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Galileo Galilei

First published Fri Mar 4, 2005; substantive revision Thu May 21, 2009

Galileo Galilei (1564–1642) has always played a key role in any history of science and, in many histories of philosophy, he is a, if not the, central figure of the scientific revolution of the 17th century. His work in physics or natural philosophy, astronomy, and the methodology of science still evoke debate after over 360 years. His role in promoting the Copernican theory and his travails and trials with the Roman Church are stories that still require re-telling. This article attempts to provide an overview of these aspects of Galileo's life and work, but does so by focusing in a new way on his discussions of the nature of matter.

1. Brief Biography

Galileo was born on February 15, 1564 in Pisa. By the time he died on January 8, 1642 (but see problems with the date, Machamer 1998, pp. 24–5) he was as famous as any person in Europe. Moreover, when he was born there was no such thing as ‘science’, yet by the time he died science was well on its way to becoming a discipline and its concepts and method a whole philosophical system.

Galileo and his family moved to Florence in 1572. He started to study for the priesthood, but left and enrolled for a medical degree at the University of Pisa. He never completed this degree, but instead studied mathematics notably with Ostilio Ricci, the mathematician of the Tuscan court. Later he visited the mathematician Christopher Clavius in Rome and started a correspondence with Guildobaldo del Monte. He applied and was turned down for a position in Bologna, but a few years later in 1589, with the help of Clavius and del Monte, he was appointed to the chair of mathematics in Pisa.

In 1592 he was appointed, at a much higher salary, to the position of mathematician at the University of Padua. While in Padua he met Marina Gamba, and in 1600 their daughter Virginia was born. In 1601 they had another daughter Livia, and in 1606 a son Vincenzo.

It was during his Paduan period that Galileo worked out much of his mechanics and began his work with the telescope. In 1610 he published The Starry Messenger, and soon after accepted a position as Mathematician and Philosopher to the Grand Duke of Tuscany (and a non-teaching professorship at Pisa). He had worked hard for this position and even named the moons of Jupiter after the Medici. There were many reasons for his move but he says he did not like the wine in the Venice area and he had to teach too many students. Late in 1610, the Collegio Romano in Rome, where Clavius taught, certified the results of Galileo's telescopic observations. In 1611 he became a member of what is perhaps the first scientific society, the Academia dei Lincei.

In 1612 Galileo published a Discourse on Floating Bodies, and in 1613, Letters on the Sunspots. In this latter work he first expressed his position in favor of Copernicus. In 1614 both his daughters entered the Franciscan convent of Saint Mathew, near Florence. Virginia became Sister Maria Celeste and Livia, Sister Arcangela. Marina Gamba, their mother, had been left behind in Padua when Galileo moved to Florence.

In 1613–4 Galileo entered into discussions of Copernicanism through his student Benedetto Castelli, and wrote a Letter to Castelli. In 1616 he transformed this into the Letter to the Grand Duchess Christina. In February 1616, the Scared Congregation of the Index condemned Copernicus' book On the Revolution of the Heavenly Orbs, pending correction. Galileo then was called to an audience with Cardinal Robert Bellarmine and advised not to teach or defend Copernican theory.

In 1623 Galileo published The Assayer dealing with the comets and arguing they were sublunary phenomena. In this book, he made some of his most famous methodological pronouncements including the claim the book of nature is written in the language of mathematics.

The same year Maffeo Barberini, Galileo's supporter and friend, was elected Pope Urban VIII. Galileo felt empowered to begin work on his Dialogues concerning the Two Great World Systems. It was published with an imprimatur from Florence (and not Rome) in 1632. Shortly afterwards the Inquisition banned its sale, and Galileo was ordered to Rome for trial. In 1633 he was condemned. There is more about these events and their implications in the final section of this article, Galileo and the Church.

In 1634, while Galileo was under house arrest, his daughter, Maria Celeste died. (Cf. Sobel 1999). At this time he began work on his final book, Discourses and Mathematical Demonstrations concerning Two New Sciences. This book was smuggled out of Italy and published in Holland. Galileo died early in 1642. Due to his conviction, he was buried obscurely until 1737.

For detailed biographical material, there are a number of sources. The best and classic work dealing with Galileo's life and scientific achievements is Stillman Drake's Galileo at Work (1978). A popular, readable biography is James Reston's Galileo: A Life (1994).

2. Introduction and Background

For most people, in the 17th Century as well as today, Galileo was and is seen as the ‘hero’ of modern science. Galileo discovered many things: with his telescope, he first saw the moons of Jupiter and the mountains on the Moon; he determined the parabolic path of projectiles and calculated the law of free fall on the basis of experiment. He is known for defending and making popular the Copernican system, using the telescope to examine the heavens, inventing the microscope, dropping stones from towers and masts, playing with pendula and clocks, being the first ‘real’ experimental scientist, advocating the relativity of motion, and creating a mathematical physics. His major claim to fame probably comes from his trial by the Catholic Inquisition and his purported role as heroic rational, modern man in the subsequent history of the ‘warfare’ between science and religion. This is no small set of accomplishments for one 17th Century Italian, who was the son of a court musician and who left the University of Pisa without a degree.

One of the good things about dealing with such momentous times and people is that they are full of interpretive fecundity. Galileo and his work provide one such occasion. Since his death in 1642, Galileo has been the subject of manifold interpretations and much controversy. The use of Galileo's work and the invocations of his name make a fascinating history (Segre 1991, Palmerino and Thijssen 2004,  Finocchiaro 2005), but this is not our topic here.

Philosophically, Galileo has been used to exemplify many different themes, usually as a side bar to what the particular writer wished to make the hallmark of the scientific revolution or the nature of good science. Whatever was good about the new science or science in general, it was Galileo who started it. One early 20th Century tradition of Galileo scholarship used to divvy up Galileo's work into three or four parts: (1) his physics, (2) his astronomy, and (3) his methodology, which could include his method of Biblical interpretation and his thoughts about the nature of proof or demonstration. In this tradition, typical treatments dealt with his physical and astronomical discoveries and their background and/or who were Galileo's predecessors. More philosophically, many would ask how his mathematics relates to his natural philosophy? How did he produce a telescope and use his telescopic observations to provide evidence in favor of Copernicanism (Reeves 2008)? Was he an experimentalist (Settle 1961, 196, 1983, 1992; Palmieri 2008), a mathematical Platonist (Koyré 1939), an Aristotelian emphasizing experience (Geymonat 1954), precursor of modern positivist science (Drake 1978), or maybe an Archimedean (Machamer 1998), who might have used a revised Scholastic method of proof (Wallace 1992)? Or did he have no method and just fly like an eagle in the way that geniuses do (Feyerabend 1975)? Behind each of these claims there was some attempt to place Galileo in an intellectual context that brought out the background to his achievements. Some emphasized his debt to the artisan/engineer practical tradition (Rossi 1962), others his mathematics (Giusti 1993, Feldhay 1998, Palmieri 2001, 2003, Renn 2002), some his mixed mathematics (Machamer 1978, 1998, Lennox 1986, Wallace 1992), others his debt to atomism (Shea 1972, Redondi 1983), and some his use of Hellenistic and Medieval impetus theory (Duhem 1954, Claggett 1966, Shapere 1974).

Yet most everyone in this tradition seemed to think the three areas—physics, astronomy and methodology—were somewhat distinct and represented different Galilean endeavors. More recent historical research has followed contemporary intellectual fashion and shifted foci bringing new dimensions to our understanding of Galileo by studying his rhetoric (Moss 1993, Feldhay 1998, Spranzi 2004), the power structures of his social milieu (Biagioli 1993, 2006), his personal quest for acknowledgment (Shea and Artigas 2003) and more generally has emphasized the larger social and cultural history, specifically the court and papal culture, in which Galileo functioned (Redondi 1983, Biagioli 1993, 2006).

In an intellectualist recidivist mode, this entry will outline his investigations in physics and astronomy and exhibit, in a new way, how these all cohered in a unified inquiry. In setting this path out I shall show why, at the end of his life, Galileo felt compelled (in some sense of necessity) to write the Discourses Concerning the Two New Sciences, which stands as a true completion of his overall project and is not just a reworking of his earlier research that he reverted to after his trial, when he was blind and under house arrest. Particularly, I shall try to show why both of the two new sciences, especially the first, were so important (a topic not much treated except recently by Biener 2004). In passing, I shall touch on his methodology and his mathematics (and here refer you to some of the recent work by Palmieri 2001, 2003). At the end I shall have some words about Galileo, the Catholic Church and his trial.

3. Galileo's Scientific Story

The philosophical thread that runs through Galileo's intellectual life is a strong and increasing desire to find a new conception of what constitutes natural philosophy and how natural philosophy ought to be pursued. Galileo signals this goal clearly when he leaves Padua in 1611 to return to Florence and the court of the Medici and asks for the title Philosopher as well as Mathematician. This was not just a status-affirming request, but also a reflection of his large-scale goal. What Galileo accomplished by the end of his life in 1642 was a reasonably articulated replacement for the traditional set of analytical concepts connected with the Aristotelian tradition of natural philosophy. He offered, in place of the Aristotelian categories, a set of mechanical concepts that were accepted by most everyone who afterwards developed the ‘new sciences’, and which, in some form or another, became the hallmark of the new philosophy. His way of thinking became the way of the scientific revolution (and yes, there was such a ‘revolution’ (pace Shapin 1996 and others, cf. selections in Lindberg 1990, Osler 2000.)

Some scholars might wish to describe what Galileo achieved in psychological terms as an introduction of new mental models (Palmieri 2003) or a new model of intelligibility (Machamer 1998). However phrased, Galileo's main move was to de-throne the Aristotelian physical categories of the one celestial (the aether or fifth element) and four terrestrial elements (fire, air, water and earth) and their differential directional natures of motion (circular,  and up and down). In their place he left only one element, corporeal matter, and a different way of describing the properties and motions of matter in terms of the mathematics of the equilibria of proportional relations (Palmieri 2001) that were typified by the Archimedian simple machines—the balance, the inclined plane, the lever, and, he includes, the pendulum (Machamer 1998, Machamer and Hepburn 2004, Palmieri 2008). In doing so Galileo changed the acceptable way of talking about matter and its motion, and so ushered in the mechanical tradition that characterizes so much of modern science, even today. But this would take more explaining (Dijksterhuis 1950, Machamer et al. 2000, Gaukroger 2009).

As a main focus underlying Galileo's accomplishments, it is useful to see him as being interested in finding a unified theory of matter, a mathematical theory of the material stuff that constitutes the whole of the cosmos. Perhaps he didn't realize that this was his grand goal until the time he actually wrote the Discourses on the Two New Sciences in 1638. Despite working on problems of the nature of matter from 1590 onwards, he could not have written his final work much earlier than 1638, certainly not before Starry Messenger of 1610, and actually not before the Dialogues on the Two Chief World Systems of 1632. Before 1632, he did not have the theory and evidence he needed to support his claim about unified, singular matter. He had thought deeply about the nature of matter before 1610 and had tried to work out how best to describe matter, but the idea of unified matter theory had to wait on the establishment of principles of matter's motion on a moving earth. And this he did not do until the Dialogues.

Galileo began his critique of Aristotle in the 1590 manuscript, De Motu. The first part of this manuscript deals with terrestrial matter and argues that Aristotle's theory has it wrong. For Aristotle, sublunary or terrestrial matter is of four kinds [earth, air, water, and fire] and has two forms, heavy and light, which by nature are different principles of (natural) motion, down and up. Galileo, using an Archimedian model of floating bodies and later the balance, argues that there is only one principle of motion, the heavy (gravitas), and that lightness (or levitas) is to be explained by the heavy bodies moving so as to displace or extrude other bits of matter in such a direction that explains why the other bits rise. So on his view heaviness (or gravity) is the cause of all natural terrestrial motion. But this left him with a problem as to the nature of the heavy, the nature of gravitas? In De Motu, he argued that the moving arms of a balance could be used as a model for treating all problems of motion. In this model heaviness is the proportionality of weight of one object on one arm of a balance to that of the weight of another body on the other arm of the balance. In the context of floating bodies, weight is the ‘weight’ of one body minus weight of the medium.

Galileo realized quickly these characterizations were insufficient, and so began to explore how heaviness was relative to the different specific gravities of bodies having the same volume. He was trying to figure out what is the concept of heaviness that is characteristic of all matter. What he failed to work out, and this was probably the reason why he never published De Motu, was this positive characterization of heaviness. There seemed to be no way to find standard measures of heaviness that would work across different substances. So at this point he did not have useful replacement categories.

A while later, in his 1600 manuscript, Le Mecaniche (Galileo 1600/1960) he introduces the concept of momento, a quasi force concept that applies to a body at a moment and which is somehow proportional to weight or specific gravity (Galluzzi 1979). Still, he has no good way to measure or compare specific gravities of bodies of different kinds and his notebooks during this early 17th century period reflect his trying again and again to find a way to bring all matter under a single proportional measuring scale. He tries to study acceleration along an inclined plane and to find a way to think of what changes acceleration brings. In this regard and during this period he attempts to examine the properties of percussive effect of bodies of different specific gravities, or how they have differential impacts. Yet the details and categories of how to properly treat weight and movement elude him.

One of Galileo's problems was that the Archimedian simple machines that he was using as his model of intelligibility, especially the balance, are not easily conceived of in a dynamic way. Except for the inclined plane, time is not a property of the action of simple machines that one would normally attend to. In discussing a balance, one does not normally think about how fast an arm of the balance descends nor how fast a body on the opposite arm is rising (though Galileo in his Postils to Rocco ca. 1634–45 does; see Palmieri 2005). The converse is also true. It is difficult to model ‘dynamic’ phenomena that deal with the rate of change of different bodies as problems of balance arms moving upwards or downwards because of differential weights. So it was that Galileo's classic dynamic puzzle about how to describe time and the force of percussion, or the force of body's impact, would remain unsolved, He could not, throughout his life find systematic relations among specific gravities, height of fall and percussive forces. In the Fifth Day of the Discouses, he presciently explores the concept of the force of percussion. This concept will become, after his death, one of the most fecund ways to think about matter.

In 1603–9, Galileo worked long at doing experiments on inclined planes and most importantly with pendula. The pendulum again exhibited to Galileo that acceleration and, therefore, time is a crucial variable. Moreover, isochrony—equal times for equal lengths of string, despite different weights—goes someway towards showing that time is a possible form for describing the equilibrium (or ratio) that needs to be made explicit in representing motion. It also shows that in at least one case time can displace weight as a crucial variable. Work on the force of percussion and inclined planes also emphasized acceleration and time, and during this time (ca. 1608) he wrote a little treatise on acceleration that remained unpublished.

We see from this period that Galileo's law of free fall arises out of this struggle to find the proper categories for his new science of matter and motion. Galileo accepts, probably as early as the 1594 draft of Le Mecaniche, that natural motions might be accelerated. But that accelerated motion is properly measured against time is an idea enabled only later, chiefly through his failure to find any satisfactory dependence on place and specific gravity. Galileo must have observed that the speeds of bodies increase as they move downwards and, perhaps, do so naturally, particularly in the cases of the pendulum, the inclined plane, in free fall, and during projectile motion. Also at this time he begins to think about percussive force, the force that a body acquires during its motion that shows upon impact. For many years he thinks that the correct science of these changes should describe how bodies change according to where they are on their paths. Specifically, it seems that height is crucial. Percussive force is directly related to height and the motion of the pendulum seems to involve essentially equilibrium with respect to the height of the bob (and time also, but isochrony did not lead directly to a recognition of time's importance.)

The law of free fall, expressed as time squared, was discovered by Galileo through the inclined plane experiments (Drake 1999, v. 2), but he attempted to find an explanation of this relation, and the equivalent mean proportional relation, through a velocity-distance relation. His later and correct definition of natural acceleration as dependent on time is an insight gained through recognizing the physical significance of the mean proportional relation (Machamer and Hepburn 2004; for a different analysis of Galileo's discovery of free fall see Renn et al. 2004.) Yet Galileo would not publish anything making time central to motion until 1638, in Discourses on the Two New Sciences (Galileo 1638/1954.) But let us return to the main matter.

In 1609 Galileo begins his work with the telescope. Many interpreters have taken this to be an interlude irrelevant to his physics. The Starry Messenger, which describes his early telescopic discoveries, was published in 1610. There are many ways to describe Galileo's findings but for present purposes they are remarkable as his start at dismantling of the celestial/terrestrial distinction (Feyerabend 1975). Perhaps the most unequivocal case of this is when he analogizes the mountains on the moon to mountains in Bohemia. The abandonment of the heaven/earth dichotomy implied that all matter is of the same kind, whether celestial or terrestrial. Further, if there is only one kind of matter there can be only one kind of natural motion, one kind of motion that this matter has by nature. So it has to be that one law of motion will hold for earth, fire and the heavens. This is a far stronger claim than he had made back in 1590. In addition, he described of his discovery of the four moons circling Jupiter, which he called politically the Medicean stars (after the ruling family in Florence, his patrons). In the Copernican system, the earth having a moon revolve around it was unique and so seemingly problematic. Jupiter's having planets made the earth-moon system non-unique and so again the earth became like the other planets.  Some fascinating background and treatments of this period of Galileo's life and motivations have recently appeared (Biagoli 2006, and Reeves 2008).

A few years later in his Letters on the Sunspots (1612), Galileo enumerated more reasons for the breakdown of the celestial/terrestrial distinction. Basically the ideas here were that the sun has spots (maculae) and rotated in circular motion, and, most importantly Venus had phases just like the moon, which was the spatial key to physically locating Venus as being between the Sun and the earth, and as revolving around the Sun. In these letters he claimed that the new telescopic evidence supported the Copernican theory. Certainly the phases of Venus contradicted the Ptolemaic ordering of the planets.

Later in 1623, Galileo argued for a quite mistaken material thesis. In The Assayer, he tried to show that comets were sublunary phenomena and that their properties could be explained by optical refraction. While this work stands as a masterpiece of scientific rhetoric, it is somewhat strange that Galileo should have argued against the super-lunary nature of comets, which the great Danish astronomer Tycho Brahe had demonstrated earlier.

Yet even with all these changes, two things were missing. First, he needed to work out some general principles concerning the nature of motion for this new unified matter. Specifically, given his Copernicanism, he needed to work out, at least qualitatively, a way of thinking about the motions of matter on a moving earth. The change here was not just the shift from a Ptolemaic, Earth-centered planetary system to a Sun-centered Copernican model. For Galileo, this shift was also from a mathematical planetary model to a physically realizable cosmography. It was necessary for him to describe the planets and the earth as real material bodies. In this respect Galileo differed dramatically from Ptolemy, Copernicus, or even Tycho Brahe, who had demolished the crystalline spheres by his comets-as-celestial argument and flirted with physical models (Westman 1976). So on the new Galilean scheme there is only one kind of matter, and it may have only one kind of motion natural to it. Therefore, he had to devise (or shall we say, discover) principles of local motion that will fit a central sun, planets moving around that sun, and a daily whirling earth.

This he did by introducing two new principles. In Day One of his Dialogues on the Two Chief World Systems (Galileo 1632) Galileo argued that all natural motion is circular. Then, in Day Two, he introduced his version of the famous principle of the relativity of observed motion. This latter held that motions in common among bodies could not be observed. Only those motions differing from a shared common motion could be seen as moving. The joint effect of these two principles was to say that all matter shares a common motion, circular, and so only motions different from the common, say up and down motion, could be directly observed. Of course, neither of the principles originated with Galileo. They had predecessors. But no one needed them for the reasons that he did, namely that they were necessitated by a unified cosmological matter.

In Day Three, Galileo dramatically argues for the Copernican system. Salviati, the persona of Galileo, has Simplicio, the ever astounded Aristotelian, make use of astronomical observations, especially the facts that Venus has phases and that Venus and Mars are never far from the Sun, to construct a diagram of the planetary positions. The resulting diagram neatly corresponds to the Copernican model. Earlier in Day One, he had repeated his claims from The Starry Messenger, noting that the earth must be like the moon in being spherical, dense and solid, and having rugged mountains. Clearly the moon could not be a crystalline sphere as held by some Aristotelians.

In the Dialogues, things are more complicated than I have just sketched. Galileo, as noted, argues for a circular natural motion, so that all things on the earth and in the atmosphere revolve in a common motion with the earth so that the principle of the relativity of observed motion will apply to phenomena such as balls dropped from the masts of moving ships. Yet he also introduces at places a straight-line natural motion. For example, in Day Three, he gives a quasi account for a Coriolis-type effect for the winds circulating about the earth by means of this straight-line motion. (David Miller discovered this in the text; see also Hooper 1998.) Further, in Day Four, when he is giving his proof of the Copernican theory by sketching out how the three-way moving earth mechanically moves the tides, he nuances his matter theory by attributing to the element water the power of retaining an impetus for motion such that it can provide a reciprocal movement once it is sloshed against a side of a basin. This was not Galileo's first dealing with water. We saw it in De Motu in 1590, with submerged bodies, but more importantly he learned much more while working through his dispute over floating bodies. (Discourse on Floating Bodies, 1612). In fact a large part of this debate turned on the exact nature of water as matter, and what kind of mathematical proportionality could be used to correctly describe it and bodies moving in it (Cf. Palmieri, 1998, 2004a).

The final chapter of Galileo's scientific story comes in 1638 with the publication of Discourses of the Two New Sciences. The second science, discussed (so to speak) in the last two days, dealt with the principles of local motion. These have been much commented upon in the Galilean literature. Here is where he enunciates the law of free fall, the parabolic path for projectiles and his physical “discoveries” (Drake 1999, v. 2). But the first two days, the first science, has been much misunderstood and little discussed. This first science, misleadingly, has been called the science of the strength of materials, and so seems to have found a place in history of engineering, since such a course is still taught today. However, this first science is not about the strength of materials per se. It is Galileo's attempt to provide a mathematical science of his unified matter. (See Machamer 1998, Machamer and Hepburn 2004, and the detailed work spelling this out by Biener 2004). Galileo realizes that before he can work out a science of the motion of matter, he must have some way of showing that the nature of matter may be mathematically characterized. Both the mathematical nature of matter and the mathematical principles of motion he believes belong to the science of mechanics, which is the name he gives for this new way of philosophizing. Remember that specific gravities did not work.

So it is in Day One that he begins to discuss how to describe, mathematically (or geometrically), the causes of how beams break. He is searching for the mathematical description of the essential nature of matter. He rules out certain questions that might use infinite atoms as basis for this discussion, and continues on giving reasons for various properties that matter has. Among these are questions of the constitution of matter, properties of matter due to its heaviness, the properties of the media within which bodies move and what is the cause of a body's coherence as a single material body. The most famous of these discussions is his account of acceleration of falling bodies, that whatever their weight would fall equally fast in a vacuum. The Second Day lays out the mathematical principles concerning how bodies break. He does this all by reducing the problems of matter to problems of how a lever and a balance function. Something he had begun back in 1590, though this time he believes he is getting it right, showing mathematically how bits of matter solidify and stick together, and do so by showing how they break into bits. The ultimate explanation of the “sticking” eluded him since he felt he would have to deal with infinitesimals to really solve this problem.

The second science, Days Three and Four of Discorsi, dealt with proper principles of local motion, but this was now motion for all matter (not just sublunary stuff) and it took the categories of time and acceleration as basic. Interestingly Galileo, here again, revisited or felt the need to include some anti-Aristotelian points about motion as he had done back in 1590. The most famous example of his doing this, is his “beautiful thought experiment”, whereby he compares two bodies of the same material of different sizes and points out that according to Aristotle they fall at different speeds, the heavier one faster. Then, he says, join the bodies together. In this case the lightness of the small one ought to slow down the faster larger one, and so they together fall as a speed less than the heavy fell in the first instance. Then his punch line: but one might also conceive of the two bodies joined as being one larger body, in which case it would fall even more quickly. So there is a contradiction in the Aristotelian position (Palmieri 2005). His projected Fifth Day would have treated the grand principle of the power of matter in motion due to impact. He calls it the force of percussion, which deals with two bodies interacting. This problem he does not solve, and it won't be solved until Descartes, probably following Beeckman, turns the problem into finding the equilibrium points for colliding bodies.

The sketch above provides the basis for understanding Galileo's changes. He has a new science of matter, a new physical cosmography, and a new science of local motion. In all these he is using a mathematical mode of description based upon, though somewhat changed from, the proportional geometry of Euclid, Book VI and Archimedes (for details on the change see Palmieri 2002).

It is in this way that Galileo developed the new categories of the mechanical new science, the science of matter and motion. His new categories utilized some of the basic principles of traditional mechanics, to which he added the category of time and so emphasized acceleration. But throughout, he was working out the details about the nature of matter so that it could be understood as uniform and treated in a way that allowed for coherent discussion of the principles of motion. That a unified matter became accepted and its nature became one of the problems for the ‘new science’ that followed was due to Galileo. Thereafter, matter really mattered.

4. Galileo and the Church

No account of Galileo's importance to philosophy can be complete if it does not discuss Galileo's condemnation and the Galileo affair (Finocchiaro 1989). The end of the episode is simply stated. In late 1632, after publishing Dialogues on the Two Chief World Systems, Galileo was ordered to go to Rome to be examined by the Holy Office of the Inquisition. In January 1633, a very ill Galileo made an arduous journey to Rome. Finally, in April 1633 Galileo was called before the Holy Office. This was tantamount to a charge of heresy, and he was urged to repent (Shea and Artigas, 183f). Specifically, he had been charged with teaching and defending the Copernican doctrine that holds that the Sun is at the center of the universe and that the earth moves. This doctrine had been deemed heretical in 1616, and Copernicus' book had placed on the index of prohibited books, pending correction.

Galileo was called four times for a hearing; the last was on June 21, 1633. The next day, 22 June, Galileo was taken to the church of Santa Maria sopra Minerva, and ordered to kneel while his sentence was read. It was declared that he was “vehemently suspect of heresy”. Galileo was made to recite and sign a formal abjuration:

I have been judged vehemently suspect of heresy, that is, of having held and believed that the sun in the centre of the universe and immoveable, and that the earth is not at the center of same, and that it does move. Wishing however, to remove from the minds of your Eminences and all faithful Christians this vehement suspicion reasonably conceived against me, I abjure with a sincere heart and unfeigned faith, I curse and detest the said errors and heresies, and generally all and every error, heresy, and sect contrary to the Holy Catholic Church. (Quoted in Shea and Artigas 194)

Galileo was not imprisoned but had his sentence commuted to house arrest. In December 1633 he was allowed to retire to his villa in Arcetri, outside of Florence. During this time he finished his last book, Discourses on the Two New Sciences, which was published in 1638, in Holland, by Louis Elzivier. The book does not mention Copernicanism at all, and Galileo professed amazement at how it could have been published. He died on January 8, 1642.

There has been much controversy over the events leading up to Galileo's trial, and it seems that each year we learn more about what actually happened. There is also controversy over the legitimacy of the charges against Galileo, both in terms of their content and judicial procedure. The summary judgment about this latter point is that the Church most probably acted within its authority and on ‘good’ grounds given the condemnation of Copernicus, and, as we shall see, the fact that Galileo had been warned by Cardinal Bellarmine earlier in 1616 not to defend or teach Copernicanism. The were also a number of political factors given the Counter Reformation, the 30 Years War (Miller 2008), and the problems with the papacy of Urban VIII that served as further impetus to Galileo's condemnation (McMullin, ed. 2005). It has even been argued (Redondi 1983) that the charge of Copernicanism was a compromise plea bargain to avoid the truly heretical charge of atomism. Though this latter hypothesis has not found many willing supporters.

Legitimacy of the content, that is, of the condemnation of Copernicus, is much more problematic. Galileo had addressed this problem in 1615, when he wrote his Letter to Castelli (which becomes known as the Letter to the Grand Duchess Christina). In this letter he had argued that, of course, the Bible was an inspired text, yet two truths could not contradict one another. So in cases where it was known that science had achieved a true result, the Bible ought to be interpreted in such a way that makes it compatible with this truth. The Bible, he argued, was an historical document written for common people at an historical time, and it had to be written in language that would make sense to them and lead them towards the true religion.

Much philosophical controversy, before and after Galileo's time, revolves around this doctrine of the two truths and their seeming incompatibility. Which of course, leads us right to such questions as: “What is truth?” and “How is truth known or shown?”

Cardinal Bellarmine was willing to countenance scientific truth if it could be proven or demonstrated (McMullin 1998). But Bellarmine held that the planetary theories of Ptolemy and Copernicus (and presumably Tycho Brahe) were only hypotheses and due to their mathematical, purely calculatory character were not susceptible to physical proof. This is a sort of instrumentalist, anti-realist position (Duhem 1985, Machamer 1976). There are any number of ways to argue for some sort of instrumentalism. Duhem (1985) himself argued that science is not metaphysics, and so only deals with useful conjectures that enable us to systematize the phenomena. Subtler versions, without an Aquinian metaphysical bias, of this position have been argued subsequently and more fully by van Fraassen (1996) and others. Less sweepingly, it could reasonably be argued that both Ptolemy and Copernicus' theories were primarily mathematical, and that what Galileo was defending was not Copernicus' theory per se, but a physical realization of it. In fact, it might be better to say the Copernican theory that Galileo was constructing was a physical realization of parts of Copernicus' theory, which, by the way, dispensed with all the mathematical trappings (eccentrics, epicycles, Tusi couples and the like). Galileo would be led to such a view by his concern with matter theory. Of course, put this way we are faced with the question of what constitutes identity conditions for a theory, or being the same theory. There is clearly a way in which Galileo's Copernicus is not Copernicus and most certainly not Kepler.

The other aspect of all this which has been hotly debated is: what constitutes proof or demonstration of a scientific claim? In 1616, the same year that Copernicus' book was placed on the Index of Prohibited Books, Galileo was called before Cardinal Robert Bellarmine, head of the Holy Office of the Inquisition and warned not to defend or teach Copernicanism. During this year Galileo also completed a manuscript, On the Ebb and Flow of the Tides. The argument of this manuscript will turn up 17 years later as day Four of Galileo's Dialogues concerning the Two Chief World Systems. This argument, about the tides, Galileo believed provided proof of the truth of the Copernican theory. But insofar as it possibly does, it provides an argument for the physical plausibility of Galileo's Copernican theory. Let's look more closely at his argument.

Galileo argues that the motion of the earth (diurnal and axial) is the only conceivable (or maybe plausible) physical cause for the reciprocal regular motion of the tides. He restricts the possible class of causes to mechanical motions, and so rules out Kepler's attribution of the moon as a cause. How could the moon without any connection to the seas cause the tides to ebb and flow? Such an explanation would be the invocation of magic or occult powers. So the motion of the earth causes the waters in the basins of the seas to slosh back and forth, and since the earth's diurnal and axial rotation is regular, so are the periods of the tides; the backward movement is due to the residual impetus built up in the water during its slosh. Differences in tidal flows are due to the differences in the physical conformations of the basins in which they flow (for background and more detail, see Palmieri 1998).

Albeit mistaken, Galileo's commitment to mechanically intelligible causation makes this is a plausible argument. One can see why Galileo thinks he has some sort of proof for the motion of the earth, and therefore for Copernicanism. Yet one can also see why Bellarmine and the instrumentalists would not be impressed. First, they do not accept Galileo's restriction of possible causes to mechanically intelligible causes. Second, the tidal argument does not directly deal with the annual motion of the earth about the sun. And third, the argument does not touch anything about the central position of the sun or about the periods of the planets as calculated by Copernicus. So at its best, Galileo's argument is an inference to the best partial explanation of one point in Copernicus' theory. Yet when this argument is added to the earlier telescopic observations that show the improbabilities of the older celestial picture, to the fact that Venus has phases like the moon and so must revolve around the sun, to the principle of the relativity of perceived motion which neutralizes the physical motion arguments again a moving earth, it was enough for Galileo to believe that he had the necessary proof to convince the Copernican doubters. Unfortunately, it was not until after Galileo's death and the acceptance of a unified material cosmology, utilizing the presuppositions about matter and motion that were published in the Discourses on the Two New Sciences, that people were ready for such proofs. But this could occur only after Galileo had changed the acceptable parameters for gaining knowledge and theorizing about the world. 

For the the long, tortuous, and fascinating aftermath of the Galileo affair see Finocchiaro 2005, and for John Paul II's attempt see George Coyne's article in McMullin 2005.


Primary Sources: Galileo's Works

The main body of Galileo's work is collected in Le Opere di Galileo Galilei, Edizione Nazionale. 20 vols. Edited by Antonio Favaro. Florence: Barbera, 1890-1909; reprinted 1929-1939 and 1964–1966.

Secondary Sources

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Copernicus, Nicolaus | matter | natural philosophy: in the Renaissance | religion: and science


Thanks to Zvi Biener and Paolo Palmieri for commenting on earlier drafts of this entry.