Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Wed Nov 9, 2005

The term hermeneutics covers both the first order art and the second order theory of understanding and interpretation of linguistic and non-linguistic expressions. As a theory of interpretation, the hermeneutic tradition stretches all the way back to ancient Greek philosophy. In the course of the Middle Ages and the Renaissance, hermeneutics emerges as a crucial branch of Biblical studies. Later on, it comes to include the study of ancient and classic cultures.

With the emergence of German romanticism and idealism the status of hermeneutics changes. Hermeneutics turns philosophical. It is no longer conceived as a methodological or didactic aid for other disciplines, but turns to the conditions of possibility for symbolic communication as such. The question “How to read?” is replaced by the question, “How do we communicate at all?” Without such a shift, initiated by Friedrich Schleiermacher, Wilhelm Dilthey, and others, it is impossible to envisage the ontological turn in hermeneutics that, in the mid-1920s, was triggered by Martin Heidegger's Sein und Zeit and carried on by his student Hans-Georg Gadamer. Now hermeneutics is not only about symbolic communication. Its area is even more fundamental: that of human life and existence as such. It is in this form, as an interrogation into the deepest conditions for symbolic interaction and culture in general, that hermeneutics has provided the critical horizon for many of the most intriguing discussions of contemporary philosophy, both within an Anglo-American context (Rorty, McDowell, Davidson) and within a more Continental discourse (Habermas, Apel, Ricoeur, and Derrida).

1. The Beginnings of Hermeneutics

The term hermeneutics, a Latinized version of the Greek hermeneutice, has been part of common language from the beginning of the 17th century. Nevertheless, its history stretches back to ancient philosophy. Addressing the understanding of religious intuitions, Plato used this term in a number of dialogues, contrasting hermeneutic knowledge to that of sophia. Religious knowledge is a knowledge of what has been revealed or said and does not, like sophia, involve knowledge of the truth-value of the utterance. Aristotle carried this use of the term a step further, naming his work on logic and semantics Peri hermeneias, which was later rendered as De interpretatione. Only with the Stoics, and their reflections on the interpretation of myth, do we encounter something like a methodological awareness of the problems of textual understanding.

The Stoics, however, never developed a systematic theory of interpretation. Such a theory is only to be found in Philo of Alexandria, whose reflections on the allegorical meaning of the Old Testament anticipate the idea that the literal meaning of a text may conceal a deeper non-literal meaning that may only be uncovered through systematic interpretatory work. About 150 years later, Origenes expounds on this view by claiming that the Scripture has three levels of meaning, corresponding to the triangle of body, soul, and spirit, each of which reflects a progressively more advanced stage of religious understanding.

With Augustine we encounter a thinker whose influence on modern hermeneutics has been profoundly acknowledged by Dilthey, Heidegger, and Gadamer. According to Gadamer, it is Augustine who first introduces the universality-claim of hermeneutics. This claim arises from the connection Augustine establishes between language and interpretation, but also from his claim that interpretation of Scripture involves a deeper, existential level of self-understanding. The work of Thomas Aquinas, to which the young Heidegger paid a great deal of attention, has also had an impact on the development of modern hermeneutics. Heidegger, however, was mainly interested in Aquinas's notion of Being, and not in his engagement with specifically hermeneutic issues such as the proper authorship of certain pseudo-Aristotelian texts. Presupposing the relative unity of an author's work, Aquinas questions the authenticity of these texts by comparing them to the existing Aristotelian corpus, thus anticipating a critical-philological procedure that would later emerge as a crucial aspect of Friedrich Schleiermacher's notion of grammatical interpretation. This, however, is not the only point of contact between medieval philosophy and modern hermeneutics. Another such junction is the way in which medieval interpretations of Sacred texts, emphasizing their allegorical nature rather than their historical roots, are mirrored in Gadamer's attempt to rehabilitate the hermeneutic relevance of the allegory.

In spite of these and similar points of dialogue, it is in the wake of Martin Luther's sola scriptura that we see the dawn of a genuinely modern hermeneutics. Following Luther's emphasis on faith and inwardness, it was possible to question the authority of traditional interpretations of the Bible in order to emphasize the way in which each and every reader faces the challenge of making the truths of the text her own. Our understanding of a text does not consist in a faithful adoption of the predominant or authorized readings of the time. It is up to the individual reader to stake out her own path to the potential meaning and truth of the text. Reading now becomes a problem in a new way.

Coming from a very different tradition, Giambattisto Vico, the author of the Scienza nuova (1725), is another central figure in the development of early modern hermeneutics. Speaking out against the Cartesianism of his time, Vico argues that thinking is always rooted in a given cultural context. This context is historically developed, and, moreover, intrinsically related to ordinary language, evolving from the stage of myth and poetry to the later phases of theoretical abstraction and technical vocabularies. To understand oneself is thus to understand the genealogy of one's own intellectual horizon. This grants a new urgency to the historical sciences. Moreover, it offers a model of truth and objectivity that differs from those entertained by the natural sciences. The historian does not encounter a field of idealized and putatively subject-independent objects, but investigates a world that is, fundamentally, her own. There is no clear distinction between the scientist and the object of her studies. Understanding and self-understanding cannot be kept apart. Self-understanding does not culminate in law-like propositions. Appealing to tact and common sense, it is oriented towards who we are, living, as we do, within a given historical context of practice and understanding.

Another philosopher who came to influence the early stages of modern hermeneutics is Benedict de Spinoza. In the seventh chapter of the Tractatus theologico-politicus (1670), Spinoza proposes that in order to understand the most dense and difficult sections of the Holy Scriptures, one must keep in mind the historical horizon in which these texts were written, as well as the mind by which they were produced. There is an analogy, Spinoza claims, between our understanding of nature and our understanding of the Scriptures. In both cases, our understanding of the parts hinges on our understanding of a larger whole, which, again, can only be understood on the basis of the parts. Seen in a larger perspective, this hermeneutic circle, the movement back and forth between the parts and the whole of the text, is an important hermeneutical theme. What does not lend itself to immediate understanding can be interpreted by means of philological work. The study of history becomes an indispensable tool in the process of unlocking hermetic meaning and language-use.

Preoccupied respectively with subjective piety, with the new science of man, and with the historical aspects of understanding, Luther, Vico, and Spinoza all shaped and gave direction to modern hermeneutics. Yet none of these thinkers developed anything like an explicit philosophical theory of understanding, let alone a method or a set of normatively binding rules by means of which the process of interpretation should proceed. Such a theory was first formulated by Johann Martin Chladenius.

In his Einleitung zur richtigen Auslegung vernünftiger Reden und Schriften (1742), Chladenius distinguishes hermeneutics from logic, but also elaborates a typology of points of view. Attesting to the legacy of Leibniz and Wolf, the so-called School Philosophy, the focus on the different points of view enables Chladenius to explain how variations in our perception of phenomena and problems may cause difficulties in our understanding of other people's texts and statements. At stake is not really a historical methodology in the modern meaning of the term, but a didactic and cognitively oriented procedure of interpretation. In order to understand what, at first, might look strange or obscure—and Chladenius outlines a whole catalogue of different obscurities—one ought to take into account the tacit and pre-reflective assumptions characterizing the point of view from which the problematic text or statement was brought forth. Only thus may we reach a true or objective understanding of the subject matter. Hermeneutics, at this point, goes hand in hand with epistemology. With his coupling of the search for truth and the search for understanding, Chladenius anticipates an important orientation in 20th century hermeneutics.

Georg Friedrich Meier is another hermeneutically minded philosopher within the Leibniz-Wolffian paradigm. Whereas Chladenius had been concerned with speech and writing, Meier's hermeneutics is geared towards signs as such—that is, every type of sign, including non-verbal or natural signs. In Versuch einer Allgemeinen Auslegungskunst (1757), Meier argues that signs do not stand for or refer to a specific non-semiotic meaning or intention, but gain their meaning through their location within a larger, linguistic whole. What determines the meaning of a sign is its relation to other signs. Meier's contribution to hermeneutics is to argue for the interdependence of hermeneutics and language, introducing a semantic holism in which linguistic obscurities are detangled by reference to language itself, not by reference to extra-linguistic elements such as the intention of the author.

Considering the early beginning of the modern hermeneutic tradition, two more names must be mentioned: Friedrich Ast and Friedrich August Wolf.

Ast published his Grundlinien der Grammatik, Hermeneutik und Kritik in 1808. An accomplished classicist and a student of Friedrich Schelling, his aim was to provide a methodology through which the whole of world-historical spirit could be retrieved. Individual utterances are neither to be understood with reference to their author, nor with reference to their place within the semiotic system, but according to their location within world-history. This, Ast thought, was possible through the combination of a synthetic and an analytic approach, the former focusing on the whole, the latter on the particular parts of which this whole consists. Ast thereby extends the scope of the hermeneutic circle. Originally conceived in terms of the relationship between the parts and the whole of the text, the hermeneutic circle now includes the text's relationship to historical tradition and culture at large.

Like Ast, Wolf was trained in Classical studies. Both his Museum der Altertumswissenschaft (1807) and his Vorlesungen über die Enzyklopädie der Altertumswissenschaft (1831) address the epistemic, that is, the philosophical, aspects of classical philology. Classical studies, Wolf claims, aims at a total knowledge of its object, but should also reflect on the relevance of such knowledge as well as the method through which it is reached. However, dealing with ancient texts, hermeneutic knowledge presupposes not only a general study of culture, but also a certain sensitivity to the individuality of its author. By establishing philology as a methodological discipline reflecting both the shared, cultural framework and the dimension of individuality, Wolf came to mark his place as one of the most important precursors of romantic hermeneutics.

2. Romantic Continuations

On the one hand, there is an interest in the human sciences and a willingness to defend the integrity of these sciences as distinct from the natural sciences. On the other hand, there is a deep concern with the problem of making sense of the texts handed over to us from the past. These are the twin pillars on which modern hermeneutics is built. For, strictly speaking, it is only at the point where these two orientations merge and mutually inform one another that we encounter the first attempts at articulating a genuinely philosophical hermeneutics. This happens in the period of German romanticism and idealism. Herder, the Schlegel brothers, and Novalis are all important in this context. So, too, is the philosophical background provided by Kant and Hegel. Yet it is Friedrich Schleiermacher who first manages to pull together the intellectual currents of the time so as to articulate a coherent conception of a universal hermeneutics, a hermeneutics that does not relate to one particular kind of textual material (such as the Bible or ancient texts), but to linguistic meaning in general.

Schleiermacher taught hermeneutics from 1805 onwards at the universities of Halle and Berlin. Although schooled in Kantian philosophy, Schleiermacher was never a full-fledged Kantian. He drew on the resources of Leibniz's monadology, Schelling's philosophy of identity, as well as the teachings of British empiricism. Yet the (Kantian) question of legitimacy remains at the center of his hermeneutics.

According to Schleiermacher, understanding other cultures is not something we can take for granted. Understanding others involves an openness towards the fact that what seems rational, true, or coherent may cover something deeply unfamiliar. This openness is only possible in so far as we systematically scrutinize our own hermeneutic prejudices. Schleiermacher speaks of this as a stricter, as opposed to a laxer hermeneutic practice. Yet a strict hermeneutic practice, Schleiermacher repeatedly emphasizes, cannot, as such, guarantee a just or fully adequate understanding. Nevertheless, it is, he thinks, an indispensable aid. It is something that may help the hermeneutician not to fall prey to the tendency to filter another's speech or writing through one's own cultural, theological, or philosophical frame of mind.

The point applies not only to our understanding of other cultures. For, according to Schleiermacher, all use of language is located somewhere between radical individuality and radical universality. Neither of these exists in an entirely purified form. All language-use is referred to grammar and a common symbolic vocabulary, yet we use these shared resources in more or less individual ways—more individual in the case of, say, poetry, less individual in, say, scientific discourse or conversations about the weather. However, the individuality of language-use does not refer to an inner, inaccessible layer of the mind. It refers to something like the style, the voice, or the particularity of the language as used or applied.

In order to grasp the meaning of another person's speech or texts, one ought to focus on both aspects of her language-use, the shared resources or grammar and syntax as well as individual application. Schleiermacher addresses this as the task of combining grammatical and technical interpretation. There is, however, no rule for this combination. Instead one must compare the text with other texts from the same period, from the same writer even, while continuously keeping in sight the uniqueness of the particular work. Schleiermacher, like Schlegel and other philosophers of the time, speaks of this as the capacity for divination: the ability to move from the particular to the universal without the aid of general rules or doctrines. Only by combining a comparative approach with creative hypothesis-making may a better understanding be obtained.

Understanding better, however, implies no promise of a fully adequate understanding. For although the risk of misunderstanding does not imply a state of total alienation—we do, after all, successufully communicate most of the time—it does mean that understanding is never final. There will always be an indivisible remainder that pushes the interpreter forwards to explore hermeneutic vistas that have so far been left outside the pale of understanding.

It is precisely the idea of a critical turn in hermeneutics combined with the focus on the individuality of language-use that made Schleiermacher such an important figure for the next generation of hermeneuticians, concerned as they were with the methodology of the human sciences, or, as they understood it, with the critique, in the Kantian meaning of the term, of historical reason.

3. Critique of Historical Reason

After Schleiermacher's death in 1834, hermeneutics was carried forward by Alexander von Humboldt, Chajim Steinthal, and Friedrich Carl von Savigny. In this period, however, historians, theologians and jurists were largely concerned with the application of hermeneutics within their special disciplines, and not with the conditions of possibility for understanding and communication as such. Three thinkers nevertheless stand out as exceptions to this tendency. They are Johann Gustav Droysen, Leopold von Ranke, and, most importantly, Wilhelm Dilthey. In different ways, Droysen, von Ranke, and Dilthey represent a return to Vico's old problem, namely how one can philosophically justify and account for the particular kind of objectivity pertaining to the study of man. Yet whereas Vico had been interested in culture and history at large, the task is now more specific: How to justify the humanities within a university system that is based upon the Enlightenment ideals of critical reason and rationality, and no longer on authority, tradition, and theological canon?

The structure of history, Ranke argues, echoes the structure of a text in so far as it consists of a particular kind of co-dependence between parts and whole. Like reading, understanding history means moving along the paths of the hermeneutic circle, from part to whole and back again. Because the historical mind is itself situated in history, there is, however, no end to this circular movement. History cannot, as the Hegelians had been arguing, be conceptualized, once and for all, by speculative philosophy. Understanding history is an ongoing activity. This, however, does not make it superfluous as a science. In our effort to understand history, historical life is brought to consciousness about itself. Doing historical work means actively participating in the cultural tradition that is being investigated; it means being historical in the most emphatic way.

Like Ranke, Droysen is interested in the methodology of the historical sciences. Trying to break free from the idealistic tradition to which Ranke still adhered, Droysen makes the case for a theory of history that, like the methodology of the natural sciences, has less to do with the object of study (history or nature) than with the manner in which the study is carried out. The natural sciences uncover universal natural laws. The historical sciences are sciences of understanding. Unlike the scientist of nature, the historian is separated from the object of study by the ever-renewed and self-renewing tradition. Her object is always mediated. Yet in understanding history the researcher also understands something that is ultimately her own, the outcome of human freedom, goals, and desires. At the end of the day, it applies even for Droysen that history is intelligible and meaningful—that the study of it permits a kind of objectivity that is different from but still comparable to the one at stake in the natural sciences.

With Dilthey, the search for a philosophical legitimation of the human sciences is brought a significant step further. The author of a vast monograph on Schleiermacher and his time, Dilthey responds to the questions raised by Droysen and Ranke by retrieving the resources of romantic hermeneutics. Scientific explanation of nature, Dilthey argues, must be completed with a theory of how the world is given to us through symbolically mediated practices. To provide such a theory is the aim of the humanities, or rather the aim of the philosophy of the humanities, the area to which Dilthey dedicated his entire academic career.

The concepts of Erlebnis (lived experience) and Verstehen (understanding) play a crucial role within Dilthey's endeavors to liberate the methodology of the humanities from that of the natural sciences. In his early writings, Dilthey made little effort to distinguish between these terms. Later on, however, Erlebnis is connected with the process of self-understanding, whereas Verstehen relates to our understanding of others. Dilthey's important point is that, as such, Erlebnis, does not provide self-understanding. Self-understanding is obtained only to the extent that the self relates to itself as it relates to others, i.e., in a mediated way. Yet Erlebnis, synthesizing and active, remains the psychological source of all experience, the experiential potential that is articulated and conceptualized in understanding.

Turning to the level of historical research, the hermeneutically oriented scientist must respond to this situation by combining a more intuitive hypothesis-formation (aiming at the lived experience at stake) and a comparative method that would revise and secure the objectivity of this process. This is Dilthey's critical adaptation of Schleiermacher's romantic hermeneutics: a theory that replaces the romantic vocabulary of divination, congeniality, and comparison with one of an initial inductive hypothesis-formation leading up to a process of critical, empirical investigation and historical comparison aiming at revision or improvement of the initial hypothesis. Dilthey's most important contribution to hermeneutics might be said to rest in the fact that he is the first to ground hermeneutics in a general theory of human life and existence. In this sense, Dilthey's philosophy paves the way for what we have later come to recognize as the turn to ontology.

4. The Ontological Turn

Informed by his reading of Schleiermacher, Droysen, and Dilthey, Martin Heidegger's Sein und Zeit (1927) completely transformed the discipline of hermeneutics. In Heidegger's view, hermeneutics is not a matter of understanding linguistic communication. Nor is it about providing a methodological basis for the human sciences. As far as Heidegger is concerned, hermeneutics is ontology; it is about the most fundamental conditions of man's being in the world. Yet Heidegger's turn to ontology is not completely separated from earlier hermeneutic philosophies. Just as Vico had started out with a critique of the Cartesian notion of certainty, so Heidegger sets out to overthrow what he takes to be the Cartesian trajectory of modern philosophical reason.

For Descartes, Heidegger argues, the task of philosophy is to show how the subject can rationally establish the norms of epistemic certainty whereby a given representation is judged to be true or false. From such a position, he continues, the way is not long to a conception of truth in terms of the methods provided by the natural sciences alone. Such a model, however, tends to forget the most fundamental, pre-scientific aspects of our being in the world. This is the area of Heidegger's hermeneutics. As such, hermeneutics no longer emerges as one of several philosophical possibilities. Rather, hermeneutics—the hermeneutics of facticity, as Heidegger calls it—is what philosophy is all about in the first place.

This reflects back on Heidegger's definition of terms such as understanding, interpretation, and assertion. Understanding, in Heidegger's account, is neither a method of reading nor the outcome of a willed and carefully conducted procedure of critical reflection. It is not something we consciously do or fail to do, but something we are. Understanding is a mode of being, and as such it is characteristic of human being, of Dasein. The pre-reflective way in which Dasein inhabits the world is itself of a hermeneutic nature. Our understanding of the world presupposes a kind of pragmatic know-how that is revealed through the way in which we, without theoretical considerations, orient ourselves in the world. We open the door without objectifying or conceptually determining the nature of the door-handle or the doorframe. The world is familiar to us in a basic, intuitive way. Most originally, Heidegger argues, we do not understand the world by gathering a collection of neutral facts by which we may reach a set of universal propositions, laws, or judgments that, to a greater or lesser extent, corresponds to the world as it is. The world is tacitly intelligible to us.

The fundamental familiarity with the world is brought to reflective consciousness through the work of interpretation. Interpretation, however, does not have to be of a propositional nature. At stake is the explicit foregrounding of a given object, as in the experience of the dysfunctional hammer all of a sudden materializing in all its lack of hammer-usefulness. At this point, we are forced to stop hammering. As if awakened to a new level of alertness, the tacit activity of hammering is replaced by the sudden awareness of what a hammer is for. Interpretation makes things, objects, the fabric of the world, appear as something, as Heidegger puts it. Still, this as is only possible on the background of the world as a totality of practices and intersubjective encounters, of the world that is opened up by Dasein's being understandingly there.

At this point, we have still not reached the level at which we, according to Heidegger, would locate the idea of truth as agreement between judgment and world. Yet a truth it is nonetheless—the truth of world-disclosure. Through the synthesizing activity of understanding, the world is disclosed as a totality of meaning, a space in which Dasein is at home.

Only through assertion is the synthesizing activity of understanding and interpretation brought to language. In disclosing the as-structure of a thing, the hammer as a hammer, interpretation discloses its meaning. Assertion, then, pins this meaning down linguistically. The linguistic identification of a thing is, in other words, not original but is predicated on the world-disclosive synthesis of understanding and interpretation. This also applies with regard to the truth-value of the assertion. The world-disclosive truth of understanding is more fundamental than the truth presented through the propositional structure “s is p,” and prior, also, to the reflectively grounded certainty maintained by the Cartesian philosopher.

This Heideggerian reformulation of the problem of truth gives rise to a new conception of the hermeneutic circle. In Spinoza, Ast, and Schleiermacher, the hermeneutic circle was conceived in terms of the mutual relationship between the text as a whole and its individual parts, or in terms of the relation between text and tradition. With Heidegger, however, the hermeneutic circle refers to something completely different: the interplay between our self-understanding and our understanding the world. The hermeneutic circle is no longer perceived as a helpful philological tool, but entails an existential task with which each of us is confronted.

According to Heidegger, Dasein is distinguished by its self-interpretatory endeavors. Dasein is a being whose being appears as an issue. However, because Dasein is fundamentally embedded in the world, we simply cannot understand ourselves without the detour through the world, and the world cannot be understood without reference to Dasein's way of life. This, however, is a perpetual process. Hence, what is precarious here is not, as in the earlier hermeneutic tradition, the moment when we are able to leave the hermeneutic circle, where our interpretative endeavors culminate in a lucid, clear, and indubitable grasp of the meaning of the text. What matters, Heidegger claims, is the attempt to enter the circle in the right way, with a willingness to realize that the investigation into the ontological conditions of my life ought to work back on the way in which my life is led.

With this turn towards ontology, the problems of philology become secondary. Hermeneutics now deals with the meaning—or lack of meaning—of human life: it is turned into an existential task.

5. Hermeneutic Humanism

After the publication of Being and Time, Heidegger stops engaging with explicit hermeneutic issues (as well as the terminology of understanding, interpretation, and the hermeneutic circle). This aspect of his thinking, however, is taken up by his student, Hans-Georg Gadamer.

Gadamer works within the Heideggerian paradigm to the extent that he fully accepts the ontological turn in hermeneutics. Yet he wants to explore the consequences of such a turn for our understanding of the human sciences. This, Gadamer thinks, can only be done if we leave behind the framework of romantic hermeneutics, both in its Schleiermacherian and in its Diltheyan versions. Going back to Vico and the neo-Aristotelian strands of early modern humanism, Gadamer wants to combine the Heideggerian notion of the world-disclosive synthesis of understanding with the idea of Bildung, of education in culture. This, by and large, is the project of Wahrheit und Methode (1960), a work that Gadamer spent more than 30 years completing.

Human being, Gadamer argues, is a being in language. It is through language that the world is opened up for us. We learn to know the world by learning to master a language. Hence we cannot really understand ourselves unless we understand ourselves as situated in a linguistically mediated, historical culture. Language is our second nature

This has consequences for our understanding of art, culture, and historical texts—i.e., on the subject area of the human sciences. Being a part of our own tradition, historical works do not primarily present themselves to us as neutral and value-free objects of scientific investigation. They are part of the horizon in which we live and through which our world-view gets shaped. We are, in other words, formed by these great works before we get the chance to approach them with an objectivizing gaze.

Gadamer argues that we never know a historical work as it originally appeared to its contemporaries. We have no access to its original context of production or to the intentions of its author. Tradition is always alive. It is not passive and stifling, but productive and in constant development. Trying, as the earlier hermeneuticians did, to locate the (scientific) value of the humanities in their capacity for objective reconstruction is bound to be a wasted effort. The past is handed over to us through the complex and ever-changing fabric of interpretations, which gets richer and more complex as decades and centuries pass. History, as Gadamer puts it, is always effective history. This, however, is not a deficiency. It is, rather, a unique possibility, a possibility that involves the particular kind of truth-claim that Gadamer ascribes to the human sciences: the truth of self-understanding.

At the end of the day, Gadamer claims, it is not really we who address the texts of tradition, but the canonic texts that address us. Having traveled through decades and centuries, the classic works of art, literature, science, and philosophy question us and our way of life. Our prejudices, whatever aspects of our cultural horizon that we take for granted, are brought into the open in the encounter with the past. As a part of the tradition in which we stand, historical texts have an authority that precedes our own. Yet this authority is kept alive only to the extent that it is recognized by the present. We recognize the authority of a text (or a work of art) by engaging with it in textual explication and interpretation, by entering into a dialogical relationship with the past. It is this movement of understanding that Gadamer refers to as the fusion of horizons. As we come, through the work of interpretation, to understand what at first appears alien, we participate in the production of a richer, more encompassing context of meaning—we gain a better and more profound understanding not only of the text but also of ourselves. In the fusion of horizons, the initial appearance of distance and alienness does itself emerge as a function of the limitations of our own initial point of departure.

Obtaining a fusion of horizons requires us to engage with the text in a productive way. This, however, is not something we can learn by coming to master a certain doctrine, method, or theory. It is more like a tacit capacity, which we acquire by following the example of others. The knowledge at stake is like a practical know-how; it resembles the Aristotelian phronesis. It is a knowledge that can neither be deduced theoretically, nor be fully articulated, but that rests on a kind of tact or sensitivity that is only exhibited in the form of exemplary judgments and interpretations.

This co-determination of text and reader is Gadamer's version of the hermeneutic circle. As important as the interplay between the parts and the whole of a text is the way in which our reading contributes to its effective history, adding to the complexity and depth of its meaning. The meaning of the text is not something we can grasp once and for all. It is something that exists in the complex dialogical interplay between past and present. Just as we can never master the texts of the past, so do we fail—necessarily and constitutively—to obtain conclusive self-knowledge. Gaining knowledge of tradition and knowing ourselves are both interminable processes; they are tasks without determinate end-points. This is the philosophical gist of Gadamer's humanistic ontology: that our being, historically conditioned as it is, is always more being (Sein) than conscious being (Bewusstsein).

6. Objectivity and Relativism

The force with which Truth and Method came to shape the conjunctures of contemporary hermeneutics can only be envisaged by taking into account how, over the past 40 years, the discussion of philosophical hermeneutics has, by and large, been a discussion of Gadamer's work.

One example is Emilio Betti. Publishing his Teoria della interpretatione in 1964, Betti approaches hermeneutics from a non-ontological point of view, explicitly connecting himself to the legacy of Schleiermacher and Dilthey. Hermeneutics, for Betti, should confine itself to the epistemological problems of interpretation, and not try to engage with the deepest conditions of human existence. Speech and texts, Betti argues, are objectified representations of human intentions. To interpret their meaning is to breathe life into these symbolically mediated intentions. This is possible because although the interpreter's individuality and the individuality expressed in the text are constitutively different, the interpreter may overcome her own point of view in order to get a grasp on the meaning of the text. At issue is an attempt to re-create the original process of creation: not in order to reach the psychological state or content of the author, but to get at the true and only meaning of the text.

Similar aspirations lie behind the criticism launched by Eric D. Hirsch in the second half of the 1960s. Hirsch's major work, Validity in Interpretation (1967), attempts to refute the central Gadamerian notion of the fusion of horizons. Like Betti, Hirsch takes this idea to invoke a problematic epistemic relativism. Without a concept of validation, he argues, no interpretation would be more plausible than any other. Knowledge and objectivity would be impossible in the domain of hermeneutics. But knowledge and objectivity, Hirsch thinks, is precisely what defines the human sciences, even though these sciences are based upon interpretation rather than explanation.

It is illuminating, in this context, to compare Betti's and Hirsch's objections, to the criticism directed against Truth and Method from another point of view, namely that of the Frankfurt School. Represented by Jürgen Habermas and Karl-Otto Apel, this criticism is also driven by a worry about the potential relativism of an ontologically informed hermeneutics. Nonetheless, according to Habermas and Apel, this problem is by no means sufficiently resolved by Betti and Hirsch.

7. Critique of Ideology

In a number of articles, Habermas draws attention to what he takes to be the political naiveté of Gadamer's hermeneutics. In Habermas's view, Gadamer places too much emphasis on the authority of tradition, leaving no room for critical judgment and reflection. Reason is denied the power of a critical, distanced judgment. What is needed is therefore not just an analysis of the way in which we de facto are conditioned by history but a set of quasi-transcendental principles of validity in terms of which the claims of the tradition may be subjected to evaluation. Hermeneutics, Habermas argues, must be completed by a critical theory of society.

It is important to realize how Habermas's objections differ from those brought forth by Betti and Hirsch. As opposed to Betti and Hirsch, Habermas does not claim that Gadamer's approach to hermeneutics is completely mistaken. He argues, rather, that Gadamer ascribes to hermeneutics an illegitimate kind of universality. Hence, the fundamental problem with Gadamer's hermeneutics would not be solved by calling for a hermeneutic method. The idea of a formal method is indeed convincingly criticized by Gadamer. Instead, what is needed is an effort to work out an adequate standard of validity, or what Habermas refers to as the quasi-transcendental principles of communicative reason. Only thus may hermeneutics, guided by the social sciences, serve the purpose of emancipation and social liberation.

Apel, by and large, shares Habermas worries, but approaches the field of hermeneutics from a slightly different angle. Like Gadamer, Apel was a student of Heidegger. Apel wants to show that Gadamer misunderstood his teacher. Towards the 1960s, Apel claims, the Heideggerian conception of truth undergoes a significant alteration. Although Apel grants that Heidegger still finds world-disclosive understanding a necessary condition for truth, he claims that Heidegger no longer thinks it is a sufficient one. This is the point that Gadamer misses, according to Apel. Gadamer does not see how the later Heidegger holds that the ontological level of understanding must be completed by an appeal to a trans-historical dimension of validity, not unlike the ones that were later to be proposed by Apel and Habermas.

These strands of criticisms—here represented by Betti, Hirsch, Habermas, and Apel—have not been left unanswered. Again and again, Gadamer emphasizes that his aim was never to dispense with every appeal to validity, objectivity, and method in understanding. This is simply a misreading, he claims. Along the paths staked out by Kant's critical turn, he sought, rather, to investigate the conditions of possibility for understanding as such. These conditions are not something that can be removed or bracketed by appealing to a hermeneutic method. Furthermore, it is not the case that our situatedness within history is a limiting condition only: rather, as the space of human experience and reason, it opens up the world to us in the first place.

Whichever line of argument one finds more convincing, it is hard not to agree that both Gadamer and his critics have gained from these encounters. And it is, it seems, the concessions and the criticisms, the specifications and the revisions, that have made it possible for a philosopher such as Paul Ricoeur to propose something like a third way in hermeneutics, an alternative to both a merely epistemic orientation in hermeneutics and to Gadamer's ontological questioning of the distinction between facticity and validity in interpretation.

8. Semiotics and Post-Structuralism

Indebted to psychoanalysis as well as to the tradition of French semiotics, Ricoeur sets out to demonstrate that there is no unbridgeable gap between ontological and critical hermeneutics. Although the differences between the two are genuine, he proposes an alternative that aims at unifying the most convincing aspects of them both. Ricoeur agrees with Habermas and Apel that the hermeneutic act must always be accompanied by critical reflection. Yet he does not find that this requires a leaving behind of the field of tradition and historical texts. Thus Ricoeur emphasizes how the text itself may open up a space of existential and political possibilities. This dynamic, productive power of the text undermines the idea of reality as a fixed, unyielding network of authoritative patterns of interpretations.

Jacques Derrida also approaches the field of hermeneutics from the background of post-structuralist theory. Like Apel, he claims that Gadamer misreads Heidegger. But whereas Apel fears that the lack of a quasi-transcendental criterion of validity may lead to a situation where a world-disclosive tradition is given too much authority vis-à-vis the critically reflecting and judging subject, Derrida's worry is that Gadamer remains within a tradition that, since Plato, has understood truth, logos, and rationality in terms of a metaphysics of presence. The divergence between Derrida and Gadamer—their interpretations of Heidegger as well as their general theories of truth and meaning—were explicitly brought to the fore in a famous meeting between the two philosophers in Paris in 1981.

Here Derrida questioned the idea of a continuously unfolding continuity of understanding. Meaning, he insisted, is not based on the will to dialogue alone. Most fundamentally, it is made possible by absence, by the relations of a word to other words within the ever-evasive network of structures that language ultimately is. Our relation to the speech of others, or to the texts of the past, is not one of mutual respect and interaction. It is a relationship in which we have to fight against misunderstanding and dissemination, one in which the focus on communality in language provides but a harmful illusion. The ethics of hermeneutics, consisting in the recognition of the possible truth of the other's point of view, tends to cover up the way in which the other escapes me, the way in which the I always fails to recognize the thou in its constitutive difference.

Gadamer, on the other hand, argues that Derrida's position—his rejection of every continuum of meaning, of an orientation towards truth, and of a genuine communication—potentially harbors indifference and that the focus on discontinuity and fragmentation resembles the kind of thinking that he criticized, in the first part of Truth and Method, as aesthetic consciousness. Precisely by emphasizing how the subject may reach beyond herself in dialogical encounters with others does the term Bildung, in Gadamer's view, allow for an ethical aspect of hermeneutics, for a hermeneutics that may contribute to a political, rather than an aesthetic humanism.

9. Hermeneutics and Pragmatism

The ethical significance of hermeneutics, particularly its resources for handling relativist challenges, has been an important issue in the reception and exploration of hermeneutic thought in Anglo-American philosophy. However, the main impetus for appropriation and integration of hermeneutics with elements of the analytical tradition has been meta-philosophical. The most influential exponent of this development is Richard Rorty.

Filtering Heidegger's ontological hermeneutics through his distinction between constructive and therapeutic philosophy, Rorty reads Being and Time as an anti-Kantian, anti-representationalist antidote to the foundationalist epistemological project of Western Philosophy. Heidegger's emphasis on the temporality and incompleteness of all understanding, on Dasein's inextricable, dynamic and never fully articulated involvement with the world, makes him, in Rorty's Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature (1979), a hero (along with Dewey and Wittgenstein) of therapeutic, anti-metaphysical pragmatist thinking. In time, however, Rorty comes to see Heidegger as unable to escape the metaphysics of representation; in Heidegger's philosophy of Being, Rorty finds another version of the Ground of All Right Thinking. To Rorty's mind, Heidegger fails to heed his own advice, to overcome metaphysics, we must leave metaphysics alone. Continuing his own turn away from metaphysics, Rorty after Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature increasingly looks to literature, and to the relation between philosophy and literature. As he explores the idea of Philosophy as a kind of writing, Rorty seeks to align philosophical thought and insight with, to put it in his own terms, poetry rather than physics. Developing the ramifications of this contrast, Rorty articulates in a more fundamental way than in Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature his opposition to the alignment and assimilation of philosophical knowledge with scientific knowledge. This development of Rorty's thought, which eventually leads him away from Heidegger, is not, however, a turning away from hermeneutic philosophy. On the contrary, it brings to the fore a deep affinity with the hermeneutic humanism of Gadamer.

Gadamer is a lesser, but perhaps more enduring, hero of Rorty's attempt to deconstruct the representationalist paradigm in philosophy from within. As Rorty articulates his conversational, non-representationalist, anti-methodological view of philosophy after epistemology, he turns precisely to Gadamer's account of understanding. Philosophical conversation should not be a search for commensuration, it should be, rather, hermeneutical. In relying on this term, Rorty intends to appropriate Gadamer's description of understanding as a fusion of horizons, as an event in which the subject is altered, rather than a process over which she exerts methodological control.

Rorty's application of Gadamer for his pragmatist, anti-ontological purposes, is, however, quite selective. For instance, while Gadamer finds in Kant an essential source of liberating anti-scientistic insight, Rorty unequivocally casts Kant as the arch villain of representationalism and institutor of the scheme-content distinction. Another measure of the distance between them is the difference between Rorty's avowedly ethnocentric defense of liberal ideals, and Gadamer's notion of the appropriation of tradition as a way of being responsive to reason. Nevertheless, the contact points between Rortyan pragmatism and hermeneutics are real and significant, not least expressed in the commitment to the idea of philosophy as intellectual activity in the humanistic tradition.

This affinity is attested to also by the work of philosophers who draw significantly on both Rorty and Gadamer. Some of Rorty's readers have been influenced by his critical exposition of the assumptions of representationalist metaphysics and his anti-rationalistic emphasis on the contingency of human thought. Yet they find untenable Rorty's attempt to turn the issue of the legitimacy of ethical and epistemic norms into a matter of sociology. For readers in this predicament, Gadamer's elaboration of the historical nature of reason and, indeed, his own exegetical, discursive dialogical practice may provide important resources. The most notable example of such a philosopher is John McDowell.

McDowell's appropriation of Gadamer in Mind and World (1994) undoubtedly owes something to Rorty's use of Gadamerian ideas in his modulation of pragmatism. However, while Rorty uses hermeneutics to label a position that stands opposed to epistemology-based philosophy, past and present, McDowell's appropriation of hermeneutics consists in part of a conciliatory reading of the past, in particular, of Kant. This conciliation rests on a central component in Gadamer's attempt to give a non-relativist view of a fully historicized reason, namely, a Hegel-inspired idea of dialogue. Dialogue is the mode of progress of understanding, and dialogue, according to both McDowell and Gadamer, presupposes a willingness to submit, at least temporarily, to the claims of another. Submission here should not be taken to imply blind acceptance, rather it is a matter of maintaining discursive openness by not insisting on the pre-eminence of ones own ways of putting the subject at issue. Maintaining this openness of vocabulary, this tentativeness of phrase and of re-phrasing, is from a hermeneutic perspective a guiding norm of any genuine dialogue. The reason is that only in such openness are new truths able to emerge, truths that are not simply a yielding of one position to another, but a genuine preservation of the insight contained in either.

This dynamic, practical, educational aspect of dialogue is an essential element of ontological hermeneutics, and McDowell draws explicitly on it. McDowell aims to conceive of persons as biologically embodied temporal creatures immersed in a shared world, yet capable by nature of being responsive to reason and thus of becoming free subjects. Thus he addresses, among other things, a central problematic of much Anglophone philosophy of mind. A critical ingredient in McDowell's project, however, is the idea of second nature. In virtue of their natural capacities, creatures like us are potentially dialogical, that is, responsive to reason. The development of second nature is precisely the realization of this potential. McDowell, drawing on explicitly Aristotelian elements in Gadamer's notion of reason, provides an original perspective on the requirements of naturalism as he works out the nature of this transformation into second nature in hermeneutical terms. McDowell focuses in particular on the dialectical, organic relation between tradition and the subject who comes at the same to understand, to continue, and to renew that tradition. This process can be regarded as an opening up of the space of reason. It is, simultaneously, a realization of the subject's autonomy as a thinker and an affirmation of the authority and openness of tradition. In McDowell's conception, it provides a tool for understanding sensitivity to reason as a realization of a potential inherent in biological nature.

The orientation of McDowell's philosophical project is more closely aligned with Gadamer's dialogical reading of past thinkers than is Rorty's more sweepingly critical style of historical narrative. It is interesting to note, therefore, that both Rorty and McDowell draw extensively on the thought of Donald Davidson, and both emphasize intersections between Davidson's philosophy and Gadamerian hermeneutics. It seems clear that there has been no significant mutual influence between Davidson and Gadamer. As well, the former's explicit philosophical concerns—how to articulate a non-reductive monism, to provide the form of a theory of meaning, to uncover the social conditions of propositional content—are very different from those of Gadamer. Yet innovative philosophers like McDowell and Rorty who are inspired by Davidson, appear to have been, among Anglophone theorists, particularly receptive to hermeneutic thought. Conversely, philosophers with a deep interest in the hermeneutic stream of Continental philosophy have shown an affinity for Davidsonian thinking. It is worthwhile, therefore, to look for convergences.

Three common points of emphasis are immediately salient: on a tight connection between understanding and truth; secondly, on the interpenetration of our grasp of linguistic meaning and of objective reality; and, thirdly, on the social nature of meaning and thought. With regard to the first point, Davidson's approach to the nature of linguistic competence has emphasized the constitutive role of the so-called principle of charity in all interpretation. This principle has it that we understand each other as speakers and agents principally and fundamentally in so far as we take each other as rational agents, as, in McDowell's phrase, responsive to norms of reason. For Davidson this means, among other things, that we take each other's sincere utterances on the whole as true. This is an inevitable outcome of what it is, as Davidson conceives it, to understand the language of another. While Davidson is concerned to give an account of the nature of linguistic competence that lets us specify the form of a semantic theory for a speaker, Gadamer seeks to illuminate how it is that a concrete, temporally immersed and spatially located individual may be open to, and understand, a point of view different from her own. For Gadamer, as we have seen, this implies some kind of change or movement, and here, too, in the fusion of horizons, the individuals grasp of truth as something over and above her own particular perspective, turns out to be the critical lever. For both Davidson and Gadamer, in spite of their different theoretical interests, communication depends on our ability to see the truth conveyed in the articulated point of view of another.

For both, this idea leads naturally into the second and third points above. Regarding a relation to truth as constitutive of dialogical meaning, Gadamer, following Heidegger, refuses to allow any fundamental dichotomy between what a subject represents as true and how the world actually, objectively, is. To be sure, he does not deny the possibility of error or ignorance. However, for Gadamer, our particular orientation toward the world, though necessarily limiting what we are able to grasp, is always also a manner of being open precisely to the world. The notion of objective reality can have no other content for Gadamer than this openness that the very perspectival nature of our understanding provides. That we are open to objective reality shows itself in our ability to rearticulate our view of the world in rational dialogue. Dialogue, however, is exactly an openness to others; for Gadamer, to be epistemically open to the world and to be open to the points of view of others are, in the end, inseparable capacities. Both, for Gadamer, are essentially capacities of language. Here Gadamer explicitly echoes Heidegger's dictum that language is the house of being. We understand language in so far as we are with others in a common and commonly known objective world.

In making this claim, Gadamer is joined by Davidson. Davidson holds that we understand others most basically by relating their words to the world around them, in what he terms Radical Interpretation. Moreover, the contents of our own thoughts, and so of our very recognition of the words of others and the objects and events to which they refer, themselves depend on our sharing with others a pattern of interaction with the world. Davidson refers to this as triangulation.

From different theoretical and philosophical perspectives, then, Gadamer and Davidson both take positions that break dramatically with the subjectivist tradition in modern philosophy, a mode of thinking that, following Descartes, ascribes a deep epistemic and ontological significance to the first-person perspective, the reflecting I. Undoubtedly this is a key reason for their common relevance to philosophers who are struggling to break away from traditional modern approaches to the problems of validity, of knowledge and of mind-world relations.

10. Conclusion

In the hands of Rorty, McDowell and an increasing number of other contemporary thinkers, the resources of philosophical hermeneutics are deployed in an effort to break out of the epistemic, dualistic paradigms of modern philosophy, and to open new philosophical ground no longer haunted by the specters of relativism and scepticism, nor by the dream of foundational justification. Now, it may seem paradoxical that a mode of thought that emphasizes exactly our beholdenness to tradition should be instrumental in what is often presented as a deliberate break with tradition. However, this impression of paradox ought to be fleeting. One of the lessons of philosophical hermeneutics is exactly that intellectual innovation of this sort depends on—indeed, is a manifestation of—the self-renewing power of tradition, of its dynamism, and its interpretability and reinterpretability. The current appropriation of hermeneutics for revisionist philosophical purposes illustrates the hermeneutic notion of effective history. While transcending anything the early interpretation-theorists could ever have imagined, the deployment of Gadamerian thought to break with subjectivism would not have been possible without them. This effective-history, moreover, is dialectical—our reading of the early hermeneuticians, our understanding of the potential inherent in their thought, is shaped essentially by this very effective-history, which both separates us from them and makes them understandable to us. Appreciating hermeneutics as a living tradition is not, in the end, a matter of identifying a theory or a family of theories. It is fundamentally a matter of perceiving a moving horizon, engaging a strand of dialogue that is an on-going re-articulation of the dynamically historical nature of all human thought.


1. The Beginnings of Modern Hermeneutics

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2. Romantic Continuations

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3. Critique of Historical Reason

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4. The Ontological Turn

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5. Hermeneutic Humanism

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6. Objectivity and Relativism

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7. Critique of Ideology

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8. Semiotics and Post-structuralism

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9. Hermeneutics and Pragmatism.

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Related Entries

Aquinas, Saint Thomas | Augustine, Saint | Davidson, Donald | Gadamer, Hans-Georg | Habermas, Jürgen | Heidegger, Martin | Herder, Johann Gottfried von | Kant, Immanuel | Ricoeur, Paul | Rorty, Richard | Schelling, Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph von | Schleiermacher, Friedrich Daniel Ernst