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Hans-Georg Gadamer

First published Mon Mar 3, 2003; substantive revision Mon Jun 8, 2009

Hans-Georg Gadamer is the decisive figure in the development of twentieth century hermeneutics—almost certainly eclipsing, in terms of influence and reputation, the other leading figures, including Paul Ricoeur, and also Gianni Vattimo (Vattimo was himself one of Gadamer's students). Trained in neo-Kantian scholarship, as well as in classical philology, and profoundly affected by the philosophy of Martin Heidegger, Gadamer developed a distinctive and thoroughly dialogical approach, grounded in Platonic-Aristotelian as well as Heideggerian thinking, that rejects subjectivism and relativism, abjures any simple notion of interpretive method, and grounds understanding in the linguistically mediated happening of tradition. Employing a more orthodox and modest, but also more accessible style than Heidegger himself, Gadamer's work can be seen as concentrated in four main areas: the first, and clearly the most influential, is the development and elaboration of a philosophical hermeneutics; the second is the dialogue within philosophy, and within the history of philosophy, with respect to Plato and Aristotle in particular, but also with Hegel and Heidegger; the third is the engagement with literature, particularly poetry, and with art; and the fourth is what Gadamer himself terms ‘practical philosophy’ (see Gadamer, 2001, 78-85) encompassing contemporary political and ethical issues. The ‘dialogical’ character of Gadamer's approach is evident, not merely in the central theoretical role he gives to the concept of dialogue in his thinking, but also in the discursive and dialogic, even ‘conversational’, character of his writing, as well as in his own personal commitment to intellectual engagement and exchange. Indeed, he is one of the few philosophers for whom the ‘interview’ has become a significant category of philosophical output (see Hahn, 1997, 588-599; also Gadamer, 2001, 2003). Although he identified connections between his own work and English-speaking ‘analytic’ thought (mainly via the later Wittgenstein, but also Donald Davidson), and has sometimes seen his ideas taken up by thinkers such as Ronald Dworkin, John McDowell, and especially Richard Rorty, Gadamer is perhaps less well known, and certainly less well-appreciated, in philosophical circles outside Europe than are some of his near-contemporaries. He is undoubtedly, however, one of the most important thinkers of the twentieth century, having had an enormous impact on a range of areas from aesthetics to jurisprudence, and having acquired a respect and reputation in Germany, and elsewhere in Europe, that went far beyond the usual confines of academia.

1. Biographical Sketch

Born on February 11, 1900, in Marburg, in Southern Germany, Hans-Georg Gadamer grew up in Breslau (now Wroclaw in Poland), where his father was Professor of Pharmacy at the University of Breslau. Showing an early interest in humanistic studies, he began university studies in Breslau in 1918, moving to Marburg with his family in 1919, and completing his doctoral studies (in his own words, ‘too young’—see Gadamer, 1997b, 7) in 1922. Gadamer's early teachers were Paul Natorp and Nicolai Hartmann, while Paul Friedlander introduced him to philological study (Gadamer passed the State Examination in Classical Philology in 1927). It was, however, Martin Heidegger (at Marburg from 1923-1928) who exerted the most important and enduring effect on Gadamer's philosophical development. Gadamer worked as Heidegger's assistant for a time, and although Gadamer took Heidegger to be disappointed with his early habilitation research, Gadamer finally submitted his habilitation dissertation (‘Plato's Dialectical Ethics’, [1991]), in 1928, under the guidance of Friedlander and Heidegger. During the 1930s and 1940s, Gadamer was able to accommodate himself, albeit reluctantly, first to National Socialism and then briefly, to Communism. While Gadamer was not an active supporter of either regime (he was never a member of the NSDAP), neither did he draw attention to himself by outright opposition, and some have seen his stance as too acquiescent (see Gadamer, 2001, for his own comments on this period; see also Wolin, 2000, and the reply by Palmer, 2002). In 1953, together with Helmut Kuhn, Gadamer founded the highly influential Philosophische Rundschau, but his main philosophical impact was not felt until the publication of Truth and Method in 1960 (1989b). He engaged in a number of important public debates in the following decades, most notably with Emilio Betti, Jürgen Habermas and Jacques Derrida. Gadamer was twice married: in 1923, to Frida Kratz (later divorced), and, in 1950, to Käte Lekebusch. Gadamer received numerous awards and prizes including, in 1971, Knight of the ‘Order of Merit’—the highest academic honor awarded in Germany. Gadamer died in Heidelberg on March 13, 2002, at the age of 102.

Gadamer's first academic appointment was to a junior position in Marburg in 1928, finally achieving a lower-level professorship there in 1937. In the meantime, from 1934-35, Gadamer held a temporary professorship at Kiel, and then, in 1939, took up the Directorship of the Philosophical Institute at the University of Leipzig, becoming Dean of the Faculty in 1945, and Rector in 1946, before returning to teaching and research at Frankfurt-am-Main in 1947. In 1949, he succeeded Karl Jaspers at Heidelberg, officially retiring (becoming Professor Emeritus) in 1968. Following his retirement, he traveled extensively, spending considerable time in North America, where he was a visitor at a number of institutions and developed an especially close and regular association with Boston College in Massachusetts.

2. Hermeneutical Foundations

2.1 Dialogue and Phronesis

Gadamer's thinking began and always remained connected with Greek thought, especially that of Plato and Aristotle. In this respect, Gadamer's early engagement with Plato, which lay at the core of both his doctoral and habilitation dissertations, was determinative of much of the character and philosophical direction of his thinking. Under the influence of his early teachers such as Hartmann, as well as Friedlander, Gadamer developed an approach to Plato that rejected the idea of any ‘hidden’ doctrine in Plato's thought, looking instead to the structure of the Platonic dialogues themselves as the key to understanding Plato's philosophy. The only way to understand Plato, as Gadamer saw it, was thus by working through the Platonic texts in a way that not only enters into the dialogue and dialectic set out in those texts, but also repeats that dialogic movement in the attempt at understanding as such. Moreover, the dialectical structure of Platonic questioning also provides the model for a way of understanding that is open to the matter at issue through bringing oneself into question along with the matter itself. Under the influence of Heidegger, Gadamer also took up, as a central element in his thinking, the idea of phronesis (‘practical wisdom’) that appears in Book VI of Aristotle's Nichomachean Ethics. For Heidegger the concept of phronesis is important, not only as a means of giving emphasis to our practical ‘being-in-the world’ over and against theoretical apprehension, but it can additionally be seen as constituting a mode of insight into our own concrete situation (both our practical situation and, more fundamentally, our existential situation, hence phronesis constitutes a mode of self-knowledge). The way in which Gadamer conceives of understanding, and interpretation, is as just such a practically oriented mode of insight—a mode of insight that has its own rationality irreducible to any simple rule or set of rules, that cannot be directly taught, and that is always oriented to the particular case at hand. The concept of phronesis can itself be seen as providing a certain elaboration of the dialogic conception of understanding Gadamer had already found in Plato, and, taken together, these two concepts can be seen as providing the essential starting point for the development of Gadamer's philosophical hermeneutics.

2.2 Ontology and Hermeneutics

Traditionally, hermeneutics is taken to have its origins in problems of biblical exegesis and in the development of a theoretical framework to govern and direct such exegetical practice. In the hands of eighteenth and early nineteenth century theorists, writers such as Chladenius and Meier, Ast and Schleiermacher, hermeneutics was developed into a more encompassing theory of textual interpretation in general—a set of rules that provide the basis for good interpretive practice no matter what the subject matter. Inasmuch as hermeneutics is the method proper to the recovery of meaning, so Wilhelm Dilthey broadened hermeneutics still further, taking it as the methodology for the recovery of meaning that is essential to understanding within the ‘human’ or ‘historical’ sciences (the Geisteswissenschaften). For these writers, as for many others, the basic problem of hermeneutics was methodological: how to found the human sciences, and so how to found the science of interpretation, in a way that would make them properly ‘scientific’. Moreover, if the mathematical models and procedures that appeared to be the hallmark of the sciences of nature could not be duplicated in the human sciences, then the task at issue must involve finding an alternative methodology proper to the human sciences as such—hence Schleiermacher's ambition to develop a formal methodology that would codify interpretive practice, while Dilthey aimed at the elaboration of a ‘psychology’ that would elucidate and guide interpretive understanding.

Already familiar with earlier hermeneutic thinking, Heidegger redeployed hermeneutics to a very different purpose and within a very different frame. In Heidegger's early thinking, particularly the lectures from the early 1920s (‘The Hermeneutics of Facticity’), hermeneutics is presented as that by means of which the investigation of the basic structures of factical existence is to be pursued—not as that which constitutes a ‘theory’ of textual interpretation nor a method of ‘scientific’ understanding, but rather as that which allows the self-disclosure of the structure of understanding as such. The ‘hermeneutic circle’ that had been a central idea in previous hermeneutic thinking, and that had been viewed in terms of the interpretative interdependence, within any meaningful structure, between the parts of that structure and the whole, was transformed by Heidegger, so that it was now seen as expressing the way in which all understanding was ‘always already’ given over to that which is to be understood (to ‘the things themselves’—‘die Sachen selbst’). Thus, to take a simple example, if we wish to understand some particular artwork, we already need to have some prior understanding of that work (even if only as a set of paint marks on canvas), otherwise it cannot even be seen as something to be understood. To put the point more generally, and in more basic ontological terms, if we are to understand anything at all, we must already find ourselves ‘in’ the world ‘along with’ that which is to be understood. All understanding that is directed at the grasp of some particular subject matter is thus based in a prior ‘ontological’ understanding—a prior hermeneutical situatedness. On this basis, hermeneutics can be understood as the attempt to ‘make explicit’ the structure of such situatedness. Yet since that situatedness is indeed prior to any specific event of understanding, so it must always be presupposed even in the attempt at its own explication. Consequently, the explication of this situatedness—of this basic ontological mode of understanding—is essentially a matter of exhibiting or ‘laying-bare’ a structure with which we are already familiar (the structure that is present in every event of understanding), and, in this respect, hermeneutics becomes one with phenomenology, itself understood, in Heidegger's thinking, as just such a ‘laying bare’.

It is hermeneutics, in this Heideggerian and phenomenological sense, that is taken up in Gadamer's work, and that leads him, in conjunction with certain other insights from Heidegger's later thinking, as well as the ideas of dialogue and practical wisdom, to elaborate a philosophical hermeneutics that provides an account of the nature of understanding in its universality (where this refers both to the ontologically fundamental character of the hermeneutical situation and the all-encompassing nature of hermeneutic practice) and, in the process, to develop a response to the earlier hermeneutic tradition's preoccupation with the problem of interpretive method. In these respects, Gadamer's work, in conjunction with that of Heidegger, represents a radical reworking of the idea of hermeneutics that constitutes a break with the preceding hermeneutical tradition, and yet also reflects back on that tradition. Gadamer thus develops a philosophical hermeneutics that provides an account of the proper ground for understanding, while nevertheless rejecting the attempt, whether in relation to the Geisteswissenschaften or elsewhere, to found understanding on any method or set of rules. This is not a rejection of the importance of methodological concerns, but rather an insistence on the limited role of method and the priority of understanding as a dialogic, practical, situated activity.

2.3 Aesthetics and Subjectivism

In 1936 Heidegger gave three lectures on ‘The Origin of the Work of Art.’ In these lectures, not published until 1950, Heidegger connects art with truth, arguing that the essence of the artwork is not its ‘representational’ character, but rather its capacity to allow the disclosure of a world. Thus the Greek temple establishes the ‘Greek’ world and in so doing allows things to take on a particular appearance within that world. Heidegger refers to this event of disclosure as the event of ‘truth’. The sense of truth at issue here is one that Heidegger presents in explicit contrast to what he views as the traditional concept of truth as ‘correctness’. Such correctness is usually taken to consist in some form of correspondence between individual statements and the world, but so-called ‘coherence’ accounts of truth, according to which truth is a matter of the consistency of a statement with a larger body of statements, can also be viewed as based upon the same underlying notion of truth as ‘correctness’. While Heidegger does not abandon the notion of truth as ‘correctness’, he argues that it is derivative of a more basic sense of truth as what he terms ‘unconcealment’. Understood in this latter sense, truth is not a property of statements as they stand in relation to the world, but rather an event or process in and through which both the things of the world and what is said about them come to be revealed at one and the same time—the possibility of ‘correctness’ arises on the basis of just such ‘unconcealment’.

It is important to recognize, however, that the unconcealment at issue is not a matter of the bringing about of some form of complete and absolute transparency. The revealing of things is, in fact, always dependent upon other things being simultaneously concealed (in much the same way as seeing something in one way depends on not seeing it in another). Truth is thus understood as the unconcealment that allows things to appear, and that also makes possible the truth and falsity of individual statements, and yet which arises on the basis of the ongoing play between unconcealment and concealment—a play that, for the most part, remains itself hidden and is never capable of complete elucidation. In the language Heidegger employs in ‘The Origin of the Work of Art’, the unconcealment of ‘world’ is thereby grounded in the concealment of ‘earth’. It is this sense of truth as the emergence of things into unconcealment that occurs on the basis of the play between concealing and unconcealing that is taken by Heidegger as the essence (or ‘origin’) of the work of art. This idea of truth, as well as the poetic language Heidegger employed in his exposition, had a decisive effect of Gadamer's own thinking. Indeed, Gadamer described his philosophical hermeneutics as precisely an attempt to take up and elaborate this line of thinking from the later Heidegger (Gadamer, 1997b, 47)

There are two crucial elements to Gadamer's appropriation of Heidegger here: first, the focus on art, and the connection of art with truth; second, the focus on truth itself as the event of prior and partial disclosure (or more properly, of concealment/unconcealment) in which we are already involved and that can never be made completely transparent. Both of these elements are connected with Gadamer's response to the subjectivist and idealist elements in German thought that were present in the neo-Kantian tradition, and, more specifically, in romantic hermeneutics and aesthetic theory. As Gadamer saw it, aesthetic theory had, largely under the influence of Kant, become alienated from the actual experience of art—the response to art had become abstracted and ‘aestheticised’—while aesthetic judgment had become purely a matter of taste, and so of subjective response. Similarly, under the influence of the ‘scientific’ historiography of such as Ranke, together with the romantic hermeneutics associated with Schleiermacher and others, the desire for objectivity had led to the separation of historical understanding from the contemporary situation that motivates it, and to a conception of historical method as based in the reconstruction of the subjective experiences of the author—a reconstruction that, as Hegel made clear, is surely impossible (see Gadamer, 1989b, 164-9).

By turning back to the direct experience of art, and to the concept of truth as prior and partial disclosure, Gadamer was able to develop an alternative to subjectivism that also connected with the ideas of dialogue and practical wisdom taken from Plato and Aristotle, and of hermeneutical situatedness taken from the early Heidegger. Just as the artwork is taken as central and determining in the experience of art, so is understanding similarly determined by the matter to be understood; as the experience of art reveals, not in spite of, but precisely because of the way it also conceals, so understanding is possible, not in spite of, but precisely because of its prior involvement. In Gadamer's developed work, the concept of ‘play’ (Spiel) has an important role here. Gadamer takes play as the basic clue to the ontological structure of art, emphasizing the way in which play is not a form of disengaged, disinterested exercise of subjectivity, but is rather something that has its own order and structure to which one is given over. The structure of play has obvious affinities with all of the other concepts at issue here—of dialogue, phronesis, the hermeneutical situation, the truth of art. Indeed, one can take all of these ideas as providing slightly different elaborations of what is essentially the same basic conception of understanding—one that takes our finitude, that is, our prior involvement and partiality, not as a barrier to understanding, but rather as its enabling condition. It is this conception that is worked out in detail in Truth and Method.

3. Philosophical Hermeneutics

3.1 The Positivity of ‘Prejudice’

One might respond to Gadamer's emphasis on our prior hermeneutic involvement, whether in the experience of art or elsewhere, that such involvement cannot but remain subjective simply on the grounds that it is always determined by our particular dispositions to experience things in certain ways rather than others—our involvement, one might say, is thus always based on subjective prejudice). Such an objection can be seen as a simple reiteration of the basic tendency towards subjectivism that Gadamer rejects, but Gadamer also takes issue directly with this view of prejudice and the negative connotations often associated with the notion, arguing that, rather than closing us off, our prejudices are themselves what open us up to what is to be understood. In this way Gadamer can be seen as attempting to retrieve a positive conception of prejudice as pre-judgment (prae-judicium) that was lost during the Renaissance. In Truth and Method, Gadamer redeploys the notion of our prior hermeneutical situatedness as it is worked out in more particular fashion in Heidegger's Being and Time (first published in 1927) in terms of the ‘fore-structures' of understanding, that is, in terms of the anticipatory structures that allow what is to be interpreted or understood to be grasped in a preliminary fashion. The fact that understanding operates by means of such anticipatory structures means that understanding always involves what Gadamer terms the ‘anticipation of completeness’—it always involves the revisable presupposition that what is to be understood constitutes something that is understandable, that is, something that is constituted as a coherent, and therefore meaningful, whole.

Gadamer's positive conception of prejudice as pre-judgment is connected with a number of different ideas in his hermeneutics. The way in which our prejudgments open us up to the matter at issue in such a way that those prejudgments are themselves capable of being revised exhibits the character of the Gadamerian conception of prejudgment, and its role in understanding, as itself constituting a version of the hermeneutic circle. The hermeneutical priority Gadamer assigns to prejudgment is also tied to Gadamer's emphasis on the priority of the question in the structure of understanding—the latter emphasis being something Gadamer takes both from Platonic dialectic and also, in Truth and Method, from the work of R. G. Collingwood. Moreover, the indispensable role of prejudgment in understanding connects directly with Gadamer's rethinking of the traditional concept of hermeneutics as necessarily involving, not merely explication, but also application. In this respect, all interpretation, even of the past, is necessarily ‘prejudgmental’ in the sense that it is always oriented to present concerns and interests, and it is those present concerns and interests that allow us to enter into the dialogue with the matter at issue. Here, of course, there is a further connection with the Aristotelian emphasis on the practical—not only is understanding a matter of the application of something like ‘practical wisdom’, but it is also always determined by the practical context out of which it arises.

The prejudicial character of understanding means that, whenever we understand, we are involved in a dialogue that encompasses both our own self-understanding and our understanding of the matter at issue. In the dialogue of understanding our prejudices come to the fore, both inasmuch as they play a crucial role in opening up what is to be understood, and inasmuch as they themselves become evident in that process. As our prejudices thereby become apparent to us, so they can also become the focus of questioning in their own turn. While Gadamer has claimed that ‘temporal distance’ can play a useful role in enabling us better to identify those prejudices that exercise a problematic influence on understanding (Gadamer acknowledges that prejudices can sometimes distort—the point is that they do not always do so), it seems better to see the dialogical interplay that occurs in the process of understanding itself as the means by which such problematic elements are identified and worked through. One consequence of Gadamer's rehabilitation of prejudice is a positive evaluation of the role of authority and tradition as legitimate sources of knowledge, and this has often been seen, most famously by Jürgen Habermas, as indicative of Gadamer's ideological conservatism—Gadamer himself viewed it as merely providing a proper corrective to the over-reaction against these ideas that occurred with the Enlightenment.

3.2 The Happening of Tradition

Inasmuch as understanding always occurs against the background of our prior involvement, so it always occurs on the basis of our history. Understanding, for Gadamer, is thus always an ‘effect’ of history, while hermeneutical ‘consciousness’ is itself that mode of being that is conscious of its own historical ‘being effected’—it is ‘historically-effected consciousness’ (wirkungsgeschichtliches Bewußtsein). Awareness of the historically effected character of understanding is, according to Gadamer, identical with an awareness of the hermeneutical situation and he also refers to that situation by means of the phenomenological concept of ‘horizon’ (Horizont)—understanding and interpretation thus always occurs from within a particular ‘horizon’ that is determined by our historically-determined situatedness. Understanding is not, however, imprisoned within the horizon of its situation—indeed, the horizon of understanding is neither static nor unchanging (it is, after all, always subject to the effects of history). Just as our prejudices are themselves brought into question in the process of understanding, so, in the encounter with another, is the horizon of our own understanding susceptible to change.

Gadamer views understanding as a matter of negotiation between oneself and one's partner in the hermeneutical dialogue such that the process of understanding can be seen as a matter of coming to an ‘agreement’ about the matter at issue. Coming to such an agreement means establishing a common framework or ‘horizon’ and Gadamer thus takes understanding to be a process of the ‘fusion of horizons’ (Horizontverschmelzung). The notion of ‘horizon’ employed here derives from phenomenology according to which the ‘horizon’ is the larger context of meaning in which any particular meaningful presentation is situated. Inasmuch as understanding is taken to involve a ‘fusion of horizons’, then so it always involves the formation of a new context of meaning that enables integration of what is otherwise unfamiliar, strange or anomalous. In this respect, all understanding involves a process of mediation and dialogue between what is familiar and what is alien in which neither remains unaffected. This process of horizontal engagement is an ongoing one that never achieves any final completion or complete elucidation—moreover, inasmuch as our own history and tradition is itself constitutive of our own hermeneutic situation as well as being itself constantly taken up in the process of understanding, so our historical and hermeneutic situation can never be made completely transparent to us. As a consequence, Gadamer explicitly takes issue with the Hegelian ‘philosophy of reflection’ that aims at just such completion and transparency.

In contrast with the traditional hermeneutic account, Gadamer thus advances a view of understanding that rejects the idea of understanding as achieved through gaining access to some inner realm of subjective meaning. Moreover, since understanding is an ongoing process, rather than something that is ever completed, so he also rejects the idea that there is any final determinacy to understanding. It is on this basis that Gadamer argues against there being any method or technique for achieving understanding or arriving at truth. The search for a methodology for the Geisteswissenschaften that would place them on a sound footing alongside the ‘sciences of nature’ (the Naturwissenschaften)—a search that had characterized much previous hermeneutical inquiry—is thus shown to be fundamentally misguided. Not only is there no methodology that describes the means by which to arrive at an understanding of the human or the historical, but neither is there any such methodology that is adequate to the understanding of the non-human or the natural. Gadamer's conception of understanding as not reducible to method or technique, along with his insistence of understanding as an ongoing process that has no final completion, not only invites comparison with ideas to be found in the work of the later Wittgenstein, but can also be seen as paralleling developments in post-Kuhnian philosophy of science.

3.3 The Linguisticality of Understanding

The basic model of understanding that Gadamer finally arrives at in Truth and Method is that of conversation. A conversation involves an exchange between conversational partners that seeks agreement about some matter at issue; consequently, such an exchange is never completely under the control of either conversational partner, but is rather determined by the matter at issue. Conversation always takes place in language and similarly Gadamer views understanding as always linguistically mediated. Since both conversation and understanding involve coming to an agreement, so Gadamer argues that all understanding involves something like a common language, albeit a common language that is itself formed in the process of understanding itself. In this sense, all understanding is, according to Gadamer, interpretative, and, insofar as all interpretation involves the exchange between the familiar and the alien, so all interpretation is also translative. Gadamer's commitment to the linguisticality of understanding also commits him to a view of understanding as essentially a matter of conceptual articulation. This does not rule out the possibility of other modes of understanding, but it does give primacy to language and conceptuality in hermeneutic experience. Indeed, Gadamer takes language to be, not merely some instrument by means of which we are able to engage with the world, but as instead the very medium for such engagement. We are ‘in’ the world through being ‘in’ language. This emphasis on the linguisticality of understanding does not, however, lead Gadamer into any form of linguistic relativism. Just as we are not held inescapably captive within the circle of our prejudices, or within the effects of our history, neither are we held captive within language. Language is that within which anything that is intelligible can be comprehended, it is also that within which we encounter ourselves and others. In this respect, language is itself understood as essentially dialogue or conversation. Like Wittgenstein, as well as Davidson, Gadamer thus rejects the idea of such a thing as a ‘private language’—language always involves others, just as it always involves the world.

Gadamer claims that language is the universal horizon of hermeneutic experience; he also claims that the hermeneutic experience is itself universal. This is not merely in the sense that the experience of understanding is familiar or ubiquitous. The universality of hermeneutics derives from the existential claim for hermeneutics that Heidegger advanced in the 1920s and that Gadamer made into a central idea in his own thinking. Hermeneutics concerns our fundamental mode of being in the world and understanding is thus the basic phenomenon in our existence. We cannot go back ‘behind’ understanding, since to do so would be to suppose that there was a mode of intelligibility that was prior to understanding. Hermeneutics thus turns out to be universal, not merely in regard to knowledge, whether in the ‘human sciences' or elsewhere, but to all understanding and, indeed, to philosophy itself. Philosophy is, in its essence, hermeneutics. Gadamer's claim for the universality of hermeneutics was one of the explicit points at issue in the debate between Gadamer and Habermas (see Ormiston and Schrift [eds.], 1990); it can also be seen as, in a certain sense, underlying the engagement between Gadamer and Derrida (see Michelfelder and Palmer [eds.], 1989), although in Derrida's case this consisted in a denial of the primacy of understanding, and the possibility of agreement, on which hermeneutics itself rests.

4. Philosophy and the History of Philosophy

Gadamer's commitment to the historically conditioned character of understanding, coupled with the hermeneutic imperative that we engage with our historical situatedness, means that he takes philosophy to itself stand in a critical relation to the history of philosophy. Gadamer's own thought certainly reflects a hermeneutical commitment to both philosophical dialogue and historical engagement. His public debates with contemporary figures such as Habermas and Derrida, although they have not always lived up to Gadamer's own ideals of hermeneutic dialogue (at least not in respect of Derrida), have provided clear evidence of Gadamer's own commitment to such engagement. The dialogue with philosophy and its history also makes up a large part of Gadamer's published work and, while that dialogue has encompassed a range of thinkers, its primary focus has been on Plato, Aristotle, Hegel and Heidegger.

In the case of Plato and Aristotle (see Gadamer 1980, 1986a, 1991), Gadamer has argued for a particular way of reading both thinkers that attends to the character of their texts, that takes those texts to display a high degree of consistency, and that, particularly in the later work, also views Plato and Aristotle as holding essentially similar views. In The Beginning of Philosophy (1997a), Gadamer also takes Plato and Aristotle as providing the indispensable point of entry to an understanding of Pre-Socratic thought. When it comes to Hegel (see Gadamer, 1971), although there is much that Gadamer finds sympathetic to his own hermeneutic project (particularly Hegel's attempt to move beyond the dichotomy of subject and object, as well as aspects of Hegel's revival of ancient dialectic), Gadamer's commitment to a hermeneutics of finitude (and so to what Hegel terms ‘bad infinity’) places him in direct opposition to the Hegelian philosophy of reflection that aims at totality and completion. It is with Heidegger, however, that Gadamer had his most significant, sustained and yet also most problematic philosophical engagement (see especially Gadamer, 1994a). Although Gadamer emphasized the continuities between his own work and that of Heidegger, and was clearly gratified by those occasions when Heidegger gave his approval to Gadamer's work, he can also be seen as involved in a subtle reworking of Heidegger's ideas. On a number of points, that reworking has a rather different character from that which is explicit in Heidegger. In particular, Gadamer argues that Heidegger's attempts, in his later thinking, to find a ‘non-metaphysical’ path of thought led Heidegger into a situation in which he experienced a ‘lack of (or need for) language’ (a Sprachnot). Gadamer's own work can thus be seen as an attempt to take up the path of Heidegger's later thought in a way that does not abandon, but rather attempts to work with our existing language. Similarly, while Heidegger views the history of philosophy as characterized by a ‘forgetting’ of being—a forgetting that is inaugurated by Plato—Gadamer takes the history of philosophy to have no such tendency. In this respect, many of the differences between Gadamer and Heidegger become clearest in their differing readings of the philosophical tradition, as well as in their approaches to poets such as Hölderlin.

5. Literature and Art

The engagement with literature and art has been a continuing feature throughout Gadamer's life and work and, in particular, Gadamer has written extensively on poets such as Celan, Goethe, Hölderlin, and Rilke (see especially Gadamer, 1994b, 1997c). Gadamer's engagement with art is strongly influenced by his dialogue with the history of philosophy, and he draws explicitly on Hegel as well as Plato. At the same time, that engagement provides an exemplification of Gadamer's hermeneutics as well as a means to develop it further, while his hermeneutic approach to art itself constitutes a rethinking of aesthetics through the integration of aesthetics into hermeneutics. In contrast to much contemporary aesthetics, Gadamer takes the experience of beauty to be central to an understanding of the nature of art and in the final pages of Truth and Method, he discusses the beautiful as that which is self-evidently present to us (as ‘radiant’) exploring also the close relationship between the beautiful and the true. Of particular importance in his writing about art and literature are the three ideas that appear in the subtitle to ‘The relevance of the beautiful’ (1986b): art as play, symbol and festival. The role of play is a central notion in Gadamer's hermeneutic thinking generally, providing the basis for Gadamer's account of the experience both of art and understanding (see Aesthetics and Subjectivism above). The symbolic character of the artwork is seen, by Gadamer, not in terms of any form of simple ‘representationalism,’ but instead in terms of the character of art as always showing something more than is literally present to us in the work (this aspect of art as referring outside itself is also taken up by Gadamer elsewhere in relation to the character of art as ‘imitation’—mimesis). The artwork, no matter what its medium, opens up, through its symbolic character, a space in which both the world, and our own being in the world, is brought to light as a single, but inexhaustibly rich totality. In the experience of art, we are not merely given a ‘moment’ of vision, but are able to ‘dwell’ along with the work in a way that takes us out of ordinary time into what Gadamer calls ‘fulfilled’ or ‘autonomous' time. Thus the artwork has a festive, as well as symbolic and playful character, since the festival similarly takes us out of ordinary time, while also opening us up to the true possibility of community.

6. Practical Philosophy

Gadamer's emphasis on application in understanding already implies that all understanding has a practical orientation in the sense of being determined by our contemporary situation. Gadamer has himself engaged, however, in more direct reflection on a range of contemporary issues (see Gadamer 1976a, 1989a, 1993b, 1998b, 1999, 2001, see also Krajewski, 2003). Much of Gadamer's discussion of these issues depends upon the hermeneutic ideas he has worked out elsewhere. A central concern in many of Gadamer's essays is the role of Europe, and European culture, in the contemporary world—something that was especially pressing for Gadamer with the advent of German reunification and the expansion of the European community (see especially Gadamer, 1989a). Here, however, a number of other closely connected issues also come into view: the nature and role of modern science and technology (see especially, 1976a, 1998b), and together with this, the role of the humanities; the question of education and, in particular, of humanistic education (1992); the issue of understanding between cultures, and especially between religions (see Lammi, 2008). In addition, Gadamer has written on matters concerning law, ethics, the changing character of the modern university, the connection between philosophy and politics, and the nature of medical practice and the concept of health (see especially Gadamer 1993b).

In almost all of these areas, Gadamer's approach is characterised, not by the attempt to apply any pre-existing theory to the domain in question, but rather by the attempt to think from within that domain, and in a way that is attentive to it. As Gadamer comments in Truth and Method ‘application is neither a subsequent nor merely an occasional part of the phenomenon of understanding, but co-determines it as a whole from the beginning’ (Gadamer,1989b,324). Theory and application do not occur, then, in separation from one another, but are part of a single hermeneutical ‘practice’.


An extensive bibliography of Gadamer's work, compiled by Richard E. Palmer, can be found in Hahn, 1997, 555-602; Palmer's bibliography is essentially a simplified version of Makita, 1995.

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Related Entries

Gadamer, Hans-Georg: aesthetics | Heidegger, Martin | hermeneutics | phenomenology