why has classical game theory helped to predict non-human animal
behavior more straightforwardly than it has done most human behavior?
The answer must lie in different levels of complication amongst the
relationships between auxiliary assumptions and phenomena.
Ross (2005a)
offers the following account. Utility-maximization and
fitness-maximization problems are the domain of economics. Economic
theory identifies the maximizing units — agents — with
unchanging preference fields. Identification of whole biological
individuals with such agents is more plausible the less cognitively
sophisticated the organism. Thus insects (for example) are tailor-made
for easy application of Revealed Preference Theory (see
Section 2.1).
As nervous systems become more complex, however, we encounter animals
that learn. Learning can cause a sufficient degree of permanent
modification in an animal's behavioral patterns that we can preserve
the identification of the biological individual with a single agent
across the modification only at the cost of explanatory emptiness
(because assignments of utility functions become increasingly ad
hoc). Furthermore, increasing complexity confounds simple modeling on
a second dimension: cognitively sophisticated animals not only reverse
their preferences over time, but are governed by distributed control
processes that make them sites of competition among *internal*
agents
(Schelling 1980;
Ainslie 1992,
Ainslie 2001).
Thus they are not straightforward economic agents even *at* a
time. There is of course no sudden crossing point at which an animal
becomes too cognitively sophisticated to be modeled as a single agent,
and for all animals (including humans) there are contexts in which we
can usefully ignore the synchronic dimension of complexity. However,
we encounter a phase shift in modeling dynamics when we turn from
asocial animals to non-eusocial social ones. (That is, animals that
are social but that don't, like ants, bees, wasps, termites and naked
mole rats, achieve cooperation thanks to fundamental changes in their
population genetics that make individuals within groups into near
clones. Main known instances are parrots, corvids, bats, rats,
canines, hyenas, pigs, weasels, elephants, hyraxes, cetacians, and
primates.) In their cases stabilization of internal control dynamics
is partly located *outside* the individuals, at the level of
group dynamics. With these creatures, modeling an individual as an
agent, with a single comprehensive utility function, is a drastic
idealization, which can only be done with the greatest methodological
caution and attention to specific contextual factors relevant to the
particular modeling exercise. Applications of game theory here can
only be empirically adequate to the extent that the economic modeling
is empirically adequate. *H. sapiens* is the extreme case in
this respect. Individual humans are socially controlled to a degree
unknown in any other non-eusocial species. At the same time, their
great cognitive plasticity allows them to vary significantly between
cultures. People are thus the least straightforward economic agents
among all organisms. (It might thus be thought ironic that they were
taken, originally and for many years, to be the exemplary instances of
economic agency.) We will consider the implications of this for
applications of game theory in a moment.

First, however, comments are in order concerning the empirical
adequacy of *evolutionary* game theory to explain and predict
distributions of strategic dispositions in populations of agents. Such
modeling is applied both to animals as products of natural selection
(Hofbauer and Sigmund 1998),
and to non-eusocial social animals (but especially humans) as
products of cultural selection
(Young 1998).
There are two main kinds of auxiliary assumptions one must justify,
relative to a particular instance at hand, in constructing such
applications. First, one must have grounds for confidence that the
dispositions one seeks to explain are (either biological or cultural,
as the case may be) *adaptations* — that is, dispositions
that were selected and are maintained because of the way in which they
promote their own fitness or the fitness of the wider system, rather
than being accidents or structurally inevitable byproducts of other
adaptations.
(See Dennett 1995
for a general discussion of this issue.) Second, one must be able to
set the modeling enterprise in the context of a justified set of
assumptions about interrelationships among nested evolutionary
processes on different time scales. (For example, in the case of a
species with cultural dynamics, how does slow genetic evolution
constrain fast cultural evolution? How does cultural evolution feed
back into genetic evolution, if it feeds back at all?) Conflicting
views over which such assumptions should be made about human evolution
are the basis for lively current disputes in the evolutionary
game-theoretic modeling of human behavioral dispositions and
institutions. This is where issues in evolutionary game theory meet
issues in the booming field of *behavioral-experimental* game
theory. I will therefore first describe the second field before
closing the present article by giving a sense of the controversies
just alluded to, which now constitute the liveliest domain of
philosophical argument in the foundations of game theory and its
applications.

### 7.1 Game Theory in the Laboratory

Economists have been testing theories by running laboratory experiments with human and other animal subjects since pioneering work by Thurstone (1931). In recent decades, the volume of such work has become positively gigantic. The vast majority of it sets subjects in microeconomic problem environments that are imperfectly competitive. Since this is precisely the condition in which microeconomics collapses into game theory, most experimental economics has been experimental game theory. It is thus difficult to distinguish between experimentally motivated questions about the empirical adequacy of microeconomic theory and questions about the empirical adequacy of game theory.

We can here give only a broad overview of an enormous and complicated
literature. Readers are referred to outstanding surveys in
Kagel and Roth (1995),
Camerer (2003),
Samuelson (2005), and
Guala (2005).
A useful high-level principle for sorting the literature indexes it
to the different auxiliary assumptions with which game-theoretic
axioms are applied. It is often said in popular presentations (e.g.,
Ormerod 1994)
that the experimental data generally refute the hypothesis that
people are rational economic agents. Such claims are too imprecise to
be sustainable interpretations of the results. All data are consistent
with the view that people are *approximate* economic agents, at
least for stretches of time long enough to permit game-theoretic
analysis of particular scenarios, in the minimal sense that their
behavior can be modeled compatibly with Revealed Preference Theory
(see Section 2.1).
However, RPT makes so little in the way of empirical demands that
this is not nearly as surprising as many non-economists suppose
(Ross (2005a).
What is really at issue in many of the debates around the general
interpretation of experimental evidence is the extent to which people
are maximizers of expected utility. As we saw in
Section 3,
expected utility theory (EUT) is generally applied in tandem with
game theory in order to model situations involving uncertainty —
which is to say, most situations of interest in behavioral
science. However, a variety of alternative mathematical accounts of
maximization lend themselves to Von Neumann-Morgenstern
cardinalization of utility; and the empirical adequacy of game theory
would be called into question only if we thought that people's
behavior is not generally describable by means of cardinal VNMufs on a
suitably liberal interpretation of these (i.e., as opposed to a narrow
interpretation in which VNM utility is defined strictly in terms of
EUT).

What the experimental literature truly appears to show is a world of behavior that is very ‘messy’ from the theorist's point of view. That is, there is no single family of maximization functions such that people act so as to maximize a member of that family in all circumstances. Faced with well-learned problems in contexts that are not unduly demanding, people often behave like expected utility maximizers. (See, for example, the so-called ‘continuous double auction’ experiments discussed in Plott and Smith 1978 and Smith 1962, 1964, 1965, 1976, 1982). As a result, classical game theory can be used in such domains with high reliability to predict behavior and implement public policy, as is demonstrated by the dozens of extremely successful government auctions of utilities and other assets designed by game theorists to increase public revenue (Binmore and Klemperer 2002). In other contexts, interpreting people's behavior as expected-utility maximizing requires undue violence to the principle of parsimony in theory construction. We get better prediction using fewer assumptions if we suppose that subjects are maximizing according to one of several alternatives (which will not be described here because they are not directly about game theory): a version of prospect theory (Kahneman and Tversky 1979), or alpha-nu utility theory (Chew and MacCrimmon 1979), or expected utility theory with rank-dependent probabilities (Quiggin 1982, Yaari 1987). In general, in testing the empirical usefulness (for studying humans) of game theory in conjunction with some theory of the target of maximization, it is more often the latter than the former that is adjusted to special cases.

A more serious threat to the usefulness of game theory is evidence of
systematic reversal of preferences, in both humans and other
animals. This is more serious both because it extends beyond the human
case, and because it challenges Revealed Preference Theory (RPT)
rather than just EUT. As explained in
Section 2.1,
RPT, unlike EUT, is among the axiomatic foundations of game theory
interpreted behavioristically. (Not all writers agree that apparent
preference reversal phenomena threaten RPT rather than EUT; but see
the discussions in
Camerer (1995), pp. 660-665, and
Ross (2005a), pp. 177-181.)
A basis for preference reversals that seems to be ubiquitous in
animals with brains is *hyperbolic discounting of the future*
(Strotz 1956,
Ainslie 1992).
This is the phenomenon whereby agents discount future rewards more
steeply in middle temporal distances from the reference point than in
close temporal contiguity or in the more remote offing. This is best
understood by contrast with the idea found in most traditional
economic models of *exponential* discounting, in which there is
a linear relationship between the rate of change in the distance to a
payoff the rate at which the value of the payoff from the reference
point declines. The figure below shows exponential and hyperbolic
curves for the same interval from a reference point to a future
payoff. The bottom one graphs the hyperbolic function; the bowed shape
results from the change in the rate of discounting.

Figure 15

A result of this is that, as middle-distance prospects become immediate prospects, people and other animals will sometimes spend resources undoing the consequences of previous actions that also cost them resources. For example: deciding today whether to mark a pile of undergraduate essays or watch a baseball game, I procrastinate, despite knowing that by doing so I put out of reach some even more fun possibility that might come up for tomorrow (when there's an equally attractive ball game on if the better option doesn't arise). So far, this is consistent with rational preference: if the world might end tonight, with a tiny but nonzero probability, then there's some level of risk aversion at which I'd rather leave the essays unmarked. The figure below compares two exponential discount curves, the lower one for the value of the game I watch before finishing my marking, and the higher one for the more valuable game I enjoy after completing the job. Both have higher value from the reference point the closer they are to it; but the curves do not cross, so my revealed preferences are consistent over time no matter how impatient I might be.

Figure 16

However, if I bind myself against procrastination by buying a ticket for tomorrow's game, when in the absence of the awful task I wouldn't have done so, then I've violated intertemporal preference consistency. More vividly, had I been in a position to choose last week whether to procrastinate today, I'd have chosen not to. In this case, my discount curve drawn from the reference point of last week crosses the curve drawn from the perspective of today, and my preferences reverse. The figure below shows this situation.

Figure 17

This phenomenon complicates applications of classical game theory to
intelligent animals. However, it clearly doesn't vitiate it
altogether, since people (and other animals) often *don't*
reverse their preferences. (If this weren't true, the successful
auction models and other s-called ‘mechanism designs’ would be
mysterious.) Interestingly, the leading theories that aim to explain
why hyperbolic discounters often behave in accordance with RPT
themselves appeal to game theoretic principles.
Ainslie (1992,
2001)
has produced an account of people as communities of internal
bargaining interests, in which subunits based on short-term,
medium-term and long-term interests face conflict that they must
resolve because if they don't, and instead generate an internal
Hobbesian breakdown
(Section 1),
outside agents who avoid the Hobbesian outcome will ruin them
all. The device of the Hobbesian tyrant is unavailable to the
brain. Therefore, its behavior (when system-level insanity is avoided)
is a sequence of self-enforcing equilibria of the sort studied by
game-theoretic public choice literature on coalitional bargaining in
democratic legislatures. That is, the internal politics of the brain
consists in ‘logrolling’
(Stratmann 1997).
These internal dynamics are then partly regulated and stabilized by
the wider social games in which coalitions (people as wholes over
temporal subparts of their biographies) are embedded
(Ross 2005a ,
pp. 334-353). (For example: social expectations about someone's role
as a salesperson set behavioral equilibrium targets for the logrolling
processes in their brain.) This explains why it is in the context of
stable institutions with relatively transparent rules that people most
resemble straightforward economic agents like insects, and that
classical game theory finds reliable application to them as entire
units.

### 7.2 Neuroeconomics and Game Theory

The idea that game theory can thus find a novel application to the
internal dynamics of brains has been developed from independent
motivations by the new research program known as
*neuroeconomics*
(Montague and Berns 2002,
Glimcher 2003,
Ross 2005a, pp. 320-334,
Camerer, Loewenstein and Prelec 2005).
Thanks to new non-invasive scanning technologies, especially
functional magnetic resonance imaging (fMRI), it has recently become
possible to study synaptic activity in working brains while they
respond to controlled cues. This has allowed direct monitoring access
to the brain's computation of expected values of rewards, which are
(naturally) taken to play a crucial role in determining
behavior. Economic theory is used to frame the derivation of the
functions maximized by synaptic-level computation of these expected
values; hence the name ‘neuroeconomics’.

Game theory plays a leading role in neuroeconomics at two levels. First, game theory has been used to predict the computations that individual neurons and groups of neurons serving the reward system must perform. In the best publicized example, Glimcher (2003) and colleagues have fMRI-scanned monkeys they had trained to play so-called ‘inspection games’ against computers. In an inspection game, one player faces a series of choices either to work for a reward, in which case he is sure to receive it, or to perform another, easier action ("shirking"), in which case he will receive the reward only if the other player (the "inspector") is not monitoring him. Assume that the first player's (the "worker's") behavior reveals a utility function bounded on each end as follows: he will work on every occasion if the inspector always monitors and he will shirk on every occasion if the inspector never monitors. The inspector prefers to obtain the highest possible amount of work for the lowest possible monitoring rate, thus deriving profits from her private information. In this game, the only Nash equilibria (NE) for both players are in mixed strategies, since any pattern in one player's strategy that can be detected by the other can be exploited. For any given pair of specific utility functions for the two players meeting the constraints described above, any pair of strategies in which, on each trial, either the worker is indifferent between working and shirking or the inspector is indifferent between monitoring and not monitoring, is a NE.

Applying inspection game analyses to pairs or groups of agents
requires us to have *either* independently justified their
utility functions over all variables relevant to their play, in which
case we can define NE and then test to see whether they successfully
maximize expected utility; *or* to assume that they maximize
expected utility, or obey some other rule such as a matching function,
and then infer their utility functions from their behavior. Either
such procedure can be sensible in different empirical contexts. But
epistemological leverage increases greatly if the utility function of
the inspector is exogenously determined, as it often is. (Police
implementing random roadside inspections to catch drunk drivers, for
example, typically have a maximum incidence of drunk driving assigned
to them as a target by policy, and an exogenously set budget. These
determine their utility function, given a distibution of preferences
and attitudes to risk among the population of drivers.) In the case of
Glimcher's experiments the inspector is a computer, so its program is
under experimental control and its side of the payoff matrix is
known. Proxies for the subjects' expected utility, in this case
squirts of fruit juice for the monkeys, can be antecedently determined
in parametric test settings. The computer is then programmed with the
economic model of the monkeys, and can search the data in their
behavior in game conditions for exploitable patterns, varying its
strategy accordingly. With these variables fixed,
expected-utility-maximizing NE behavior by the monkeys can be
calculated and tested by manipulating the computer's utility function
in various runs of the game.

Monkey behavior after training tracks NE very robustly (as does the behavior of people playing similar games for monetary prizes; Glimcher 2003, pp. 307-308). Working with trained monkeys, Glimcher and colleagues could perform the experiments of significance here. Working and shirking behaviors for the monkeys had been associated by their training with staring either to the right or to the left on a visual display. In earlier experiments, Platt and Glimcher (1999) had established that, in parametric settings, as juice rewards varied from one block of trials to another, firing rates of each parietal neuron that controls eye movements could be trained to encode the expected utility to the monkey of each possible movement relative to the expected utility of the alternative movement. Thus "movements that were worth 0.4 ml of juice were represented twice as strongly [in neural firing probabilities] as movements worth 0.2 ml of juice" (p. 314). Unsurprisingly, when amounts of juice rewarded for each movement were varied from one block of trials to another, firing rates also varied.

Against this background, Glimcher and colleagues could investigate the way in which monkeys' brains implemented the tracking of NE. When the monkeys played the inspection game against the computer, the target associated with shirking could be set at the optimal location, given the prior training, for a specific neuron under study, while the work target would appear at a null location. This permitted Glimcher to test the answer to the following question: did the monkeys maintain NE in the game by keeping the firing rate of the neuron constant while the actual and optimal behavior of the monkey as a whole varied? The data robustly gave the answer ‘yes’. Glimcher reasonably interprets these data as suggesting that neural firing rates, at least in this cortical region for this task, encode expected utility in both parametric and nonparametric settings. Here is a vindication of the empirical applicability of classical game theory in a context independent of institutions or social conventions.

Further analysis pushed the hypothesis deeper. The computer playing Inspector was presented with the same sequence of outcomes as its monkey opponent had received on the previous day's play, and for each move was asked to assess the relative expected values of the shirking and working actions available on the next move. Glimcher reports a positive correlation (though unfortunately does not indicate the strength coefficient) between small fluctuations around the stable NE firing rates in the individual neuron and the expected values estimated by the computer trying to track the same NE. Glimcher comments on this finding as follows:

The neurons seemed to be reflecting, on a play-by-play basis, a computation close to the one performed by our computer … [A]t a … [relatively] … microscopic scale, we were able to use game theory to begin to describe the decision-by-decision computations that the neurons in area LIP were performing. (Glimcher 2003, p. 317)

Thus we find game theory reaching beyond its traditional role as a
technology for framing high-level constraints on evolutionary dynamics
or on behavior by well-informed agents operating in institutional
straightjackets. In Glimcher's hands, it is used to directly model
activity in a monkey's brain.
Ross (2005a)
argues that groups of neurons thus modeled should not be identified
with the sub-personal game-playing units found in Ainslie's theory of
intra-personal bargaining described earlier; that would involve a kind
of straightforward reduction that experience in the behavioral and
life science has taught us not to expect. However, we can and should
expect game-theoretic models of the brain to yield crucial ‘bottom-up'
constraints on the *information* we hypothesize as available to
the more abstract sub-personal agents when we model *their*
games.

We have now seen the first level at which neuroeconomics applies game theory. A second level arises thanks to new research methodology developed by Read Montague's team centered at Baylor College of Medicine. As described earlier in this section, the majority of work in experimental/behavioral economics has involved studying subjects while they play games. Initial technical constraints imposed by the fMRI technology prevented these experiments from being replicable under scanning conditions. The problem is that the brain doesn't necessarily (or even typically) perform the same task using exactly the same neural resources from one occasion to the next. One thus cannot simply aggregate independent observations under generalizations that link types of behavior and their exact neural signatures. That is, one cannot first scan a subject playing one strategic position in a game, then scan a person in the next strategic position in a repetition of the game, and so on iteratively, all with a view to assembling a post hoc picture of the brains in interaction. Rather, the interaction itself must be directly scanned if one wants an aggregated neural image of a game. However, only one person at a time fits without extreme discomfort into a scanning capsule. Montague and colleagues have addressed this problem by developing what they call ‘hyperscanning’ software that allows two computers linked to separate scanners to jointly calibrate the data. Since the computers need only be virtually linked, this allows researchers to run experimental games with geographically separated subjects under scanning. Thirty years worth of results in experimental game theory thus stand waiting for re-interpretation under the discipline of a powerful new dimension of empirical measurement. Where formerly we could only conjecture up to the limits of behavioral discrimination which strategies agents implemented under various game conditions, we now look forward to the prospect of literally watching strategic computations as they are carried out.

An early instance of this kind of work is
King-Casas *et al*. (2005).
They took a standard protocol from behavioral game theory, the
so-called ‘trust’ game, and implemented it with subjects
under hyper-scanning. This game involves two players. In its repeated
format as used in the King-Casas *et al*. experiment, the first
player is designated the ‘investor’ and the second the
‘trustee’. The investor begins with $20, of which she can
keep any portion of her choice while investing the remainder with the
trustee. In the trustee's hands the invested amount is tripled by the
experimenter. The trustee may then return as much or as little of this
profit to the investor as he deems fit. The procedure is run for ten
rounds, with players' identities kept anonymous from one another.

This game has an infinite number of NE. Previous data from behavioral
economics are consistent with the claim that the modal NE in human
play *approximates* both players using
‘Tit-for-tat’ strategies (see
Section 4)
modified by occasional defections to probe for information, and some
post-defection cooperation that manifests (limited) toleration of such
probes. This is a very weak result, since it is compatible with a wide
range of hypotheses on exactly which variations of Tit-for-tat are
used and sustained, and thus licenses no inferences about potential
dynamics under different learning conditions, institutions, or
cross-cultural transfers.

When they ran this game under hyperscanning, the King-Casas and Montague group obtained the following results. Neurons in the trustee's caudate nucleus (generally thought to implement computations or outputs of midbrain dopaminergic systems)showed strong response when investors benevolently reciprocated trust — that is, responded to defection with increased generosity. As the game progressed, these responses shifted from being reactionary to being anticipatory. Thus reputational profiles as predicted by classical game-theoretic models were observed being constructed directly by the brain. A further aspect of play not predictable by theoretical modeling alone, and which purely behavioral observation had not been sufficient to discriminate, is that responses by the caudate neurons to malevolent reciprocity — reduced generosity in response to cooperation — were significantly smaller in amplitude. This may be the mechanism by which the brain implements modification of Tit-for-tat so as to prevent occasional defections for informational probing from unravelling cooperation permanently. The fact that these differences in response levels can be quantitatively measured suggest that, once more data from variations (including cross-cultural variations) on the experiment are in hand, we may come to know in detail which strategies people are disposed use in trust games under different conditions. As noted previously, purely behavioral evidence underdetermines this knowledge, merely ruling out strategies inconsistent with observed equilibria. The group has since replicated the experiment with subjects suffering from so-called ‘borderline personality disorder.’ The research community looks forward to publication of these results, which promise to advance our understanding of both the physical basis of psychopathology and the more general empirical conditions for sociality in humans (and perhaps other animals).

The truly revolutionary advance in understanding promised by this sort
of investigation mainly consists not in what it tells us about
particular types of games, but rather in comparative inferences it
facilitates about the ways in which contextual framing influences
people's conjectures about which games they're playing. fMRI probes
enable us to quantitatively estimate degrees of strategic
*surprise*. This is a highly portentous new source of leverage
for the empirical application of game theory. Note that reciprocally
interacting expectations about surprise may themselves be subject to
strategic manipulation, but this is an idea that has barely begun to
be theoretically explored by game theorists (see
Ross and Dumouchel 2004).
That we now have the prospect of empirically testing such new
theories, as opposed to just hypothetically modeling them, should
greatly stimulate their development.

### 7.3 Game Theoretic Models of Human Nature

This brings us right up to the moving frontier of experimental /
behavioral applications of classical game theory. We can now return to
the branch point left off several paragraphs back, where this stream
of investigation meets that coming from evolutionary game
theory. There is no serious doubt that, by comparison to other
non-euscial animals —including our nearest relatives,
chimpanzees and bonobos — humans achieve prodigious feats of
coordination (see
Section 4)
(Tomasello *et al*. 2004).
A lively controversy, with important philosophical implications and
fought on both sides with game-theoretic arguments, currently rages
over the question of whether this capacity can be wholly explained by
cultural adaptation, or is better explained by inference to a genetic
change early in the career of *H. sapiens*.

Henrich *et al*.
(2004,
2005)
have run a series of experimental games with populations drawn from
fifteen small-scale human societies in South America, Africa, and
Asia, including three groups of foragers, six groups of slash-and-burn
horticulturists, four groups of nomadic herders, and two groups of
small-scale agriculturists. The games (Ultimatum, Dictator, Public
Goods) they implemented all place subjects in situations broadly
resembling that of the Trust game discussed earlier in this
section. That is, Ultimatum and Public Goods games are scenarios in
which social welfare can be maximized, and each individual's welfare
maximized (Pareto efficiency achieved) if and only if at least some
players use strategies that are not sub-game perfect equilibrium
strategies (see
Section 2.6).
In Dictator games, a narrowly selfish first mover would capture all
available profits. Thus in each of the three game types, SPE players
who cared only about their own monetary welfare would get outcomes
that would involve massively inegalitarian payoffs. In none of the
societies studied by Henrich *et al*. (or any other society in
which games of this sort have been run) are such outcomes
observed. The players whose roles are such that they would take away
all but epsilon of the monetary profits if they and their partners
played SPE always offered the partners substantially more than
epsilon, and even then partners sometimes refused such offers at the
cost of receiving no money. Furthermore, unlike the traditional
subjects of experimental economics — university students in
industrialized countries — Henrich *et al*.'s subjects
did not even play *Nash* equilibrium strategies with respect to
monetary payoffs. (That is, strategically advantaged players offered
larger profit splits to strategically disadvantaged ones than was
necessary to induce agreement to their offers.) Henrich *et
al*. interpret these results by saying that all actual people,
unlike ‘rational economic man’, value egalitarian outcomes
to some extent. However, their experiments also show that this extent
varies significantly with culture, and is correlated with variations
in two specific cultural variables: typical payoffs to cooperation
(the extent to which economic life in the society depends on
cooperation with non-immediate kin) and aggregate market integration
(a construct built out of independently measured degrees of social
complexity, anonymity, privacy, and settlement size). As the values of
these two variables increase, game behavior shifts (weakly) in the
direction of Nash equilibrium play. Thus the researchers conclude that
people are genetically endowed with a preference for egalitarianism,
but that the relative weight of this preference is programmable by
social learning processes conditioned on local cultural cues.

In evaluating Henrich *et al*.'s interpretation of the data, we
should first note that the axioms defining ‘rational economic
man’, which are incorporated into game theory in the way
discussed in
Section 2.1,
do not include the property of selfishness. (See
Ross (2005a) ch. 4;
Binmore (2005b);
and any economics or game theory text that lets the mathematics do
the talking and doesn't insist on ‘spinning’ it in one
idealogical direction or another.) Orthodox game theory thus does not
predict that people will play SPE or NE strategies derived by treating
monetary payoffs as equivalent to utility.
Binmore (2005b)
is therefore justified in taking Henrich *et al*. to task over
their fashionable rhetoric suggesting that their empirical work
embarrasses orthodox theory. It does not.

This is not to suggest that the anthropological interpretation of the
empirical results should be taken as uncontroversial.
Binmore (1994,
1998,
2005a,
2005b)
has argued for many years, based on a wide range of behavioral data,
that when people play games with non-relatives they tend to learn to
play Nash equilibrium with respect to utility functions that
approximately correspond to income functions. As he points out in
Binmore (2005b),
Henrich *et al*.'s data do not test this hypothesis for their
small-scale societies, because their subjects were not exposed to the
test games for the (quite long, in the case of the Ultimatum game)
learning period that theoretical and computational models suggest are
required for people to converge on NE. When people play unfamiliar
games, they tend to model them by reference to games they are used to
in everyday experience. In particular, they tend to play one-shot
laboratory games as though they were familiar *repeated* games,
since one-shot games are rare in normal social life outside of special
institutional contexts. Many of the interpretive remarks made by
Henrich *et al*. are consistent with this hypothesis concerning
their subjects (though they explicitly reject the hypothesis
itself). What is controversial here — the issues of spin around
‘orthodox' theory aside — is less about what the
particular subjects in this experiment were doing than about what
their behavior should lead us to infer about human evolution.

Gintis (2004) argues that data of the sort we
have been discussing support the following conjecture about human
evolution. Our ancestors were pure maximizers of individual
fitness. Somewhere along the evolutionary line these ancestors arrived
in circumstances where enough of them maximized their individual
fitness by maximizing that of their group
(Sober and Wilson 1998)
that a genetic modification went to fixation in the species: we
developed preferences not just over our own welfare, but over the
relative welfare of all members of our communities, indexed to social
norms *programmable* in each individual by cultural
learning. Thus the contemporary researcher applying game theory to
model a social situation is advised to unearth her subjects' utility
functions by (i) finding out what community (or communities) they are
members of, and then (ii) inferring the utility function(s) programmed
into members of that community (communities) by studying
representatives of each relevant community in a range of games and
assuming that the outcomes are Nash equilibria. Since the utility
functions are the dependent variables here, the games must be
independently determined. We can typically hold at least the strategic
forms of the relevant games fixed, Gintis supposes, by virtue of (a)
our confidence that people prefer egalitarian outcomes, all else being
equal, to inegalitarian ones within the culturally evolved ‘insider
groups’ to which they perceive themselves as belonging and (b) a
requirement that the games have Nash equilibria drawn from stable
attractors in plausible evolutionary game-theoretic models of the
culture's historical dynamics.

Requirement (b) as a constraint on game-theoretic modeling of general
human strategic dispositions is no longer very controversial —
or, at least, is no more controversial than the generic adaptationism
in evolutionary anthropology of which it is one expression. However,
many commentators are skeptical of Gintis's suggestion that there was
a genetic discontinuity in the evolution of human sociality. (For a
cognitive-evolutionary anthropology that explicitly denies such
discontinuity, see
Sterelny 2004.)
Based partly on such skepticism (but more directly on behavioral
data)
Binmore (2005a,
2005b)
resists modeling people as having built-in preferences for
egalitarianism. According to
Binmore's (1994,
1998,
2005a)
model,the basic class of strategic problems facing non-eusocial
social animals are coordination games. Human communities evolve
cultural norms to select equilibria in these games, and many of these
equilibria will be compatible with high levels of apparently
altruistic behavior in some (but not all) games. Binmore argues that
people adapt their conceptions of fairness to whatever happen to be
their locally prevailing equilibrium selection rules. However, he
maintains that the *dynamic* development of such norms must be
compatible, in the long run, with bargaining equilibria among
self-regarding individuals. Indeed, he argues that as societies evolve
institutions that encourage what Henrich *et al*. call
aggregate market integration (discussed above), their utility
functions and social norms tend to converge on self-regarding economic
rationality with respect to welfare. This does not mean that Binmore
is pessimistic about the prospects for egalitarianism: he develops a
model showing that societies of rational bargainers can be pulled
naturally along dynamically stable equilibrium paths towards norms of
distribution corresponding to Rawlsian justice
(Rawls 1971).
The principal barriers to such evolution, according to Binmore, are
precisely the kinds of other-regarding preferences that conservatives
valorize as a way of discouraging examination of more egalitarian
bargaining equilibria that are within reach along societies'
equilibrium paths.

Resolution of this debate between Gintis and Binmore fortunately need
not wait upon discoveries about the deep human evolutionary past that
we may never have. The models make rival empirical predictions of some
testable phenomena. If Gintis is right then there are limits, imposed
by the discontinuity in hominid evolution, on the extent to which
people can learn to be self-regarding. This is the main significance
of the controversy discussed above over Henrich *et al*.'s
interpretation of their field data. Binmore's model of social
equilibrium selection also depends, unlike Gintis's, on widespread
dispositions among people to inflict second-order punishment on
members of society who fail to sanction violators of social norms.
Gintis (2005)
shows using a game theory model that this is implausible if
punishment costs are significant. However,
Ross (2005b)
argues that the widespread assumption in the literature that
punishment of norm-violation must be costly results from failure to
adequately distinguish between models of the original evolution of
sociality, on the one hand, and models of the maintenance and
development of norms and institutions once an initial set of them has
stabilized. Finally, Ross also points out that Binmore's objectives
are as much normative as descriptive: he aims to show egalitarians how
to diagnose the errors in conservative rationalisations of the status
quo without calling for revolutions that put equilibrium path
stability (and, therefore, social welfare) at risk. It is a sound
principle in constructing reform proposals that they should be
‘knave-proof’ (as Hume put it), that is, should be
compatible with less altruism than *might* prevail in
people. Thus, despite the fact that the majority of researchers
working on game-theoretic foundations of social organization presently
appear to side with Gintis and the other members of the Henrich *et
al*. team, Binmore's alternative model has some strong
considerations in its favor. Here, then, is another issue along the
frontier of game theory application awaiting resolution in the years
to come.

An enormous range of further applications of both static and dynamic game theory have been developed, but we have hopefully now provided enough to convince the reader of the tremendous utility of this analytical tool. The reader whose appetite for more has been aroused should find that she now has sufficient grasp of fundamentals to be able to work through the large literature, of which some highlights are listed below.

## Bibliography

### Annotations

In the following section, books and articles which no one seriously interested in game theory can afford to miss are marked with (**).

The most accessible textbook that covers all of the main branches of game theory is Dixit and Skeath (1999). A student entirely new to the field should work through this before moving on to anything else.

Game theory has countless applications, of which this article has been able to suggest only a few. Readers in search of more, but not wishing to immerse themselves in mathematics, can find a number of good sources. Dixit and Nalebuff (1991) is especially strong on political and social examples. McMillan (1991) emphasizes business applications.

The great historical breakthrough is von Neumann and Morgenstern (1947), which those with scholarly interest in game theory should read with classic papers of John Nash (1950a, 1950b, 1951). For a contemporary mathematical treatment that is unusually philosophically sophisticated, Binmore (2005c) (**) is in a class by itself. The second half of Kreps (1990) (**) is the best available starting point for a tour of the philosophical worries surrounding equilibrium selection for non-behaviorists. Koons (1992) takes these issues further. Fudenberg and Tirole (1991) is the most thorough and complete mathematical text available. Gintis (2000) (**) has provided a text crammed with terrific problem exercises, which is also unique in that it treats evolutionary game theory as providing the foundational basis for game theory in general. This surely is the norm for the future. Recent developments in fundamental theory are well represented in Binmore, Kirman and Tani (1993).

The philosophical foundations of the basic game-theoretic concepts as economists understand them are presented in LaCasse and Ross (1994). Ross and LaCasse (1995) outline the relationships between games and the axiomatic assumptions of microeconomics and macroeconomics. Philosophical puzzles at this foundational level are critically discussed in Bicchieri (1993) (**). Lewis (1969) (**) puts game-theoretic equilibrium concepts to wider application in philosophy, a program that is carried a good deal further in Skyrms (1996) (**). (See also Nozick [1998].) Gauthier (1986) launches a literature not surveyed in this article, in which the possibility of game-theoretic foundations for contractarian ethics is investigated. This work is critically surveyed in Vallentyne (1991), and extended into a dynamic setting in Danielson (1992). Binmore (1994, 1998) (**), however, effectively demolishes this project. Philosophers will also find Hollis (1998) to be of interest.

Hardin (1995) is one of many examples of the application of game theory to problems in applied political theory. Baird, Gertner and Picker (1994) review uses of game theory in legal theory and jurisprudence. Mueller (1997) surveys applications in political economy. Ghemawat (1997) does the same in business strategy. Poundstone (1992) provides a lively history of the Prisoner's Dilemma and its use by Cold War strategists. Durlauf and Young (2001) is a good collection on applications to social structures and social change.

Evolutionary game theory owes its explicit genesis to Maynard Smith (1982) (**). For a text that integrates game theory directly with biology, see Hofbauer and Sigmund (1998) (**). Sigmund (1993) presents this material in a less technical and more accessible format. Some exciting applications of evolutionary game theory to a range of philosophical issues, on which this article has drawn heavily, is Skyrms (1996) (**). These issues and others are critically discussed from various angles in Danielson (1998). Mathematical foundations for evolutionary games are presented in Weibull (1995), and pursued further in Samuelson (1997). As noted above, Gintis (2000) (**) now provides an introductory textbook that takes evolutionary modeling to be foundational to all of game theory. H.P. Young (1998) gives sophisticated models of the evolutionary dynamics of cultural norms through the game-theoretic interactions of agents with limited cognitive capacities but dispositions to imitate one another. Fudenberg and Levine (1998) gives the technical foundations for modeling of this kind.

Many philosophers will also be interested in Binmore (1994 1998, 2005a) (**), which shows that application of game-theoretic analysis can underwrite a Rawlsian conception of justice that does not require recourse to Kantian presuppositions about what rational agents would desire behind a veil of ignorance concerning their identities and social roles. (In addition, Binmore offers excursions into a vast range of other issues both central and peripheral to both the foundations and the frontiers of game theory; these books are a tour de force.) And almost everyone will be interested in Frank (1988) (**), where evolutionary game theory is used to illuminate basic features of human nature and emotion; though readers of this are also directed to criticism of Frank's model in Ross and Dumouchel (2004).

Behavioral and experimental applications of game theory are surveyed in Kagel and Roth (1995). Camerer (2003) (**) is a comprehensive study of this literature (that also brings it up to date), and cannot be missed by anyone interested in these issues. A shorter survey that emphasizes philosophical and methodological criticism is Samuelson (2005). Philosophical foundations are also carefully examined in Guala (2005).

Game-theoretic dynamics of the sub-person receive fascinating, and accessible, discussion in Ainslie (2001). Seminal texts in neuroeconomics, with extensive use of and implications for behavioral game theory, are Montague and Berns (2002), Glimcher 2003 (**), and Camerer, Loewenstein and Prelec (2005). Ross (2005a) studies the game-theoretic foundations of microeconomics in general, but especially behavioral economics and neuroeconomics, from the perspective of cognitive science.

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## Other Internet Resources

- History of Game Theory
- Principia Cybernetica entry: Game Theory
- University of Rochester Economics Department: Game Theory
- TU Wroclaw IMath—Game Theory
- What is Game Theory?
- Al Roth's Game Theory and Experimental Economics Page
- Web-based material by Bill Harms (Philosophy, U. British Columbia)

## Related Entries

game theory: and ethics | game theory: evolutionary | prisoner's dilemma | rationality

### Acknowledgments

I would like to thank James Joyce and Edward Zalta for their comments on the various versions — now up to three — of this entry. I would also like to thank Sam Lazell for not only catching a nasty patch of erroneous analysis in the second version, but going to the superogatory trouble of actually providing fully corrected reasoning. If there were many such readers, all authors in this project would become increasingly collective over time. One of my MBA students, Anthony Boting, noticed that my solution to an example I used in the second version rested on equivocating between relative-frequency and objective-chance interpretations of probability. Two readers, Brian Ballsun-Stanton and George Mucalov, spotted this too and were kind enough to write to me about it. Many thanks to them. Joel Guttman pointed out that I'd illustrated a few principles with some historical anecdotes that circulate in the game theory community, but told them in a way that was too credulous with respect to their accuracy. Michel Benaim and Mathius Grasselli noted that I'd identified the wrong Plato text as the source of Socrates's reflections on soldiers' incentives. Ken Binmore picked up another factual error while the third revision was in preparation, as a result of which no one else ever saw it. Some other readers helpfully spotted typos: thanks to Fabian Ottjes and Brad Colbourne. Nelleke Bak, my in-house (so to speak) graphics guru (and spouse) drew all figures except 15, 16, and 17, which were generously contributed by George Ainslie. My thanks to him. Finally, thanks go to Colin Allen for technical support (in the effort to deal with bandwidth problems to South Africa) prior to publication of the second version of this entry, and to Daniel McKenzie for procedural advice on preparation of the third version.