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Friedrich Albert Lange

First published Tue May 31, 2005

Friedrich Albert Lange (b. 1828, d. 1875) was a German philosopher, pedagogue, political activist, and journalist. He was one of the originators of neo-Kantianism and an important figure in the founding of the Marburg school of neo-Kantianism. He is also played a significant role in the German labour movement and in the development of social democratic thought. His book, The History of Materialism, was a standard introduction to materialism and the history of philosophy well into the twentieth century.

1. Life and Intellectual Career

Lange was born on September 28, 1828 in Wald near Solingen, Germany. He was the son of a protestant theologian, pastor and professor. Soon after Lange was born, the family moved to Langenberg near Elberfeld and then in 1832 to Duisburg. Lange went to both elementary school and high school in Duisburg. The family moved in 1841 to Zurich so that his father could take up the position as pastor and Professor of Theology that had been withdrawn from David Friedrich Strauss as a result of Strauss's controversial book, The Life of Jesus. Lange continued his high school education in Zurich. Lange also attended lectures at the university for two semesters on philology and theology. He was exposed to both Hegel and Herbart in Zurich. This exposure to Herbart influenced his later interests in education theory, but more importantly led him back to Kant. In 1848 he went to study philology at the University of Bonn under Friedrich Ritschl. Here he also took courses in philosophy, the history of classical German literature, and analytic geometry and calculus. He finished a dissertation on Greek poetry, “Quaestiones metricae”, and was awarded his doctorate in 1851.[1]

After doing his military service in Cologne, he became an assistant high school teacher there in 1852 at the Friedrich-Wilhelms-Gymnasium. After failing in three years to be promoted from assistant teacher to teacher, he resigned and received his habilitation (qualification as a university lecturer) at the University of Bonn. In 1855 he became a Privatdozent of Philosophy and Pedagogy at the University of Bonn.[2] His inaugural lecture was on the relation between the education systems and dominant world views of various time periods (Lange 1855).[3] He gave lectures on psychology and pedagogy. He began lecturing on the history of materialism during the summer of 1857. This was the beginning of the research that would eventually yield his book, The History of Materialism, many years later. He also gave lectures on “Moralstatistik”, the view popular in some circles in the nineteenth century that there are statistical correlations between the rates of certain kinds of morally significant behavior such as crimes, marriages, and suicides. Lange's thoughts about how to reform logic also begin during this period even though his book, Logical Studies, that eventually emerged from his investigations, was only published posthumously. It is presumably significant for his later views that during this time he also heard Hermann von Helmholtz lecture on the “Physiology of the Sense Organs”.[4]

After failing to find a university position better than that of Privatdozent, he accepted an offer to teach at his old school, the Duisburg Gymnasium. He taught there from 1858-1862. He gave classes on Greek, Latin, German and philosophy. He was also busy outside the classroom writing reports for the school authorities and participating in politics as an elector. He wrote many articles for Karl Schmid's encyclopedia of pedagogy during this time (Lange 1869-75). This was the period when Lange really became interested in, and became engaged with, politics. He became a political activist engaged in the then burgeoning German civil society. He participated in the organization of the new consumer cooperatives meant to help the working class avoid exploitation by merchant traders—the traders sold low-quality goods at high prices and encouraged indebtedness. He was also involved with the liberal, nationalist society, the Deutsche Nationalverein (whose members were later to form a similarly motivated political party, the Deutsche Fortschrittspartei) attempting to achieve German unification.

The political activism brought him into conflict with various authorities. He had to quit his teaching post because of political problems in 1862. The school authorities had issued a decree in January warning teachers not to engage in “agitation”. Lange attempted to organize the teachers against the decree. He followed this up with a spirited public defense of the view that teachers needed to be fully active citizens in order to lead their students, by example, to the life of a true citizen (Lange 1862). Lange continued his political activism against attempts by the authorities to bring state employees, including teachers, into line. Another warning followed in June and, despite some failed attempts at reconciliation with the authorities, Lange decided to leave his position at the end of the school year. He became co-editor of the liberal Rhein- und Ruhrzeitung and secretary of the Duisburg Chamber of Commerce. The newspaper was an outspoken critic of the right-wing policies of Bismarck and already had strained relations with the authorities. Lange therefore also wrote for other papers and magazines and often resorted to publishing short pamphlets that were widely distributed. He also joined the management of a small publishing house with the intention of publishing a series of popular works for the working class to both educate and raise their consciousness and to represent their interests.

Despite working on a liberal paper his own position steadily shifted in the socialist direction. His political positions split the editorial staff of the newspaper and alienated the members of the Chamber of Commerce. He soon left the newspaper because he thought it was not taking the interests of the working class seriously enough. Similarly he broke with the Fortschrittspartei and what he took to be its anti-worker platform.

A crucial event in his political development was his participation, a few weeks after Ferdinand Lassalle's death, in the second Congress of the German Workers' Association, Vereinstag deutscher Arbeitervereine (VDAV) in Leipzig in October 1864. The VDAV was founded initially as a counterweight to Lassalle's more radical, more Prussian, Allgemeine Deutsche Arbeiterverein (ADAV) (General German Workers' Association)—one of the ancestors of the current Social Democratic Party. The VDAV was set up as a loose organization, in contrast again to the ADAV, but acquired more structure later as the Federation of German Workers' Associations, Verband Deutscher Arbeitervereine (and so kept the same initials in German) (SED 1966, 216; Na'aman 1980). Lange was there at the 1864 Congress as a representative of his Duisburg consumers' cooperative. He was elected to the Standing Committee and attempted to mediate between various factions, in particular between the Lassalleans of the ADAV and the more liberal participants of the Congress. The politics were quite complicated since there were indeed voices further left, famously Marx and Engels, even of the leadership of the ADAV. The disagreements were in essence about which existing social, political, and economic structures and forces should or had to be accepted and worked within and which could and should be replaced. The disagreements also reflected splits between the middle class and the working class. Despite his role as mediator, Lange was clear that the workers must not be co-opted for a middle class, liberal agenda and that the workers' movement as a whole must remain focused on the class interests of the working class (Bernstein 1892, 139; Mehring 1908, 368). Lange failed to succeed in his mediating efforts and felt compelled to explain his own position in his Arbeiterfrage (The Labor Question) (Lange 1865a).

These political fights pushed to the background Lange's plans to publish short works for the working class. He did nonetheless publish a couple smaller works (Lange 1863b, 1865c). He was also writing his most famous book, The History of Materialism, during this time. In his Grundlegung der mathematischen Psychologie (1865b), also written during this time, he indicated that he had already finished his History of Materialism. It eventually came out in print in 1866.

With August Bebel and Wilhelm Liebknecht, Lange continued to try to push the VDAV to the left from the initial liberal position of Hermann Schulze-Delitzsch towards a position that took the interests of the working class itself more seriously (Bebel 1958, 103; Hundt 1965; Na'aman 1980, xxv). He also joined the International Working Men's Association, the First International, in 1866 (Weikart 1999, 84). As the political repression increased, newspapers were no longer willing to publish Lange's articles and Lange set up his own newspaper, Der Bote vom Niederrhein, that ran from October 1865 to June 1866. Marx and Engels had turned down his initial request for support for such a newspaper (Lange 1968b, 78-79; Irmer 1975, 14).[5] Lange had intended the newspaper to help maintain unity within the workers' movement but he failed in these efforts (Hundt 1965, 694-96; Offermann 2002, 42, 147-148; Lange [1866] 1968a, 23 May 1866, 3 June 1866). By the end of this period Lange was political isolated having broken with the liberals and unwilling to fully join the socialists. He was also losing hope in the working class and felt that the left was being outmaneuvered by Bismarck. In part this was simply because of the international military successes of Bismarckian politics (Ellissen 1905, 7; Nipperdey 1985, 790-803). Discouraged, he left for Switzerland.

He settled in Winterthur. He became co-editor of the Winterthurer Landboten and joined a friend's publishing house. He became very involved in Swiss politics, particularly in the movement to reform the constitution and make it more democratic—a movement that was particularly strong in his Zurich canton. He was on the boards of many social organizations and on various state committees as an expert on education, banking, and the railways (Weinkauff 1883, 30). During this time, he also taught occasionally at the Winterthur Gymnasium. He continued working on his contributions to Schmid's education encyclopedia (Lange 1859-75) and he responded to criticisms of the first edition of his History of Materialism in Neue Beiträge zur Geschichte des Materialismus (Lange 1867).

In 1869 he joined the Zurich faculty as a Privatdozent. He finished the heavily revised second edition of the Arbeiterfrage in 1870. In 1870 he also finally received a professorship at Zurich though unfortunately soon after being diagnosed with cancer. Despite the illness he continued working on the second edition of The History of Materialism (Lange 1873-75). After rejecting offers from Königsberg and Würzburg, he accepted an invitation to take up a professorship at Marburg in 1872. He gave lectures right till the end, but cancer eventually led to his death on 21 November 1875 in Marburg.

2. Pedagogy

Lange's intellectual interests were quite varied. One of his earliest interests was in theoretical questions about both the purpose and method of education. Before he had even taken up his first job as a high school teacher in Cologne he was already thinking and writing about reforming the German Gymnasium system. Like others he was concerned in particular that the emphasis on the classics in the Gymnasiums failed to prepare students for a time in which the natural sciences were becoming more and more important. Mathematics and the natural sciences needed to be emphasized (Lange 1865a, 401). Lange returned again and again throughout his career to questions of pedagogy and the history of pedagogy. However, despite his many publications and lectures on pedagogy, despite his collaboration with K. A. Schmid on the Encyklopädie des gesammten Erziehungs- und Unterrichtwesens, Lange appears not to have made a significant impact either on his contemporaries or in the history of pedagogy (Knoll 1975a, 8). He even began by attempting to give lectures on pedagogy when he started teaching at the University of Bonn but failed to generate any interest among the students for his lectures (Knoll 1975b, 112-13).

Lange claimed that the purpose of education should be to produce rational, cultured citizens. The question was how to produce such citizens. Lange tried to show that turning to both the history of education and the history of pedagogy would throw light on this question of means. The history of education would help us understand the way in which social, cultural and political conditions interact to affect the kind of education that occurs in a particular historical context (Lange 1855).

Creating free citizens and leaders requires that the teachers themselves be actively engaged in their communities as citizens. Teachers thus should not be prevented from political engagement. Only politically engaged teachers will, indeed, be able to communicate to their students the love of freedom and fatherland. As he was later to emphasize in his History of Materialism, simply instructing people, including students, to be ethical—to be concerned with the good of humanity in general—does not have much of an impact. In the case of education one can have an impact by presenting a role model and by being a personal inspiration for one's students. His example is that of Thomas Arnold of Rugby whom he believed was able to shape his students' ethical views precisely because of he was so impressive as a person and this personality was the result of, and in some sense constituted by, his active engagement with the political issues of his time (Lange 1862).

Christian virtues were for Lange an essential part of education; however, the relevant form of Christianity seems to be quite vague, indeed bordering at times on some form of “indeterminate pantheism” (Knoll 1975a, 13). This is no surprise given his later discussions of religion (see below). Education, in the inclusive sense of Bildung, also required instruction in philosophy. Exposure to philosophy is an essential part of learning how to make reasoned decisions. There must also be education in politics. This gives one the requisite knowledge to participate in political affairs and helps prepare one for being a citizen (Knoll 1975b, 123).

The importance of education, and the crucial role of the freedom of thought in education, implied, for Lange, that any social entity should have the right to set up schools and decide what should be taught in them. The state should set up schools only where existing structures of civil society have failed to generate enough schools. The state should restrict the opening of a school only when it poses a genuine threat to a legitimate state or explicitly promotes criminal activity. There should be no requirement that there be any religious instruction let alone a requirement that any particular religion be taught. In state schools it is important in fact that there should be no religious instruction (Lange 1968b, 125-127).

Lange tries to take a middle position on the relative importance of natural talent and social environment for both the method and results of education. He grants that there probably are given differences in dispositions but that the environment has a significant influence on how these dispositions express themselves and thus on how students' talents develop. He criticizes social Darwinist theories that think there is no need to pay attention to the barriers to development created by the lack of economic or social privileges (Lange 1873-75, 255; Lange 1894a, 48-49). On the other hand he warns against an idealism that assumes some fundamental human equality of ability either as a given, underlying fact or as a plausible goal (Knoll 1975a, 19-20).

Finally Lange went against contemporary trends and argued that pedagogy should be informed by the emerging science of empirical psychology though he granted that empirical psychology was a very young discipline that had so far failed to produce many compelling results (Lange 1859-1875, “Seelenlehre”, 142; Knoll 1975a, 16). He emphasized the importance of statistical methods—an emphasis that was also quite prescient for the later development of pedagogy (Knoll 1975a, 19).

3. The Labor Question

Lange developed an interest in, and sympathy for, labor movements in their socialist and communist manifestations from the very early days of his university career. Politically he should probably be regarded as occupying a middle position between left liberalism and socialism.

The first edition of the Arbeiterfrage was created in response to heated debates about political strategy in the developing labor movement. It was followed by a second and third edition that to an increasing degree took up more theoretical questions. The Arbeiterfrage was, like the works of Karl Marx, Friedrich Engels and others of the period, shaped by a direct experience of rapid industrialization. A crucial consequence of this industrialization was the generation of an impoverished urban working class.[6] The heart of this process in Germany was precisely in the Ruhrgebiet and the Rhineland where Lange was. Lange concluded that the solution to the problem of what to do about the working class, the “Arbeiterfrage”—literally the “worker question”—as it was called, must come from the workers themselves. This required politically organizing the workers and their organizations to form a front against the bourgeoisie (Irmer 1975, 2).

Lange's position is one of socialist Darwinism (as opposed to social Darwinism). Lange accepted a modified version of Thomas Malthus's concerns about the relation between increases in population and food production: “The truth of the Malthusian theory consists therefore in this, that the growth of the population constantly reaches the limit that the growth of the means of subsistence permits” (Lange 1975b, 31; Weikart 1999, 86). This is an essential part of the explanation of the social conditions of the working class. He quotes Darwin to emphasize that it is population pressure that lies behind the struggle for existence for all organisms. This, he emphasizes, includes humans (Lange 1894, 2). Within capitalism the struggle for existence for the working class becomes a struggle for wages.

Malthus granted in principle that measures like contraception could prevent the increase in population that reduces standards of living to the subsistence level but he held out little hope. Lange was more sanguine though the positive note in his book may have come too late to prevent its opening chapters from ensuring its unpopularity. The talk of the struggle for existence, and the rigid-sounding laws that govern it, could hardly have been inspiring to the workers' movement it was meant for (Mehring 1960, 352). Nonetheless Lange did not draw the conclusions from Darwin that the social Darwinists did. He did not take Darwinism as supporting capitalism in part because he took it to be a mistake to straightforwardly infer any normative conclusions from the Darwinian explanatory claims. He also seemed to regard the principles appealed to in Darwin and Malthus as natural tendencies that could be mitigated by human reason. These explanatory laws do not determine how we should think nor do they determine how we must inevitably think:

In our present writing on the labor question Darwin plays a large role, insofar as we have attempted to derive the conditions which produce the labor question from the principles developed by Darwin, without, however, viewing them as absolutely necessary ingredients of human existence. (Lange 1975b, 30-31; Weikart 1999, 89)

Just as human reason can control and mitigate the struggle for existence among the plants we cultivate, it can control and mitigate the struggle for existence among humans.

What is needed is enough of an improvement in the living conditions of the working class that the workers will decrease their rate of reproduction. Once the quality of the living conditions becomes high enough, the working class will become reasonable enough to be susceptible to rational arguments in favor of having a reasonable number of children. Their lack of rationality in this matter is a result of their misery and ignorance. The improvement of living conditions to a sufficient level requires organizing the working class so that they can demand better wages and a decrease in the concentration of capital. This may be possible while maintaining private property in the means of production, but, if not, we should try for communism, or whatever other path including various forms of mixed economies, promises success. We will only learn slowly through experience what the best system is (Lange 1866a, 113-114; Lange 1894a, 212-262).

It is important to note, given the political context in which Lange was writing, that he did not seem to think that some revolutionary act would bring us suddenly closer to such improved conditions of existence. He saw the process of such development as a slow one. Simply changing the legal property relations or the official structure of the state will not be sufficient, he argues. What is required in addition to changes in the structure of the state and the legal system are fundamental changes in the way people think. This kind of change though will always take time. The reform of the state and laws only provides the preconditions for this change in consciousness. Such reform does not immediately bring this change about. Lange is careful though not to deny that the kind of revolution some socialists and communists supported could bring us closer to the goal. It is just that any such revolution would be merely one step in a long process that will involve both progress and regress (Lange 1894a, 249-251).

On the other hand “the view that the state has nothing to do with the matter” is just as mistaken (Lange 1894a, 250). Lange criticizes the kind of self-help approach that some of the liberal middle-class, in particular Franz-Hermann Schulze-Delitzsch, famously pushed. Schulze-Delitzsch believed that the goals of the liberal bourgeoisie and the working class did not have to be thought of as in conflict.The problems facing the working class could be dealt with within the existing capitalist mode of production. The working class, to put it crudely, could, thanks to the help of a series of consumer, credit and production cooperatives, educate itself and save enough money to compete with capitalists on their own terms. Lange thought this position was completely unrealistic and that those who pushed it failed to actually listen to the workers themselves. He criticized the paternalistic attitude of these liberal reformers and mocked their inability to even understand the dialects spoken by many of the workers.

Marx and Engels disagreed strongly with Lange's position (Weikart 1999, 31; Marx and Engels 1975, 43: 158, 527-528). The view Engels expresses in a letter to Lange seems to be that taking the Malthusian view requires treating what is a historical law, in other words a contingent law that holds during a particular mode of production, as an “eternal” law. The problem of producing enough is a problem generated by the existing mode of production. The technological means available then and in the future are and would be more than enough to deal with any increases in population as long as capitalism is overcome. Theories of eternal laws are part of an ideology that supports the existing mode of production because they present what are contingent laws as necessary thus creating the impression that the social order cannot be changed. This inhibits the interest in changing society (Lange 1968b, 80-81; Marx and Engels 1975, 42: 136).

They also disagreed about the usefulness of Hegel. Lange suspected that Hegelian dialectic, even in the more empiricist and materialist form that Marx deployed it, was not that useful for purposes of explanation. Indeed he expresses his surprise that at a time in which Hegel was no longer taken seriously in philosophy, Hegelian ideas could be so influential in the workers' movement in both the thought of Lassalle and Marx (Lange 1894a, 247-249, 260-262). Lange had immense respect for Marx and thought of him as the leading economist of the time. However, he thought that when it came to Marx's writings the Hegelian “speculative form … tiresomely intrudes on the content of some parts of the work to the disadvantage of its effectiveness” and undermines the effect of the “astounding” display of detailed empirical evidence (Lange 1894a, 248). Lange also thought that the emphasis on revolution, and the thought that a revolution could somehow suddenly change the conditions of the working class and the mode of production, was also the result of the negative influence of Hegel. Marx and Engels, on the other hand, were committed to some kind of dialectic form of explanation. Marx thought that Lange's basic attitude towards Hegel and dialectic was fundamentally mistaken—“simply childish”—and, indeed, showed that Lange “understands rien [nothing] about Hegel's method and therefore, second, still less about my critical manner of applying it” (Marx and Engels 1975, 43: 528). There is however evidence that Lange did understand what was at stake as is shown, for example, by his clear discussion of idealism in psychology, and in the study of nature in general, in his “Seelenlehre” (Lange 1859-1875, 144-45).

Lange had an indirect impact on what was later known as the revisionist debate within socialism. Eduard Bernstein, the father of revisionism, eventually broke with Marxian orthodoxy and argued that achieving socialism did not require a revolution or at least that much could be achieved by working within existing democratic political structures. This was in part a result of Bernstein's developing neo-Kantianism. He claimed that indeed it was primarily Lange's work that led him to both Kant and revisionism (Vorländer 1900, 47; Bernstein 1892). He suggests that when it comes to articulating a path forward for socialism, “I would translate ‘back to Kant’ by ‘back to Lange’” (Bernstein 1902, 187-88).

4. Neo-Kantianism

The domination of German philosophy by Hegelian Idealism for the first third of the nineteenth century was followed by a revival of materialism. This was in part brought on by the criticisms of Christian theology and supernaturalism in David Friedrich Strauss's The Life of Jesus and the criticisms of Christian theology and Hegelian idealism in the works of Ludwig Feuerbach, most famously in The Essence of Christianity. The revival was also given impetus by the recent successes and the increasing prestige of the natural sciences. This new materialism was represented by figures like Karl Vogt, Jacob Moleschott, Ludwig Büchner, and Heinrich Czolbe. These materialists explicitly took the natural sciences as their ideal; indeed, many of them were practicing natural scientists. There was a more or less immediate reaction to this new materialism from those who thought that these materialists were philosophically naive and overly optimistic about the degree to which they could defend materialism, the degree to which materialism could solve, or avoid, traditional philosophical problems, and the degree to which it could avoid thoroughly undermining morality. These opponents focussed on a range of philosohical problems for materialism centered on whether it could adequately account for our mental lives. Could it, for example, account for sensations and consciousness? The epistemology of the new materialists also struck many as philosophically naive. The principles of inference, for example, that allow one to draw conclusions from sense perception do not themselves seem to be justified by sense perceptions.

Lange was one of those who thought that materialism faced serious philosophical problems; however, he also thought that Hegelian Idealism was bankrupt. What was needed was a philosophical approach that would be compatible with the recent successes of materialistic explanations as deployed by the natural sciences but not simply be a form of materialism. Lange was one of the first in this period to argue that the appropriate response to the philosophical situation in Germany at the middle of the nineteenth century was to return to Kant. As he put it in a letter, “I take the Hegelian System to be a step backward towards Scholasticism from which we are really already free. Herbart, to whom I first attached myself, was for me only a bridge to Kant, to whom so many honest researchers return in order to, where possible, complete what Kant had only half done: the annihilation of metaphysics” (Ellissen 1894, 106). Lange was thus one of the founding figures in what was to emerge as the neo-Kantian movement rallied by Otto Liebmann's slogan “Back to Kant!”

It is not easy, however, to assess the degree of genuine continuity between the many different strands of neo-Kantianism that emerged and Kant's own interests. Lange is sometimes taken as the founder of the Marburg School of neo-Kantianism. Perhaps it would be more accurate to say that Lange was a mentor of the first famous member of the Marburg School, Hermann Cohen. The other famous members were Paul Natorp and Ernst Cassirer. These later figures were more genuinely Kantian than Lange himself. This is in part because Lange shared much with Hermann von Helmholtz. While keeping much of the language of Kant, Hermann von Helmholtz, and others, managed arguably to fundamentally change the questions being asked in Kant's name and the methods that were allowed in finding answers to these questions. In many ways Hermann Cohen returned to a conception of these questions that was closer to Kant's. Lange, on the other hand, drew from Helmholtz a version of the thought that the scientific investigation of the physiology of the sense organs provided some kind of confirmation of Kant's fundamental claims.

Helmholtz had argued that contemporary science was confirming on empirical grounds insights that Kant hat had but that Kant took as supported by a priori considerations. In his famous address, “On Goethe's Scientific Researches”, he claimed:

The result of [scientific] examination, as at present understood, is that the organs of sense do indeed give us information about external effects produced on them, but convey those effects to our consciousness in a totally different form, so that the character of a sensuous perception depends not so much on the properties of the object perceived as on those of the organ by which we receive the information. (Helmholtz 1853, 13)

The ground for this conclusion was supposed to be the fact, uncovered by physiology, that nerves are not faithful transmitters of external properties to consciousness:

All the optic nerve conveys to us, it conveys under the form of a sensation of light, whether it be the rays of the sun, or a blow in the eye, or an electric current passing through it. Again, the auditory nerve translates everything into phenomena of sound, the nerves of the skin into sensations of temperature or touch. … The same ray of sunshine, which is called light when it falls on the eye, we call heat when it falls on the skin. (Helmholtz 1853, 13)

He then concluded:

Perhaps the relation between our senses and the external world may be best enunciated as follows: our sensations are for us only symbols of the objects of the external world, and correspond to them only in some such way as written characters or articulate words to the things they denote. They give us, it is true, information respecting the properties of things without us, but no better information than we give a blind man about colour by verbal descriptions. (Helmholtz 1853, 14)

Thus, “what the recent physiology of the senses has shown by the way of experience is what Kant had tried to show for the representations of the human mind in general when he laid out the participation of the particular, built-in rules of the mind, the organization of the mind as it were, in our representations” (Helmholtz 1855, 58).

Helmholtz thinks the confirmation of Kant goes further. The only way to get from the “world of sensations” to the “world of reality”, the “external world”, is through an inference. We infer that there is an external world because there has to be a “cause of our nerve excitations because there can be no effect without cause.” But, Helmholtz asks, “How do we know that there is no effect without a cause?” This is not a principle we could learn from experience since it is the principle we need in place before we can come to any conclusions about the world including the conclusion that cause follows effect. Thus, “the investigation of sensory perception also leads us to what Kant had already recognized, namely that the principle, “No effect without cause”, is a law of our thought given before all experience” (Helmholtz 1855, 77).

Thus, as he puts it later, what science shows us is quite compatible with extreme forms of idealism:

It is always good to keep this in mind so as not to conclude more from the facts than is warranted. The different shadings of idealistic and realistic opinions are metaphysical hypothesis which, so long as they are recognized as such, and however injurious they may become when represented as dogma or as supposed necessities of thought, are completely justified scientifically. (Helmholtz 1878, 360).

Scientific theories are thus perfectly acceptable, indeed extremely important, as long as we do not give them a metaphysical interpretation. One should wholeheartedly welcome the successes of natural science and empirical methodology, but the naive realism of the materialists was mistaken. The epistemological questions need to be taken seriously. The return to Kant was precisely to raise again the question of whether indeed the natural sciences give us a picture of reality in itself. In other words, accepting the success of empirical methodology and materialistic explanations did not entail accepting a materialist ontology or epistemology.

Lange's most famous book, The History of Materialism and the Critique of its Contemporary Significance, is in essence a defense of such a return to Kant. It is also a detailed history of materialism (and was read well into the twentieth century for precisely this reason). However, more fundamentally, it was meant to drive home the above mentioned concerns about materialism. Lange accepted materialism as a sensible maxim for the construction of theories within natural science. However, as a comprehensive philosophical system, as both fundamental ontology and epistemology, materialism is self-undermining, he argues, for essentially the kinds of reasons Helmholtz presents.

Lange's History is divided into two parts. The first part covers the history of materialism from the atomism of Democritus till the time of Kant. It includes discussions of what Lange considers to be reactions to materialism: the philosophical positions of Plato and Aristotle and the theological positions taken by both Christian and Muslim scholars. He includes a discussion of the dominance of Aristotelianism in the writings of the Scholastics. Materialism finally returns with the regeneration of science. In this context, after discussions of Gassendi and Hobbes, he turns to Newton and Locke. Finally he treats Leibniz as a German reaction to materialism.

The second part covers the history of materialism from the time of Kant. The opening section of this part is a discussion of Kant's own position in relation to materialism and sets the stage for Lange's “back to Kant” arguments. These arguments are directed against the contemporary forms of materialism mentioned above.

Lange claims that “the empirical method has celebrated its highest triumph” in the physiology of the sense organs. But this triumph “at the same time … leads us to the very limits of our knowledge, and betrays to us at least so much of the sphere beyond it as to convince us of its existence” (Lange 1873-75, 3:202; see also 2:158). Such physiological investigation into the sense organs may initially look favourable for the materialists—in that it promises to give us a materialistic account of our knowledge of the world—in fact it is deadly. Physiology shows us that the sense organs do not show us how the world really is and indeed that our very concept of matter may have nothing to do with what is really there in the world (Lange 1873-75, 3: 205-19).[7]

The arguments Lange deploys are essentially extended versions of the arguments Helmholtz was using. For example, he claims that the physiology of our eyes shows that the visual sensation of a single three-dimensional object in front of me is in fact a composite generated from the two two-dimensional stimulations of each of my retinas (Lange 1873-75, 3:203). Supposedly we learn that even the simplest of sensations is not the result of a single natural process, which processes are in anycase completely different from sensations in themselves, but the combination of many different processes (3: 203-204). Furthermore we learn that “colours, sounds, smells, &c., do not belong to things in themselves, … they are peculiar forms of excitation of our sensibility, which are called forth by corresponding but qualitatively very different phenomena in the world” (3:217). Indeed, according to these physiological accounts, only a very specific set of vibrations is picked out and the rest are ignored (3:217). We learn that there is a blind spot on the retina but that the brain fills in the spot when constructing our image of the world (3:220). The conclusion Lange wants us to draw from all of this is that the world we think we see is radically different from the way the world really is by materialism's own lights.

Lange considers the possibility that many of these then commonplace arguments could perhaps be seen merely as arguments in favour of a subjective account of secondary qualities and that one could respond by insisting that nonetheless the empirical theory we construct gives us a correct account of the primary qualities. Indeed for all that has been said, someone might argue, we may still be warranted in thinking that reality is composed of bodies in motion in space. However, Lange wants to resist even this move, the “last refuge of Materialism” as he calls it (3:224):

Just as the vibrations of the phenomenal world we have to deal with are related to the colours of the immediately seen, so too an entirely, to us, inconceivable order of things might be related to the order of time and space that rules in our perceptions. (3:224-225)

Physical space, for example, could easily be, Lange claims, of more than three dimensions without that having any effect on our phenomenal world (3:227).

Thus materialism, as the belief in “material, self-existent things” is thoroughly undermined: the “consistent Materialistic view thus changes around, therefore, into a consistently idealistic view” (Lange 1873-75, 3:215, 223).

It helps in understanding Lange's position, to see the kind of view he thinks would in principle escape these worries. Lange considers one version of materialism in his book that he thinks does not undermine itself. This is the position of Heinrich Czolbe the author of Neue Darstellung des Sensualismus. Lange credits him for being the only one among the materialists to truly face up to the problems regarding perception generated by materialism for itself (Lange 1873-75, 2: 105).

Czolbe goes beyond simple materialism in his sensualism, and gets credit from Lange for facing up to the self-undermining nature of materialism, precisely because Czolbe takes as central the problem created by the above mentioned empirical arguments about the nature of nerve processes in sense organs. He takes this to be the problem that Feuerbach, Vogt, Moleschott, and others have not adequately dealt with (Czolbe 1855, vi; Lange 1873-75, 3:286). These materialists have therefore not succeeded in defeating religion or speculative philosophy. Indeed Czolbe complains that the physiologists play right into the hands of the speculative, idealistic philosophers because they do not think through the philosophical consequences of their physiological theories (Czolbe 1856, 27-28). The only way to defeat the speculative philosophers, Czolbe argues, is to insist that the sensory qualities are mechanically propagated through the nerves without any change (Czolbe 1855, 14; 1856, 15-16, 27-28). His view appears to be that qualitative properties such as colours or sounds are transmitted directly from the outside to the inside. The view is hard of course to wrap one's mind around, but the suggestion is that qualia are out there in the external world and are merely transmitted to the inside of the brain by the nerves. They are not generated by the nerves. Czolbe was of course not ignorant of wave theories of light or sound but claimed that the wave particle in some way already is the qualia which has only to be transmitted to the right spot in the brain in order for us to be conscious of it. As Lange mockingly emphasizes, the sound waves somehow involve the experience of their sound in themselves already (Lange 1873-75, 2:111). Czolbe accepts Hermann Lotze's description of his view which I quote here for its relative clarity. Czolbe claims:

the sensible qualities of sensation are already completely present in the external stimuli, that from a red-radiating object a ready-made redness, from a sound source a melody, detaches itself in order to penetrate into us through the portals of the sense organs (Czolbe 1856, 14).

If this were the correct view of how the sense organs work, then, so Czolbe claims, we would have an empirical account of knowledge that was not self-undermining.

One immediate problem already was how to defend such a view against the empirical evidence available even in Czolbe's time. Consider, for example, something Czolbe was aware of, namely, the presence of electrical currents in nerves. The worry for Czolbe is that light waves end up being converted to electrical currents in the nerves and that this might lead us back to the supposedly self-undermining empirical stories of the other materialists. Czolbe's response is first to point out that it is possible that both electricity and light—not just light waves but the very qualia—could be transmitted at the same time. He then points to supposed empirical data that at the moment of excitation the electrical current in the nerve weakens. This, he thinks, is decisive evidence that the electrical current is not responsible for transmission since if it were, the electrical current would have to increase at the moment of excitation rather than decrease (Czolbe 1855: 16-17).

The view has other strange consequences. Just to give one example: he accepts something like a coloured picture, with all the different colour points, traveling in parallel up the optic nerve and has to concern himself with how many colour ‘points’ could travel in parallel in a single nerve (Czolbe 1855: 33). He thinks that this too is essential to keep materialism from undermining itself. The empirical data, he wants to argue, supports such a non-self-undermining empirical account of knowledge.

Lange takes the way in which Czolbe has to, by Lange's lights, twist the empirical evidence as clear support for the claim that materialism undermines itself, even if Czolbe's materialism, were it to actually be supported by empirical evidence, is in principle able to avoid undermining itself. Lange accuses Czolbe of being obstinate and treating the results of scientific investigations in an unscientific manner as mere illusions that would disappear on closer examination (Lange 1873-75, 2:291).

Lange thus thinks he has good grounds for drawing the following conclusions from his discussion of physiology and materialism:

  1. The sense-world is a product of our organisation.
  2. Our visible (bodily) organs are, like all other parts of the phenomenal world, only pictures of an unknown object.
  3. The transcendent basis of our organisation remains therefore just as unknown to us as the things which act upon it. We have always before us only the product of both. (Lange 1873-75, 3: 219)

He sees himself as agreeing with Helmholtz when Helmholtz “resolves the activity of the senses into a kind of inference” (Lange 1873-75, 3:228). It does not follow, he emphasizes, that “the search for a physical mechanism of sensation, as of thought, [is] superfluous or inadmissible. At length, however, we see that such a mechanism, like every other represented mechanism, must be itself only a necessarily occurring picture of an unknown state of things” (Lange 1873-75, 3:229). He concludes:

The senses give us, as Helmholtz says, effects of things, not faithful pictures let alone the things themselves. To these mere effects however belong also the senses themselves, together with the brain and the supposed molecular movements in it. We must therefore recognise the existence of a transcendent world order, whether this depends on “things-in-themselves”, or whether—since even the “thing in itself” is but a last application of our intuitive thought—it depends on mere relations, which exhibit themselves in various minds as various kinds and stages of the sensible, without its being at all conceivable what an adequate appearance of the absolute in a cognizing mind would be.” (Lange 1873-75, 3:230).

That we do not have knowledge of this transcendent order shows us that all metaphysics is, like art, a creation of the imagination. Nonetheless we should still “in natural science everywhere apply the same conceptions and methods as the Materialist; but what to the latter is definitive truth is to the Idealist only the necessary result of our organisation” (Lange 1873-75, 3:324).

4.1 The Standpoint of the Ideal

The realization that metaphysics is a creation of the imagination, and thus similar to art, opens up, so Lange thinks, a way to respond to the damaging ethical consequences of the materialistic world view. Though he does seem to think that the materialistic world views of many of his contemporaries influence their ethics, it is less clear whether Lange thinks that the kind of materialism discussed above actually entails any ethical positions. At times Lange oddly claims that both a normative principle of ethical egoism and some kind of principle of sympathy for humanity can both be “derived” [”abgeleitet”] from theoretical materialism (Lange 1873-75, 3:260, 303). It is perhaps most charitable to read Lange as suggesting that there is nothing in materialism that requires one principle or the other but that indeed one could find oneself attracted to either principle even if one started from theoretical materialism. His considered view appears to be that materialists have a plausible explanatory account for certain kinds of human behaviour but that they slide from this plausible explanatory account to problematic normative claims. His label “ethical materialism” thus seems to be a label for the kind of ethical positions that materialists tend to accept as a matter of sociological or psychological fact rather than some particular ethical position required by materialism.

Lange begins by granting that regarding humans as egoists concerned only with satisfying their desires may well be an abstraction that allows for some degree of predictive success when it comes to explaining human behaviour in the market place. The mistake the materialist makes is “in confounding this abstraction with reality” (Lange 1873-75, 3:233-237). The materialist assumes that the abstraction of the rational egoist is an accurate picture of all of human behaviour and, perhaps even more damagingly, an ethical ideal for how we should behave. Part of the problem is that ethical materialism has a mistaken account of the human good. It claims that “a man is all the happier the more wants he has, if he has at the same time sufficient means for their satisfaction” (Lange 1873-75, 3:239). This is mistaken because what matters is the nature of the want and, so Lange, the way the want comes about and is satisfied (Lange 1873-75, 3:241). Finally serious concerns about issues of distributive justice are avoided by what Lange considers to be quite implausible appeals to “invisible hand” arguments (Lange 1873-75, 3:242-259). As in the case of Marx, this does not mean that Lange denies the usefulness of markets in increasing productivity and encouraging technical innovation. The problem with markets is that they generate inequality and hinder human flourishing. Though Lange talks about exploitation it is unclear that he has some specific, technical, Marxist notion in mind.

Lange thinks that materialism, or rather science in general, will undermine religion, or at least traditional forms of it. He takes seriously the concern that this might also undermine moral commitment. He points out that it is not obvious what power religion really has to encourage moral behaviour. The New Testament's claim that it is easier for a camel to pass through the eye of a needle than for a rich man to enter the kingdom of heaven seems to have little impact on the acquisitiveness of contemporary Christian capitalists, “while the servants of the Church sit at the tables of the rich and preach submissiveness to the poor” (Lange 1873-75, 3:270-271). Such Christian ideas though have slowly and steadily encouraged universalistic concern and have combatted egoism and this, other things equal, is morally beneficial. What prevents these ideas from having more influence, and more of a purely positive influence, is the dogmatic form within which they appear and the nature of the institution of the Church itself. The power of the Church to force the acceptance of its dogmas not only results in unwarranted beliefs but also in a general debasement of our mental abilities (Lange 1873-75, 3:275).

Religion, like the other creations of our imagination, can have a powerful influence on us for good or for bad. The mistake is to confuse such creations with the knowledge that science provides (Lange 1873-75, 3:280). Lange thinks that “the classification of religion with art and metaphysics will at no very distant time be generally conceded”. The “great mass of believers of all religions” are “in a state of mind like that in which children listen to fairy-tales” (Lange 1873-75, 3:281). The coming realization though that these are all fairy tales does not mean that “the sense for poesy” is not important even when we are, so to speak, adults (Lange 1873-75, 3:281). Truth is not enough. He considers the example of beauty:

Truth … not only does not coincide with Beauty, but stands, in fact, in distinct opposition to it. … The artist sees his subject even in immediate observation as more beautiful than the less susceptible layman, and the realists in painting are only distinguished from the idealists by this, that they take up more of the qualities of reality into their work … if they did not idealise at all, they would be no longer artists. The eye of love poetises … all passions and activities of the senses poetise; and if we could entirely abolish this poesy, it is a question whether anything would be left to make life worth living. (Lange 1873-75, 3:285)

What is needed is “Begriffsdichtung”—literally “concept poetry”—the imaginative generation of conceptual structures. This is what metaphysicians and the unconscious creators of religion have been doing all along. Similarly in the case of morality if we are to overcome narrow interests, “then myth asserts its rights” (Lange 1873-75, 3:299). When it comes to “the direction of the impulses towards the general good”, then “mere moral teaching will hardly be likely to produce a frame of mind to which trumpet-peals and hymns are appropriate” (Lange 1873-75, 3:299). We need to set up ideals, indeed “[o]ne thing is certain, that man needs to supplement reality by an ideal world of his own creation”. This ideal world, these myths, are meant to inspire us to be moral and help us overcome “spiritual impoverishment” just as the myths, the ideals, of Christianity can, at their best, inspire us (cf. Kant 1787, A569/B597 and Kant 1793, §17). His model is Schiller's philosophical poetry (Lange 1873-75, 3:342-44; Lange 1897).

Lange appears to think that it is Kant's critique of reason that gives us the permission to engage in the creative generation of myths, to engage in conceptual poetry. One reason for this is that without Kant's critique we would have to worry that our myths might conflict with, or be undermined by, some metaphysical account of reality: “No thought is so calculated to reconcile poesy and science as the thought that all our ‘reality’—without any prejudice to its strict connexion, undisturbed by any caprice—is only appearance” (Lange 1873-75, 2:234). Now that we have learnt that metaphysics is merely myth we can in our active construction of myth give up the “deceptive form of a demonstrative science”. Indeed he thinks that Schiller is a model precisely because in his philosophical poems we have “a performance … which lends to the ideal an overpowering force by removing it openly and unhesitatingly into the realm of fantasy” (Lange 1873-75, 3:343).

But what are these myths supposed to inspire us to? Are there constraints on which myths we should create? This is not always clear in Lange. As we have seen it does seem that at least we are supposed to be inspired to be moral. This suggests that at least morality itself is not a myth. But if it is not a myth, then does this mean that we have some way of knowing moral truths—that morality somehow escapes the problems raised for other areas of purported metaphysical knowledge? Again, Lange's writings on this point are not clear and there is some evidence that he was not quite sure what position to take. Given the general emphasis on Kant, it comes as no surprise that Lange would take seriously what Kant has to say about this. What variation on Kant's view he finally accepts though is harder to discern.

The version of Kant's view that Lange considers is the one presented in the Critique of Practical Reason. Lange's focus on this version, like his interpretation of Kant's views on theoretical reason, set him apart from many later Kant scholars. The Critique of Practical Reason shares with Kant's other writings the claim that there is a fundamental law of practical reason which is also the moral law. It focusses though on one particular formulation of this law: “So act that the maxim of your will could always hold at the same time as a principle in a giving of universal law”. What is distinctive about the Critique of Practical Reason is that Kant then proceeds to give a distinctive account of how we come to know this law or how this law is justified. He writes:

Consciousness of this fundamental law may be called a fact of reason because one cannot reason it out from antecedent data of reason, for example, from consciousness of freedom (since this is not antecedently given to us) and because it instead forces itself upon us of itself as a synthetic a priori proposition that is not based on any intuition, either pure or empirical. (Kant 1788, 5:31)

According to this “fact of reason” version, we seem simply to have a particular moral law forced on us in our mental lives and we are unable to give any deeper justification of this moral law—it is just a fact that we have to accept. It is a fact that I am bound by the moral law. However, I could not be bound by the moral law unless I could follow it and I cannot follow this moral law unless I am free. Kant thus argues that we can conclude for practical purposes that the we are free.

Lange seems to accept the content of the law and treats it as supporting the kind of universalitic and impartial concern he sees as standing in opposition to egoism. However, he is clearly worried about whether Kant has really succeeded in providing a justification for the moral law.

In the first edition of his History, he claims that any moral philosophy could use this strategy and thus that “if Kant believes that he has absolutely proved his [moral philosophy], then he simply commits the usual mistake of all metaphysicians”. In the first edition, this claim comes right near the end of the section on Kant and is immediately followed by a summary of what he takes to be Kant's “Copernical Revolution”: (i) “The world of appreances is a consequence of our concepts”. (ii) “The ideas”, in Kant's sense presumably of concepts of reason whose objects are not such that they could be met in experience (Kant 1787, A311/B368-A320/B377), “give us no knowledge, rather they lead us to an imagined world. It is precisely in this that their usefulness lies. We deceive ourselves when we try to increase our knowledge through them; we enrich ourselves when we make them the foundation of our actions.” (iii) “The one absolute that man has is the moral law and from this fixed point a secure order can be brought to the unstable world of the ideas”. After this summary of what he takes to be Kant's position, Lange declares his support for (i) and (ii) but seems to reject (iii) for grounds similar to those we have already seen. Kant's claim that his moral law is a fixed point is somehow “subjective” and shows Kant as being a child of his times. The lasting achievement though that Lange thinks we can keep from (iii) is the more general claim that “the ideal is no longer to be judged by supposed evidence but rather by its relationship to the ethical ends of mankind” (Lange 1866b, 277-78). This is where the discussion of the fundamental moral law in the first edition ends. It leaves open the question of what ethical ends are supposed to be used for judging the ideals we create in our myths and how we are supposed to defend these ethical ends without becoming metaphysicians.

In the second edition of his History, the claims quoted in the previous paragaph have been removed. After giving a brief summary of Kant's appeal to a “fact of reason” and his argument for freedom, Lange does not go on to suggest that Kant maybe making the mistake of all metaphysicians. Rather, he writes: “So far Kant's doctrine of freedom is perfectly clear and—apart from the question of the a priority of the moral law—invulnerable” (Lange 1873-75, 2:229). What follows is a new discussion of Kant's conception of our freedom and worries about our freedom being apparently restricted only to the noumenal realm. Lange does return to declarations in favour of constructing ideals but no further explication is given of how we are supposed to find ethical ends, or a moral law, that guides the construction of these ideals, nor, for that matter, what problem in specific lies behind the above mentioned “question of the a priority of the moral law” (Lange 1873-75). Thus in the end it is hard to see what constrains, and what fundamentally is served by, the construction of these ideals. The changes between the first and second edition also suggest that Lange was not quite sure what more to say on this point.


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Cassirer, Ernst | Cohen, Hermann | Engels, Friedrich | Helmholtz, Hermann von | Kant, Immanuel | Marx, Karl | Natorp, Paul | neo-Kantianism | Nietzsche, Friedrich | socialism | Überweg, Friedrich