Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Religion and Science

First published Tue Feb 20, 2007

Modern western empirical science has surely been the most impressive intellectual development since the 16th century. Religion, of course, has been around for much longer, and is presently flourishing, perhaps as never before. (True, there is the thesis of secularism, according to which science and technology, on the one hand, and religion, on the other, are inversely related: as the former waxes, the latter wanes. Recent resurgences of religion and religious belief in many parts of the world, however, cast considerable doubt on this thesis.) The relation between these two great cultural forces has been tumultuous, many-faceted, and confusing. This entry will concentrate on the relation between science and the theistic religions: Christianity, Judaism, Islam and theistic varieties of Hinduism and Buddhism, where theism is the belief that there is an all-powerful, all-knowing perfectly good immaterial person who has created the world, has created human beings ‘in his own image,’ and to whom we owe worship, obedience and allegiance. There are many important issues and questions in this neighborhood; this entry concentrates on just a few. Perhaps the most salient question is whether the relation between religion and science is characterized by conflict or by concord. (Of course it is possible that there be both conflict and concord: conflict along certain dimensions, concord along others.) This question will be the central focus of what follows. Other important issues to be considered are the nature of religion, the nature of science, the epistemologies of science and, in particular, of religious belief, and the question how the latter figures into the (alleged or actual) conflict or concord between religion and science.

1. The Nature of Science and the Nature of Religion

1.1 Science

The first thing to say, here, is that it is exceedingly difficult to characterize these phenomena. First, consider science: what exactly is science? How can we characterize it? What are the necessary and sufficient conditions for a given inquiry or theory or claim to be scientific, a part of science? This is far from easy to say. Many conditions have been proposed as essential to science. According to Jacques Monod, “The cornerstone of the scientific method is the postulate that nature is objective…. In other words, the systematic denial that ‘true’ knowledge can be got by interpreting nature in terms of final causes …” (Monod 1971, 21, Monod's emphasis). In the 1930s, the eminent German Chemist Walther Nernst claimed that science, by definition, requires an infinite universe; hence Big Bang theory, he said, isn't science (von Weizsäcker 1964, 151). Another proposed constraint: science can't involve moral judgments, or value judgments more generally.

Clearly there is an intimate connection between the nature of science and its aim, the conditions under which something is successful science. Some say the aim of science is explanation (whether or not this is put in the service of truth). Some (realists) say the aim of science is to produce true theories; others say the aim of science is to produce empirically adequate theories, whether or not they are true (van Fraassen 1980). Some say science can't deal with the subjective, but only with what is public and sharable (and thus reports of consciousness are a better subject for scientific study than consciousness itself). Some say that science can deal only with what is repeatable; others deny this. In the furor over the teaching of “Intelligent Design” (ID) in public schools, some have said that scientific theories must be falsifiable, and, since the proposition that living things (rabbits, say) have been designed by one or more intelligent designers isn't falsifiable, ID isn't science. Others point out that many eminently scientific claims—for example, there are electrons—aren't falsifiable in isolation: what is falsifiable are whole theories about electrons. And while the proposition living things have been designed by an intelligent being is not falsifiable in isolation, the proposition an intelligent being has designed and created 800 lb. rabbits that live in Cleveland is clearly falsifiable (and false). The first group may reply that this proposition about 800 lb. rabbits is really just equivalent to its empirical implications, i.e., to the proposition that there are 800 lb. rabbits that live in Cleveland, so that the bit about the designer really drops out. The second group may then retort that if so, the same must hold for theories about electrons; but then theories about electrons are really just equivalent to their empirical implications, so that electrons drop out.

Still others claim that science is constrained by ‘methodological naturalism’ (MN)—the idea that neither the data for a scientific investigation nor a scientific theory can properly refer to supernatural beings (God, angels, demons); thus one couldn't properly propose (as part of science) a theory according to which the recent outbreak of weird and irrational behavior in Washington D.C. is to be accounted for in terms of increased demonic behavior in that neighborhood. How do we know that MN really is an essential constraint on science? Some claim that it is simply a matter of definition; thus Nancey Murphy: "… there is what we might call methodological atheism, which is by definition common to all natural science" (Murphy 2001, 464). She continues: "This is simply the principle that scientific explanations are to be in terms of natural (not supernatural) entities and processes". Similarly for Michael Ruse: “The Creationists believe that the world started miraculously. But miracles lie outside of science, which by definition deals only with the natural, the repeatable, that which is governed by law” (Ruse 1982, 322). By definition of what? By definition of the term ‘science’ one supposes. But others then ask: what about the Big Bang: if it turns out to be unrepeatable, must we conclude that it can't be studied scientifically? And consider the claim that science, by definition, deals only with that which is governed by law—natural law, one supposes. Some empiricists (in particular, Bas van Fraassen) argue that there aren't any natural laws (but only regularities): if they are right, would it follow that there is nothing at all for science to study? Still further, while some people argue that MN is an essential constraint on science, others dispute this: but can a serious dispute be settled just by citing a definition?

Giving plausible necessary and sufficient conditions for science, therefore, is far from trivial; and many philosophers of science have given up on the “demarcation problem,” the problem of proposing such conditions (Laudan 1988). Perhaps the best we can do is point to paradigmatic examples of science and paradigmatic examples of non-science. Of course it may be a mistake to suppose that there is just one activity here, and just one aim. The sciences are enormously varied; there is the sort of activity that goes on in highly theoretical branches of physics (for example, investigating what happened during the first 10−43 seconds, or trying to figure out how to subject string theory to empirical check). But there is also the sort of project exemplified by an attempt to learn how the population of touconderos has responded to the decimation of the Amazon jungle over the last 25 years. In the first kind of account it may make sense to think what is desired is an empirically adequate theory, with the question of the truth of the theory at least temporarily bracketed. Not so in cases of the second kind; here nothing but the sober truth will do.

Similarly with methodological naturalism. Some scientific projects are clearly constrained by MN (see below); a condition for theoretical adequacy, for them, will certainly be that the account in question is naturalistic. But is MN just part of the very nature of science as such? According to Isaac Newton, often said to be the greatest scientist of all time, the orbits of the planets would decay into chaos without outside intervention; he therefore proposed that God periodically adjusted their orbits. While that hypothesis is one of which we no longer have need, is it clear that its addition to Newton's account of the motions of the planets resulted in something that wasn't science at all? That seems unduly harsh.

Perhaps we should think of the concept of science as one of those cluster concepts called to our attention by Thomas Aquinas and Ludwig Wittgenstein. Perhaps there are several quite different activities that go under the name ‘science’; these activities are related to each other by similarity and analogy, but there is no one single activity which is just science as such. There are projects for which the criterion of success involves producing true theories; there are others where the criterion of success involves producing theories that are empirically adequate, whether or not they are also true. There are projects constrained by MN; there are other projects that are not so constrained. These projects or activities all fall under the meaning of the term ‘science’; but there is no single activity of which all are examples. (In the same way, chess, basketball and poker are all games; but there is no single game of which they are all versions.) Perhaps the best we can do, with respect to characterizing science, is to say that the term ‘science’ applies to any activity that is (1) a systematic and disciplined enterprise aimed at finding out truth about our world,[1] and (2) has significant empirical involvement. This is of course vague (How systematic? How disciplined? How much empirical involvement?) and perhaps unduly permissive. (Does astrology count as science, even if only bad science?) Still, we do have many excellent examples of science, and excellent examples of non-science.

1.2 Religion

If it is difficult to give an account of the nature of science, it is not much easier to say just what a religion is. Of course there are multifarious examples: Christianity, Islam, Judaism, Hinduism, Buddhism and many others. What characteristics are necessary and sufficient for something's being a religion? How does one distinguish a religion from a way of life, such as Confucianism? That's not easy to say. Not all religions involve belief in something like the almighty and all-knowing, morally perfect God of the theistic religions, or even in any supernatural beings at all. (Of course a substantial majority of them do.) With respect to our present inquiry, what is of special importance is the notion of a religious belief: what does a belief have to be like to be religious?

Once more, that's not easy to say. To cite the furor over intelligent design again, some say the proposition that there is an intelligent designer of the living world is religion, not science. But not just any belief involving an intelligent designer, indeed, not just any belief involving God, is automatically religious. According to the New Testament book of James, “the devils believe [that God exists] and tremble”; the devils' beliefs, presumably, aren't religious.[2] Someone might propose theories about an omnipotent, omniscient and wholly good being as a key part of a metaphysical system: belief in such theories need not be religious. And what about a system of beliefs that answers the same great human questions answered by the clear examples of religion: questions about the fundamental nature of the universe and what is most real and basic in it, about the place of human beings in that universe, about whether there is such a thing as sin or an analogue, and if there is, what there is to be done about it, where we must look to improve the human condition, whether human beings survive their deaths and how a rational person should act? Will any system of beliefs that provides answers to those questions count as a religion? Again, not easy to say; probably not. The truth here, perhaps, is that a belief isn't religious just in itself. The property of being religious isn't intrinsic to a belief; it is rather one a belief acquires when it functions in a certain way in the life of a given person or community. To be a religious belief, the belief in question would have to be appropriately connected with characteristically religious attitudes on the part of the believer, such attitudes as worship, love, commitment, awe, and the like. Consider someone who believes that there is such a person as God, all right, because the existence of God helps with several metaphysical problems (for example, the nature of causation, the nature of propositions, properties and sets, and the nature of proper function in creatures that are not human artifacts). However, this person has no inclination to worship or love God, no commitment to try to further God's projects in our world; perhaps, like the devils, he hates God and intentionally does whatever he can to frustrate God's purposes in the world. For such a person, belief that there is such a person as God need not be a religious belief. In this way it's possible that a pair of people share a given belief which functions as a religious belief in the life of only one of them.

It is therefore extremely difficult to give (informative) necessary and sufficient conditions for either science or religion. Perhaps for present purposes that is not a really serious problem; we do have many excellent examples of each, and perhaps that will suffice for our inquiry.

2. Epistemology and Science and Religion

There are many interesting epistemological questions about science. A central topic has been the under determination of theory by evidence: evidence for a theory seldom entails the theory, in which case there will be several empirically equivalent theories—theories with the same consequences with respect to experience. Can empirically equivalent theories differ in epistemic status or value? If so, what makes the difference? Here it is common to appeal to the so-called theoretical virtues, such as simplicity, fecundity, beauty and the like. What shall we think of the “pessimistic induction” according to which nearly all past scientific theories have been later rejected; should that reduce our confidence in present scientific theories? How much, if any, of current scientific lore constitutes knowledge? And how far does the scientific method reach? Are there subjects science isn't competent to deal with? Is science more competent to deal with some subjects than others? Scientific modes of procedure seem to have been most successful in the hard sciences; the human sciences seem to lag. Are there differences in epistemic well-foundedness between different sciences, or perhaps between the hard sciences and the softer sciences? Questions of this sort, while of great intrinsic interest, aren't directly relevant to our present inquiry. What is most important to see is that the epistemology of science is really the epistemology of the main human cognitive faculties: memory, perception, rational intuition (logic and mathematics), testimony, perhaps Reid's sympathy, induction, and the like. What is characteristic of science is that these faculties are employed in a particularly disciplined and systematic way, and that there is particular emphasis upon perceptual experience.

With respect to religious belief, there are also several sorts of epistemological questions. Are there good arguments for the existence of God? If there aren't, does it matter? Is the existence of evil, in all the horrifying forms it displays, evidence against theistic belief? Does it constitute a defeater for theistic belief? What about the question of pluralism: religion comes in so many kinds—Christianity, Islam, Judaism, Hinduism, Buddhism (with sub versions of each kind), but also a host of less widely practiced varieties. According to Jean Bodin, "each is refuted by all" (Bodin 1975, 256); does this variety constitute a defeater for each particular variety of religious belief? Some religious doctrines—Trinity, Incarnation, Atonement—are not easy to understand; does that mean they cannot be known or even rationally believed? If religious belief is based on faith rather than on reason, does that mean that it is at best seriously insecure, so that talk of a ‘leap of faith’, or ‘blind faith’ is appropriate? These questions have been most fully investigated with respect to Christian belief; hence what follows will concentrate on some questions about the epistemology of Christian belief.

For present purposes, perhaps the main epistemological question is this: what is the source of rationality, or warrant, or positive epistemic status, if any, enjoyed by religious belief? Is it of the same sort as that enjoyed by belief in the teachings of current science? Is the evidence, if any, for religious belief of the same sort as that for scientific beliefs? Or is there some special source of positive epistemic status for religious belief? This is really a contemporary version of a question that goes back a long way: the question about the relation between faith and reason. It is connected with the question whether there are cogent arguments (rational arguments, arguments drawn from the deliverances of reason) for theistic belief, and whether the existence of cogent argument is required for rational acceptance of religious belief.

Here there are fundamentally two views. According to ‘evidentialism’, the source of positive epistemic status for religious belief, if indeed it has such status, is just reason—the ensemble of rational faculties including, preeminently, perception, memory, rational intuition, testimony, and the like. The source of positive epistemic status for religious belief, therefore, is the same as that for scientific belief. This view goes back at least to John Locke (1689) and has prominent contemporary representatives. On this view, the existence of cogent arguments for a religious belief is required for rational acceptance of that belief, or at any rate is intimately related to rational acceptance. Some who endorse this view believe there aren't any such cogent arguments; accordingly they reject religious belief as unfounded and rationally unacceptable (Mackie 1982); others hold that in fact there are excellent arguments for theism and even for specifically Christian belief. Here the most prominent contemporary spokesperson would be Richard Swinburne, whose work over the last 30 years or so has resulted in the most powerful, complete and sophisticated development of natural theology the world has so far seen (see, e.g., Swinburne (1979, 2004), (1981, 2005)).

The other main view, one adopted by, for example, both Thomas Aquinas (Summa Theologiae) and John Calvin (1559), is that belief in God in the first place, and in the distinctive teachings of Christianity in the second, can be rationally accepted even if there are no cogent arguments for them from the deliverances of reason; they have a source of warrant or positive epistemic status independent of the deliverances of reason. This view also has prominent contemporary representation (Alston 1991; Plantinga and Wolterstorff 1984; Plantinga 2000). To use Calvin's terminology, there is the Sensus Divinitatis, which is a source of belief in God, and the Internal Testimony of the Holy Spirit, which is the source of belief in the distinctive doctrines of Christianity. Beliefs produced by these sources go beyond reason in the sense that the source of their warrant is not the deliverances of reason; of course it does not follow that such beliefs are irrational, or contrary to reason; nor does it follow that there is something especially dicey or insecure, or chancy about them, as if faith were necessarily blind or a leap in the dark. Indeed, John Calvin defines faith as “a firm and certain knowledge of God's benevolence towards us, … .” (Calvin, 1559, p. 551 (emphasis added)). On this view, religion and faith have a source of properly rational belief independent of reason and science; it would therefore be possible for religion and faith to correct as well as be corrected by science and reason.

There is some reason to think that if theism is indeed true, if indeed there is an all-powerful, all-knowing perfectly good person who has created the world and created human beings in his image, then religious belief would be independent of arguments from reason; it would not require such argument for rationality or positive epistemic status. For if theism is true, God would presumably want human beings to know of his presence (and in fact the vast majority of the human population believe in God or something very much like him); he would therefore arrange for human beings to be able to come to knowledge of him. But if knowledge of God depended on the theistic arguments, or other arguments from the deliverances of reason, then, as Aquinas says, only a few human beings would ever come to a knowledge of this truth, and they only after a long time, and with a substantial admixture of error.

3. Conflict and Concord

3.1 Concord

Let's begin with concord. The early pioneers and heroes of modern Western science—Copernicus, Galileo, Kepler, Newton, Boyle, and so on—were all serious Christians, if occasionally, as with Newton, Christologically unorthodox. Furthermore, many (Foster 1934, 1935, 1936; Ratzsch forthcoming) have pointed out that theistic belief and empirical science display a deep concord, fit together neatly. This is in part a result of the doctrines of creation embraced by theistic religions—in particular two aspects of those doctrines. First, there is the thought that God has created the world, and has of course therefore also created human beings. Furthermore, he has created human beings in his own image. Now God, according to theistic belief, is a person: a being who has knowledge, affection (likes and dislikes), and executive will, and who can act on his beliefs in order to achieve his ends. One of the chief features of the divine image in human beings, then, is the ability to form beliefs and to acquire knowledge. As Thomas Aquinas puts it, “Since human beings are said to be in the image of God in virtue of their having a nature that includes an intellect, such a nature is most in the image of God in virtue of being most able to imitate God” (ST Ia q. 93 a. 4). God has therefore created both us and the world, and arranged for the former to know the latter. Thinking of science at the most basic level as the project of acquiring knowledge of ourselves and our world, it is clear, from this perspective, that the doctrine of imago dei underwrites this project. Indeed, the pursuit of science is a clear example of the development and enhancement of the image of God in human beings, both individually and collectively.

Second, there is the thought that divine creation is contingent. According to theism, many of God's properties—his omniscience and omnipotence, his goodness and love—are essential to him: he has them in every possible world in which he exists. (And since, according to most theistic thought, he is a necessary being, one that exists in every possible world, he has those properties in every possible world.) Not so, however, with his property of creating. He isn't obliged, by his nature or anything else, to create the world; it is rather a free action on his part. Furthermore, given that he does create, he isn't obliged to do so in any particular way, or to create any particular kinds of things; that he has created the kinds of things we actually find is again contingent, a free action on his part.

It is this doctrine of the contingency of divine creation that underwrites the empirical character of modern Western science (Ratzsch, forthcoming). For the realm of the necessary is (for the most part) the realm of a priori knowledge; here we have mathematics and logic and much philosophy.[3] What is contingent, on the other hand, is the domain or realm of a posteriori knowledge,[4] the sort of knowledge produced by perception, memory, and the empirical methods of science. This relationship between the contingency of creation and the importance of the empirical was recognized very early. Thus Roger Cotes, from the preface he wrote to Newton's Principia Mathematica:

Without all doubt this world, so diversified with that variety of forms and motions we find in it, could arise from nothing but the perfect free will of God directing and presiding over it.
From this fountain it is that those laws, which we call the laws of Nature, have flowed, in which there appear many traces of the most wise contrivance, but not the least shadow of necessity. These therefore we must not seek from uncertain conjectures, but learn them from observations and experiments (Cotes 1953, 132–33) [emphasis added].

What we've just seen is that in a certain way theistic belief supports modern science by licensing or endorsing the whole project of empirical investigation; it is also sometimes claimed that science supports theistic belief. Here there are several arguments, arguments that have historically fallen into two basic types: biological and cosmological. An example of the first type is the argument proposed by Michael Behe (Behe, 1996), according to which some structures at the molecular level exhibit “irreducible complexity.” These systems display several finely matched interacting parts all of which must be present and working properly in order for the system to do what it does; the removal of any part would preclude the thing's functioning. Among the phenomena Behe cites are the bacterial flagellum, the cilia employed by several kinds of cells for locomotion and other functions, blood clotting, the immune system, the transport of materials within cells, and the incredibly complex cascade of biochemical reactions and events that occur in vision. Such irreducibly complex structures and phenomena, he argues, can't have come to be by gradual, step-by-step Darwinian evolution (unguided by the hand of God or any other person); at any rate the probability that they should do so is vanishingly small. They therefore present what he calls a Lilliputian challenge to unguided Darwinism; if he is right, they present it with a Gargantuan challenge as well. Not only do they challenge Darwinism; they are also, he says, obviously designed: their design is about as obvious as an elephant in a living room: “to a person who does not feel obliged to restrict his search to unintelligent causes, the straightforward conclusion is that many biochemical systems were designed” (Behe, p. 193). Others, for example Paul Draper (2002) and Kenneth R. Miller (1999, 130–64), argue that Behe has not proved his case.

A second type of argument for theism starts from the apparent fine-tuning of several of the physical parameters. Starting in the late sixties and early seventies, astrophysicists and others noted that several of the basic physical constants must fall within very narrow limits if there is to be the development of intelligent life—at any rate in a way anything like the way in which we think it actually happened. Thus B. J. Carr and M. J. Rees:

The basic features of galaxies, stars, planets and the everyday world are essentially determined by a few microphysical constants and by the effects of gravitation… . several aspects of our Universe—some of which seem to be prerequisites for the evolution of any form of life—depend rather delicately on apparent ‘coincidences’ among the physical constants (Carr and Rees, 1979, 605).

For example, if the force of gravity were even slightly stronger, all stars would be blue giants; if even slightly weaker, all would be red dwarfs; in neither case could life have developed (Carter 1979, 72). The same goes for the weak and strong nuclear forces; if either had been even slightly different, life, at any rate life of the sort we have, could probably not have developed.

Apparently life is possible only because the universe is expanding at just the rate required to avoid recollapse. At an earlier time, the fine-tuning had to be even more remarkable:

… we know that there has to have been a very close balance between the competing effect of explosive expansion and gravitational contraction which, at the very earliest epoch about which we can even pretend to speak (called the Planck time, 10–43 sec. after the big bang), would have corresponded to the incredible degree of accuracy represented by a deviation in their ratio from unity by only one part in 10 to the sixtieth (Polkinghorne 1989, 22).

Other examples: the value of cosmological constant, of the vacuum expectation value of the Higgs field, and the ratio of the mass of the proton to the electron must all be fine-tuned to an incredible degree for the universe to be life-permitting (Barr 2003, 123-130). A particularly informed and technically detailed account of some of these fine-tunings is to be found in Robin Collins's “Evidence for Fine-Tuning” (Collins 2003). Many see these apparent enormous coincidences as substantiating the theistic claim that the universe has been created by a personal God who intends that there be life and indeed intelligent life; they take fine-tuning as offering the material for a properly restrained theistic argument. These arguments take several versions; perhaps the most successful versions argue that the epistemic probability of these fine-tuning phenomena on theism is much greater than their epistemic probability on the atheistic chance hypothesis. Here the conclusion is not (as such) that probably theism is true, but rather that theism is much better supported by these phenomena than the chance hypothesis is (Swinburne 2003; Collins 1999).

Objections come in many varieties. Some who offer these arguments, in particular those associated with the so-called ‘Intelligent Design’ movement, take them to be contributions to science rather than philosophy or theology; the most common objection is that they don't meet the conditions for being science, in particular because their conclusion, that the universe has been designed by an intelligent being, isn't falsifiable. Others (as we saw above) reply that falsifiability is ordinarily not a property of individual propositions, but of entire theories, and that theories involving intelligent design can perfectly well be falsifiable.

A more interesting objection to fine-tuning arguments is the “many universe” suggestion: perhaps there are very many, even infinitely many different universes or worlds; the cosmological constants take on different values in different worlds, so that very many (perhaps all possible) different sets of such values get exemplified in one world or another. Couldn't there be an eternal cycle of ‘big bangs’, with subsequent expansion to a certain limit and then subsequent contraction to a ‘big crunch’ at which the cosmological values are arbitrarily reset? (Dennett 1995, 179) Alternatively, couldn't it have been that at the Big Bang, there was enormous initial inflation, resulting in many cosmoi with many different settings for the physical constants? In either case it isn't at all surprising that in one or another of the resulting universes, the values of the cosmological constants are such as to be life-permitting. Nor is it at all surprising that the universe in which we find ourselves has life-permitting values; we couldn't exist elsewhere. If so, then the fine-tuning argument is ineffective: the probability of fine-tuning on the many worlds suggestion together with atheism is at least as large as the probability of fine-tuning on theism. There are responses (for example, that on this account there would have to be a universe generator which was itself fine-tuned (Collins 1999), or that even if it is likely that some universe be fine-tuned, nevertheless the likelihood that this universe be fine-tuned is unaffected by the pluriverse suggestion (White 2003)) and responses to the responses, and so on; not surprisingly, there is no consensus as to whether these fine-tuning arguments are successful.

3.2 Conflict?

The Christian doctrine of creation supports a deep concord between Christian belief and science; yet it is of course compatible with this sort of concord that there also be conflict. Many have claimed that there is conflict, indeed warfare, between religion and science (Draper 1875) (White 1895). This is certainly too strong; but obviously the relation between the two has not always been smooth and irenic. There is the famous Galileo incident, often portrayed as a contest between the Catholic hierarchy, representing the forces of repression and tradition, the voice of the old world, the dead hand of the past, and, on the other hand, the forces of progress and the dulcet voice of reason and science. This way of looking at the matter is simplistic (Brooke 1991, 8–9); much more was involved. The dominant Aristotelian thought of the day was heavily a prioristic; hence part of what was involved was a dispute about the relative importance of observation and a priori thought in astronomy. Also involved were questions about what the Christian (and Jewish) Bible teaches in this area: does a passage like Joshua 10:12–15 (in which Joshua commanded the sun to stand still) favor the Ptolemaic system over the Copernican? And of course the usual questions of power and authority were also present.[5]

More recently, a central locus of alleged conflict has been the theory of evolution. This particular flap is of course still very much with us. Many Christian fundamentalists accept a literal interpretation of the creation account in the first two chapters of Genesis; they therefore find incompatibility between the contemporary Darwinian evolutionary accounts of our origins and the Christian faith, at least as they understand it. Many Darwinian fundamentalists (as the late Stephen J. Gould called them) second that motion: they too claim there is conflict between Darwinian evolution and classical Christian or theistic belief. Contemporaries who champion this conflict view would include, for example, Richard Dawkins (1986, 2003), and Daniel Dennett (1995). An important part of the alleged conflict turns on the Christian belief that human beings and other creatures have been designed—designed by God; according to evolution, however, (so say Dawkins and Dennett), human beings have not been designed, but are a product of the unguided blind process of natural selection operating on some such source of genetic variation as random genetic mutation. Thus Dawkins:

All appearances to the contrary, the only watchmaker in nature is the blind forces of physics, albeit deployed in a very special way. A true watchmaker has foresight: he designs his cogs and springs, and plans their interconnections, with a future purpose in his mind's eye. Natural selection, the blind, unconscious automatic process which Darwin discovered, and which we now know is the explanation for the existence and apparently purposeful form of all life, has no purpose in mind. It has no mind and no mind's eye. It does not plan for the future. It has no vision, no foresight, no sight at all. If it can be said to play the role of watchmaker in nature, it is the blind watchmaker. (Dawkins 1986, 5)

Others point out that this proposed conflict is far from obvious. The central feature of the modern doctrine of evolution is that the main driving force of the process is natural selection, winnowing some form of genetic variation, the most popular version being random genetic mutation. It is no part of the theory to say that these mutations occur just by chance in a sense of that term that implies that they are uncaused; they are random only in the sense that they do not arise from the design plan of the creatures to which they accrue, and do not occur because they enhance the organism's reproductive fitness. Thus Ernst Mayr, the dean of post-World War II biology: “When it is said that mutation or variation is random, the statement simply means that there is no correlation between the production of new genotypes and the adaptational needs of an organism in the given environment” (Mayr 1998, 98). If so, evolution, as currently stated and currently understood, is perfectly compatible with God's orchestrating and overseeing the whole process; indeed, it is perfectly compatible with that theory that God causes the random genetic mutations that are winnowed by natural selection. Those who claim that evolution shows that humankind and other living things have not been designed, so say their opponents, confuse a naturalistic gloss on the scientific theory with the theory itself. The claim that evolution demonstrates that human beings and other living creatures have not, contrary to appearances, been designed, is not part of or a consequence of the scientific theory, but a metaphysical or theological add-on (van Inwagen 2003).[6]

A second area of alleged conflict has to do with divine action in the world. According to classical theistic religion, God has created the world; he also upholds and conserves it, preserves it in being. Apart from his conserving activity, the world would disappear like a candle flame in a high wind. So there is creation and conservation; but, so say the classical theistic religions, there is also special divine action, action going beyond creation and conservation. There are the miracles reported in both the Jewish and Christian Bibles: the parting of the Red Sea, for example, as well as Jesus's walking on water, feeding the 5,000, and rising from the dead. Miracles are also reported in the Koran. Many believers don't think of these special divine actions as restricted to Bible times: God still, at present, responds to prayers and accomplishes miraculous healings. Further, according to Christian ways of thought, God works in the hearts and minds of his children in such a way as to produce faith; Thomas Aquinas called this divine activity ‘the internal instigation of the Holy Spirit’ and John Calvin called it ‘the internal witness (or testimony) of the Holy Spirit.’ All of these would be examples of special divine action.

Now many see here conflict with modern science. Among them are a large number of theologians; thus according to Langdon Gilkey,

… contemporary theology does not expect, nor does it speak of, wondrous divine events on the surface of natural and historical life. The causal nexus in space and time which the Enlightenment science and philosophy introduced into the Western mind … is also assumed by modern theologians and scholars; since they participate in the modern world of science both intellectually and existentially, they can scarcely do anything else. Now this assumption of a causal order among phenomenal events, and therefore of the authority of the scientific interpretation of observable events, makes a great difference to the validity one assigns to biblical narratives and so to the way one understands their meaning. Suddenly a vast panoply of divine deeds and events recorded in scripture are no longer regarded as having actually happened… Whatever the Hebrews believed, we believe that the biblical people lived in the same causal continuum of space and time in which we live, and so one in which no divine wonders transpired and no divine voices were heard. (Gilkey 1983,31)

Of course many philosophers and scientists would agree. The problem is alleged to be with God's special action in the world; there is no particular problem with creation and conservation, but divine action going beyond that is widely thought to be incompatible with modern science. Where exactly is this incompatibility thought to arise? The thought seems to be that special divine activity would be incompatible with the laws of nature as disclosed by science. Thus the distinguished biologist H. Allen Orr:

It is not that some sects of one religion invoke miracles but that many sects of many religions do. (Moses, after all, parted the waters and Krishna healed the sick.) I agree of course that no sensible scientists can tolerate such exceptionalism with respect to the laws of nature (Orr, 2004).

Now Gilkey and the others are apparently thinking in terms of a Newtonian world-picture, according to which the universe is like a great machine proceeding according to the laws disclosed in science. This isn't sufficient for the hands-off, anti-interventionist theology of these theologians. After all, Newton himself, one hopes, accepted the Newtonian world-picture, and Newton proposed that God periodically adjusted the planetary orbits, which according to his calculations would otherwise gradually go awry. What Gilkey and his friends add, here, apparently, is determinism: the thought that the laws of nature together with the state of the universe at any time, entail the state of the universe at any other time. Here the classical source is Pierre Laplace:

We ought then to regard the present state of the universe as the effect of its previous state and as the cause of the one which is to follow. Given for one instant a mind which could comprehend all the forces by which nature is animated and the respective situation of the beings that compose it—a mind sufficiently vast to subject these data to analysis—it would embrace in the same formula the movements of the greatest bodies of the universe and those of the lightest atom; for it, nothing would be uncertain and the future, as the past, would be present to its eyes. (Laplace 1796)

It is the Laplacian world-picture that apparently animates Gilkey, et al. It is worth noting, however, that determinism and the Laplacian world-picture don't follow from classical science. That is because the great conservation laws deduced from Newton's Laws are stated for closed or isolated systems. Thus Sears and Zemansky (1963):

The principle of conservation of energy states that the internal energy of an isolated system remains constant. This is the most general statement of the principle of conservation of energy. (p. 415)

Newton's laws (as well as Maxwell's later physics of electricity and magnetism) apply to isolated or closed systems; they describe how the world works provided that the world is a closed (isolated) system, subject to no outside causal influence. But it is no part of Newtonian mechanics or classical science generally to declare that the material universe is indeed a closed system. (How could a thing like that be experimentally verified?) Hence there is nothing in classical science (at least in this area) incompatible with God's changing the velocity or direction of a particle, or a whole system of particles (or, for that matter, creating ex nihilo a full-grown horse). Energy, momentum and the like are conserved in a closed system; but the claim that the material universe is in fact a closed system is not part of classical physics; it is another metaphysical or theological add-on. So here there is no conflict between classical physics and special divine action in the world.

This classical, Laplacian picture has of course been superseded by the development of quantum mechanics, beginning in the first couple of decades of the 20th century. According to quantum mechanics, associated with any physical system, a system of particles, for example, there is a wave function whose evolution through time is governed by the Schrödinger equation for that system. Now the interesting thing about quantum mechanics is that, unlike classical mechanics, it doesn't specify or predict a single configuration for this system of particles at a future time t. The wave function assigns a value at t to each of the configurations possibly resulting from the initial conditions; by applying Born's Rule to those values we get an assignment of probabilities to each of those possible configurations at t. Accordingly, we aren't told which configuration will in fact result (given the initial conditions) when the system is measured at t; instead we are given a distribution of probabilities for the many possible outcomes. Clearly miracles (parting the waters, rising from the dead, etc.) are not incompatible with these assignments. (No doubt such events would be assigned very low probabilities; but of course we don't need quantum mechanics to know that such events are improbable.) Further, on collapse interpretations such as those of Ghirardi, Rimini, and Weber, there is plenty of room for divine activity. Indeed, God could actually be the cause of the collapses, and of the way in which they occur (i.e., where P is the possibility that gets actualized at t, it could be that God causes P to be actualized then). (This could perhaps be seen as a halfway house between occasionalism and secondary causation.) With the advent of quantum mechanics, therefore, there seems to be even less reason to see special divine action in the world as somehow incompatible with science.

Nevertheless, many who are entirely aware of the quantum mechanical revolution still find a problem with special divine action. For example, there is the “Divine Action Project” (Wildman 1988–2003, 31–75), a 15-year series of conferences and publications that began in 1988. So far these conferences have resulted in some 6 books of essays involving at least 50 or more authors from various fields of science together with philosophers and theologians, including many of the most prominent writers in the field. Most of these authors find a problem with special divine action. That is because they believe that a satisfactory account of God's action in the world would have to be noninterventionist, as Wildman says. Thus Arthur Peacocke, commenting on a certain proposal for divine action:

God would have to be conceived of as actually manipulating micro-events (at the atomic, molecular, and according to some, quantum levels) in these initiating fluctuations on the natural world in order to produce the results at the macroscopic level which God wills. But such a conception of God's action … would then be no different in principle from that of God intervening in the order of nature with all the problems that that evokes for a rationally coherent belief in God as the creator of that order. (Peacocke 2004)

Apparently, then, the project is to develop a conception of special divine action (action beyond creation and conservation) that doesn't involve intervention. But what would intervention be in the quantum mechanical picture? That's not easy to say. Indeed, it's not easy to see how intervention could be distinct from divine action beyond creation and conservation. If they aren't distinct, however, special divine action would just be intervention, in which case the project of developing a conception of special divine action that doesn't involve intervention is unhopeful.

Still a third area of alleged conflict between religious belief and science has to do with the different epistemic attitudes associated with each. Thus, for example, John Worrall:

Science, or rather a scientific attitude, is incompatible with religious belief. Science and religion are in irreconcilable conflict … There is no way in which you can be both properly scientifically minded and a true religious believer (Worrall 2004, p. 60).

In science, the dominant epistemic attitude (so the claim goes) is one of critical empirical investigation, issuing in theories which are held tentatively and provisionally; one is always prepared to give up a theory in favor of a more satisfactory successor. In religious (e.g., Christian) belief, the epistemic attitude of faith plays an important role, an attitude which differs both in the source of the belief in question, and in the readiness to give it up.

Others (Ratzsch, 2004), however, point out that there isn't obviously a conflict here. Clearly those two attitudes are indeed different, and perhaps they can't be taken simultaneously with respect to the same proposition. Does that show a conflict between science and religious belief? Perhaps some ways of forming belief are appropriate in one area and others in other areas. To get a conflict, we must add that the scientific epistemic attitude is the only one appropriate to any area of cognitive endeavor. That claim, however, is not itself part of the scientific attitude; it is an epistemological declaration for which substantial argument is required (but not so far in evidence). Furthermore, scientists themselves don't seem to take the scientific epistemic attitude (as characterized above) to all of what they believe, or even all of what they believe as scientists. Thus it is common for scientists to believe that there has been a past, and indeed they sometimes tell us how long ago the earth, or our galaxy, or even the entire universe, was formed. Scientists seldom hold this belief—that there has been a past—as a result of empirical investigation; nor do they ordinarily hold it in that tentative, critical way, always looking for a better alternative.

In these areas, therefore, it is hard to find conflict between theistic religious belief and contemporary science.

4. Where there is conflict?

Other areas of science, however, do appear to produce conflict. First, there is the relatively new but rapidly growing discipline of evolutionary psychology. The heart and soul of this project is the effort to explain distinctive human traits—our art, humor, play, love, poetry, sense of adventure, love of stories, our music, our morality, and our religion—the heart and soul of this project is to explain all of these traits in terms of our evolutionary origin and history. And here we do find theories incompatible with religious belief. One important topic in this area has been altruistic behavior—behavior that promotes the reproductive fitness of someone else at the expense of the altruist's own reproductive fitness. How is it that there are people like missionaries and Mother Teresa, people who devote their entire lives to the service of others, paying little attention to their own reproductive prospects? Herbert Simon attempts to explain altruism from an evolutionary perspective in terms of two mechanisms, docility and limited rationality:

Docile persons tend to learn and believe what they perceive others in the society want them to learn and believe. Thus the content of what is learned will not be fully screened for its contribution to personal fitness.

Because of bounded rationality, the docile individual will often be unable to distinguish socially prescribed behavior that contributes to fitness from altruistic behavior [i.e., socially prescribed behavior that does not contribute to fitness]. In fact, docility will reduce the inclination to evaluate independently the contributions of behavior to fitness. … . By virtue of bounded rationality, the docile person cannot acquire the personally advantageous learning that provides the increment, d, of fitness without acquiring also the altruistic behaviors that cost the decrement (Simon 1990, 3, 4).

Simon's theory is carefully worked out, well developed, and of considerable interest; it is also incompatible with theistic religious belief. According to his theory, the explanation of the altruist's behavior is failure to see that the behavior in question compromises evolutionary fitness. Hence, according to Simon's theory, the answer to the question ‘Why did Mother Teresa behave in such a way as to compromise her evolutionary fitness?’ is ‘Due to bounded rationality, she was unable to see that her mode of behavior would compromise her fitness.’ From a Christian perspective, that's not at all the right answer, which would rather be something like ‘She wanted to follow the example of Jesus and do what she could do to help the poor and sick.’

Another example from this area is provided by the many theories of religion and religious belief. According to some of these theories, religious belief is false but adaptive; according to others it is false and maladaptive. An example of the first group would be the theory proposed by David Sloan Wilson, who says that religion is a group adaptation: "Many features of religion, such as the nature of supernatural agents and their relationships with humans can be explained as adaptations designed to enable human groups to function as adaptive units" (Wilson 2002, p. 51). Religious belief, he says, is fictitious, but adaptive at the group level: it promotes cooperation, mutual respect, and solidarity, thus enabling the group to do well in competition with other groups.

That religious belief can function as a group adaptation is of course consistent with theistic belief; what about the bit about religious belief's—theistic belief, for example—being fictitious? How could the claim that there is no such person as God be part of empirical science? And even if it could be, Wilson's theory, one thinks, would be on more solid ground if that easily detachable theological add-on were detached. What is not so easily detachable is the claim that religious belief (unlike memory, perceptual beliefs, rational intuition) is produced by cognitive faculties or processes that are not aimed at the production of true belief. According to Wilson, these processes or faculties have a function conferred on them by evolution; but it is not that of producing true beliefs. It is rather the function of producing beliefs that promote cooperation and solidarity; ultimately their function is to produce beliefs that are adaptive, i.e., promote reproductive fitness.

Here a comparison with Sigmund Freud's views of theistic belief may be illuminating. Freud claims that theistic belief is illusion. This doesn't mean that theistic belief is false (although Freud thinks it is false); what it means is that theistic belief is produced by a cognitive process (wishful thinking) that is not ‘reality oriented’; its purpose is not the production of true belief, but (in this case) a belief that enables the believer to avoid the depression and apathy that would set in if she saw clearly the miserably appalling condition in which we human beings actually find ourselves. Wilson's view is like Freud's, then, in that he too proposes that theistic belief is produced by cognitive faculties that are not reality oriented. Whereas Freud takes a dim view of theistic belief, Wilson is much more appreciative:

In the first place, much religious belief is not detached from reality …. Rather, it is intimately connected to reality by motivating behaviors that are adaptive in the real world—an awesome achievement when we appreciate the complexity that is required to become connected in this practical sense. … Adaptation is the gold standard against which rationality must be judged, along with all other forms of thought. Evolutionary biologists should be especially quick to grasp this point because they appreciate that the well-adapted mind is ultimately an organ of survival and reproduction (Wilson 2002, p. 228).

Although Wilson has kind words for religion, his claim that religious belief is not aimed at the truth is incompatible with theistic religious belief. According to Christianity, for example, faith, including belief in the essentials of the Christian faith, is a divine gift; and the process producing it in the believer (the internal instigation of the Holy Spirit, according to Thomas Aquinas, the internal witness or testimony of the Holy Spirit, according to John Calvin) is indeed aimed at the truth and has as its function the production of true belief.

So here there is conflict between science and religion. What accounts for this conflict? Several things, no doubt; but part of the explanation is to be found in methodological naturalism, a widely accepted constraint on science. According to methodological naturalism (MN), in doing science one must proceed “as if God is not given”, to use the words of Hugo Grotius. Exactly what does that mean? There are various suggestions; here is one. According to MN, (1) the data set (data model) for a proper scientific theory can't refer to God or other supernatural agents (angels, demons), or employ what one knows or thinks one knows by way of (divine) revelation. Thus the data for a theory wouldn't include, for example, the proposition that there has recently been an outbreak of demon possession in Washington, D. C. (2) A proper scientific theory can't refer to God or any other supernatural agents, or employ what one knows or thinks one knows by way of revelation. So if the data model contained the proposition that there has been an outbreak of weird and irrational behavior in Washington, one couldn't properly propose a theory involving demon possession to explain it. (3) Note first that the probability or plausibility of theory candidates and their capacity to explain the data, as well as their empirical implications, is always relative to an array of background information or an epistemic base. The third constraint, then, is that the epistemic base of a proper scientific theory can't include propositions obviously entailing[7] the existence of God or other supernatural agents, or propositions one knows or thinks one knows by way of revelation. So consider someone who in fact accepts the main lines of one of the theistic religions, and works in the area of evolutionary psychology. No doubt she will honor MN as a constraint on her scientific activity. If so, for scientific purposes she will eliminate from her evidence base propositions obviously entailing the existence of God or other supernatural beings, as well as what she knows or thinks she knows by way of faith or revelation. But then she might very well come up with theories of the kind we've been pointing to, theories incompatible with theistic religion.

A rather different area with the same dialectic: historical biblical criticism (HBC). HBC is to be contrasted with traditional biblical commentary. The practitioner of the latter assumes that the bible is the word of God, and tries to lay bare the meaning of what is taught in various parts of the bible. The practitioner of HBC, on the other hand, specifically brackets the belief that the bible is divine revelation, and intends instead to study it scientifically. Thus the late Raymond Brown, a highly respected Catholic scripture scholar, believes that HBC is "scientific biblical criticism" (Brown 1973, p. 6); it yields "factual results" (p. 9); he intends his own contributions to be "scientifically respectable" (p. 11): and practitioners of HBC investigate the scriptures with "scientific exactitude" (pp. 18–19); see also Meier 1991, p. 6. To study the bible scientifically, therefore, is to study it in a way constrained by MN. (See also Sanders 1985, p. 5; Levenson 1993, p. 109; and Lindars 1986, p. 91).

Naturally enough, there has been considerable tension between HBC, so construed, and traditional Christians, going back as least as far as David Strauss in 1835: "Nay, if we would be candid with ourselves, that which was once sacred history for the Christian believer is, for the enlightened portion of our contemporaries, only fable." As for contemporary tensions, according to Luke Timothy Johnson:

The Historical Jesus researchers insist that the ‘real Jesus’ must be found in the facts of his life before his death. The resurrection is, when considered at all, seen in terms of visionary experience, or as a continuation of an ‘empowerment’ that began before Jesus's death. Whether made explicit or not, the operative premise is that there is no ‘real Jesus’ after his death (Johnson 1997, p. 144).

And according to Van Harvey “So far as the biblical historian is concerned, … there is scarcely a popularly held traditional belief about Jesus that is not regarded with considerable skepticism” (Harvey 1986, p. 193)

An absolutely central characteristic of HBC is this effort to be scientific. Of course we might ask whether HBC, or any historical study, is really science; its advocates say that it is, but are they right? In view of the difficulty of the demarcation problem however, it is probably unwise to transform this question into an objection. (Further, even if historical studies of this kind are not precisely science, they are certainly very much like science.) And insofar as HBC requires conformity to MN, one who practices it brackets or suspends or sets aside any theological views, or what is known by revelation.[8] Just as with evolutionary psychology, therefore, one who works at HBC might in fact accept theistic religion of one sort or another, but in his work as a practitioner of HBC, come to conclusions incompatible with his religious belief. So far, therefore, there is the same dialectic here as with evolutionary psychology: theories incompatible with theistic religion arising (at least in part) out of MN.

In at least these two areas, therefore, there is conflict between scientific theories and religious belief. In a certain very important respect, however, this conflict is superficial. That is because the theories and claims of evolutionary psychology and HBC need not constitute defeaters, even partial defeaters,[9] for those elements of religious belief with which they are incompatible—even though theism is committed to taking science with great seriousness and even if it is conceded that the theories in question constitute good science. And that is precisely because MN is taken as constraining scientific activity. We can see this as follows. As already suggested, scientific investigation or inquiry is always conducted against the background of an evidence base, a body of background knowledge or belief. An important part of MN, furthermore, is that this evidence base must not contain propositions obviously entailing the existence of supernatural beings, or propositions that are accepted by way of faith. It follows that the evidence base of an adherent of a theistic religion will contain the scientific evidence base as a proper part; it will include all the propositions to be found in the scientific evidence base, plus more—perhaps those specific to Christian belief. Now suppose a given theory—Simon's theory on altruism, or Wilson's on religion, or some minimalist account of Jesus's life and activity—is in fact proper science, and is indeed the most plausible, scientifically most satisfactory theoretical response to the evidence, given EBS, the scientific evidence base. This means that from the point of view of EBS together with current evidence, that theory is the scientifically best or most plausible result. Still, that doesn't automatically give a believer a defeater for those of her beliefs with which the theory are incompatible. That is because EBS is only part of her evidence base. And it can easily happen that a proposition P is the plausible response, given a part of my evidence base (together with the current evidence), that P is incompatible with one of my beliefs, and that P fails to provide me with a defeater for that belief.

For example, suppose I tell you that I saw you at the mall yesterday afternoon. Then with respect to part of your total evidence base—a part that includes your knowledge that I told you I saw you there, together with your knowledge that I have decent vision and am ordinarily reliable, and the like—the right thing to think is that you were at the mall. Nevertheless, we may suppose, you know perfectly well that you weren't there; you remember that you were home all afternoon thinking about methodological naturalism. Here the right thing to think from the perspective of a proper part of your evidence base is that you were at the mall; but this does not give you a defeater for your belief that you were not there. Another example: we can imagine a renegade group of whimsical physicists proposing to reconstruct physics, refusing to use memory beliefs, or if that is too fantastic, memories of anything more than 1 minute ago. Perhaps something could be done along these lines, but it would be a poor, paltry, truncated, trifling thing. And now suppose that the best theory, from this limited evidence base, is inconsistent with general relativity. Should that give pause to the more traditional physicists who employ what they know by way of memory as well as what the renegade physicists use? I should think not. This truncated physics could hardly call into question physics of the fuller variety, and the fact that from a proper part of the scientific evidence base, something inconsistent with general relativity is the best theory—that fact would hardly give more traditional physicists a defeater for general relativity.

Similarly for the case under question. The traditional Christian thinks she knows by faith that Jesus was divine and that he rose from the dead. But then she need not be moved by the fact that these propositions are not especially probable on the evidence base to which HBC limits itself—i.e., one constrained by MN and therefore one that deletes any knowledge or belief dependent upon faith. The findings of HBC, if findings they are, need not give her a defeater for those of her beliefs with which they are incompatible. The point is not that HBC, evolutionary psychology and other scientific theorizing couldn't in principle produce defeaters for Christian belief;[10] the point is only that its coming up with theories incompatible with Christian belief doesn't automatically produce such a defeater. Everything depends on the particular evidence adduced in the case in question, and the bearing of that evidence given the believer's total evidence base. In the case in question, for example, it may be that given EBS and the relevant data base, it is unlikely that Jesus arose from the dead. But given an evidence base including not only EBS but also belief in God together with the specifically Christian beliefs that Jesus is the second person of the trinity incarnate, and that the New Testament is a reliable source of information on these matters—given these things, the proposition that he rose from the dead may not be at all improbable. Similar considerations would hold, of course, for the other theistic religions and proposed scientific defeaters.

Someone might complain that this looks like a recipe for intellectual irresponsibility, for hanging on to beliefs in the teeth of the evidence. Can't a believer always say something like this, no matter what proposed defeater presents itself? “Perhaps B (the proposed defeatee) is improbable or unlikely with respect to part of what I believe,” she says, “but it is certainly not improbable with respect to the totality of what I believe, that totality including, of course, B itself.” Obviously that can't be right; if it were, every putative defeater could be turned aside in this way and defeat would be impossible. But defeat is not impossible; it sometimes happens that one does acquire a defeater for a belief B, by learning that B is improbable with respect to some proper subset of one's evidence base. According to the book of Isaiah (41:9), God says “I took you from the ends of the earth, from its farthest corners I called you. I said, ‘You are my servant’; I have chosen you and have not rejected you.” Someone might believe R, the proposition that the earth is a rectangular solid with ends and corners, on the basis of this text; she will have a defeater for this belief when confronted with the scientific evidence—photographs of the earth from space, for example—against it. At any rate she will have a defeater for R if the rest of her noetic structure is at all like ours. The same goes for someone who holds pre-Copernican beliefs on the basis of such a text as “The earth stands fast; it shall not be moved” (Psalm 104:5). Why is there a defeater in some cases, but not in others? What makes the difference?

Here is a suggestion. Consider some religious belief B incompatible with a deliverance of some current scientific theory: B might be, for example, the belief that Mother Teresa was perfectly rational in behaving in that altruistic fashion. Let the scientific theory in question be Herbert Simon's account of altruism, and let EBS be the believer's evidence base. Our question is whether A, the belief that Simon's theory is proper science (and that it entails the denial of B), is a defeater for B. Add A to S's evidence base; and now the right question, perhaps, is this: is B epistemically improbable or unlikely with respect to the conjunction of A with EBS? Of course B itself might initially be a member of EBS, in which case it will certainly not be improbable with respect to it. If that were sufficient for A's not being a defeater of B, however, no member of the evidence base could ever be defeated by a new discovery; and that can't be right. So let's delete B from EBS. Call the result of deleting B from S's evidence base ‘EBS reduced with respect to B’ — ‘EBSB’ for short.[11] And now the suggestion — call it ‘the reduction test for defeat’ — is that A is a defeater for B just if B is appropriately improbable with respect to the conjunction of A with EBSB.

Suppose we apply this test to the belief B that Mother Teresa was rational in behaving altruistically, with A being the belief that Simon's theory of altruism is good science and is incompatible with B; and let's suppose that Sis a Christian believer. To apply the reduction test, we must ask whether B is improbable with respect to the conjunction of A with EBSB. The answer, I should think, is that B is not improbable with respect to that conjunction. For EBSB includes the empirical evidence, whatever exactly it is, appealed to by Simon, but also the proposition that we human beings have been created by God and created in his image, along with the rest of the main lines of the Christian story. With respect to the conjunction of A with that body of propositions, it is not likely that if Mother Teresa had been more rational, smarter, she would have acted so as to increase her reproductive fitness rather than live altruistically. Hence, on the proposed reduction test, the fact that Simon's theory is good science and is more likely than not with respect to the scientific evidence base—that fact does not give Sa defeater for what she thinks about Mother Teresa.

Consider, on the other hand, the belief B* that the earth has corners and edges and the photographic evidence against that belief: here, plausibly, the reduction test gives the result that the latter is a defeater for B*. (True: a Christian might think that the Bible is infallible, since God is its ultimate author; but of course that leaves open the question what God intends to teach in the passage in question.) So the reduction test gives sensible results in these two cases. It can't be right in general, however—more exactly, it is right in general only on a certain very important assumption the believer is likely to reject. For it might be, clearly enough, that B has a lot of warrant on its own, warrant it doesn't get from the other members of EBS or indeed any other propositions. B may be basic with respect to warrant; B might get warrant from a source different from any involved in the scientific theory with which it is incompatible. If so, the fact that B is unlikely with respect to EBSB doesn't show that Shas a defeater for B in the fact that B is unlikely with respect to EBSB together with the relevant A.

By way of illustrative example: you are on trial for some crime; the evidence against you is strong, and you are convicted. Nevertheless, you remember very clearly that at the time the crime occurred, you were on a solitary walk in the woods. Your belief that you were walking in the woods isn't based on argument or inference from other propositions (You don't note, e.g., that you feel a little tired and that your walking shoes are muddy, and that there is a map of the area in your parka pocket, concluding that the best explanation of these phenomena is that you were walking there.) So consider EByouP, your evidence base diminished with respect to P, the proposition that you didn't commit the crime and were walking in the woods when it was committed. With respect to EByouP, P is epistemically improbable; after all, you have the same evidence as the jury for ¬P, and the jury is quite properly (if mistakenly) convinced that you did the crime. Still, you certainly don't have a defeater, here, for your belief that you are innocent. The reason, of course, is that P has for you a source of warrant independent of the rest of your beliefs: you remember it. In a case like this, whether you have a defeater for the belief P in question will depend, on the one hand, upon the strength of the intrinsic warrant enjoyed by P, and, on the other, the strength of the evidence against P from EByouP. Very often the intrinsic warrant will be the stronger.

The same will go for religious beliefs, if they do in fact have intrinsic warrant. If S holds a religious belief B and if B has warrant in the basic way, then even if the probability of B on EBSB together with the relevant A is low, it won't follow that A is a defeater of B for S. Perhaps the reduction test offers a necessary condition of A's being a defeater for B for S; it is also sufficient only if religious beliefs don't have warrant or positive epistemic status in the basic way, and only if they don't acquire warrant or positive epistemic status from a source other than those that confer that status on scientific beliefs. This is part of the importance of the question noted above in section 2.

5. Naturalism and Science

So far we've examined alleged conflict between theistic religious belief and science with respect to several areas: evolution, divine action in the world, the difference between the scientific attitude and the religious attitude, evolutionary psychology, and HBC. But some have suggested a science/religion (or science/quasi-religion) conflict of a wholly different sort: one between naturalism and science. (Otte 2002; Plantinga 1993, 2002a, forthcoming; Rea 2002; Taylor 1963); there are also hints of this effect in Nietzsche (2003) and in Darwin himself (1887).

Now naturalism comes in several different colors and flavors. First, there is the view that nature is all there is; there are no supernatural beings. Of course this is a bit slim as an explanation of naturalism; we need to know what nature is, and what allegedly supernatural beings might be like. Perhaps a way to proceed would be to say that naturalism, so conceived, is the view that there is no such person as the God of theism, or anything like God (see, e.g., Beilby 2002). Call this ‘naturalism1’. Another variety of naturalism, ‘scientific naturalism’, we might call it, would be the claim that there are no entities in addition to those endorsed by contemporary science (Kornblith 1994).[12] Given that current science endorses no supernatural beings, scientific naturalism implies naturalism1. There is also what we might call ‘epistemological naturalism’, according to which, roughly speaking, the methods of science are the only proper epistemic methods (Krikorian 1944). With the help of a couple of fairly obvious premises, epistemological naturalism also implies naturalism1, and I'll use ‘naturalism’ to refer to the disjunction of the three versions of naturalism sketched. Advocates of naturalism thus conceived would be (for example) Bertrand Russell (1957), Daniel Dennett (1995), Richard Dawkins (1986), David Armstrong (1978), and the many others that are sometimes said to endorse “The Scientific World-View.”

Naturalism is presumably not a religion. In one very important respect, however, it resembles religion: it can be said to perform the cognitive function of a religion. There is that range of deep human questions to which a religion typically provides an answer (above, Section I): what is the fundamental nature of the universe: for example, is it mind first, or matter (non-mind) first? What is most real and basic in it, and what kinds of entities does it display? What is the place of human beings in the universe, and what is their relation to the rest of the world? Are there prospects for life after death? Is there such a thing as sin, or some analogue of sin? If so, what are the prospects of combating or overcoming it? Where must we look to improve the human condition? Is there such a thing as a summum bonum, a highest good for human beings, and if so what is it? Like a typical religion, naturalism gives a set of answers to these and similar questions. We may therefore say that naturalism performs the cognitive function of a religion, and hence can sensibly be thought of as a quasi-religion.

Next, note many thinkers going back at least to Nietzsche (Nietzsche 2003) and possibly William Whewell (Curtis 1986) have pointed to a potentially worrisome implication of evolutionary theory. The worry can be put as follows. According to orthodox Darwinism, the process of evolution is driven mainly by two mechanisms: random genetic mutation and natural selection. The former is the chief source of genetic variability; by virtue of the latter, a mutation resulting in a heritable, fitness-enhancing trait is likely to spread through that population and be preserved as part of the genome. It is fitness-enhancing behavior and traits that get rewarded by natural selection; what get penalized are maladaptive traits and behaviors. In crafting our cognitive faculties, natural selection will favor cognitive faculties and processes that result in adaptive behavior; it cares not a whit about true belief (as such) or about cognitive faculties that reliably give rise to true belief. As evolutionary psychologist Donald Sloan Wilson puts it, “the well-adapted mind is ultimately an organ of survival and reproduction” (Wilson 2002, 228). What our minds are for (if anything) is not the production of true beliefs, but the production of adaptive behavior: that our species has survived and evolved at most guarantees that our behavior is adaptive; it does not guarantee or even make it likely that our belief-producing processes are for the most part reliable, or that our beliefs are for the most part true. That is because our behavior could perfectly well be adaptive, but our beliefs false as often as true. Darwin himself apparently worried about this question: "With me," says Darwin,

the horrid doubt always arises whether the convictions of man's mind, which has been developed from the mind of the lower animals, are of any value or at all trustworthy. Would any one trust in the convictions of a monkey's mind, if there are any convictions in such a mind? (Darwin 1887)

We can briefly state Darwin's doubt as follows. Let R be the proposition that our cognitive faculties are reliable, N the proposition that naturalism is true and E the proposition that we and our cognitive faculties have come to be by way of the processes to which contemporary evolutionary theory points us: what is the conditional probability of R on N&E? I.e., what is P(R | N&E)? Darwin fears it may be rather low.

Of course it is only unguided natural selection that prompts the worry. If natural selection were guided and orchestrated by the God of theism, for example, the worry would disappear; God would presumably use the whole process to create creatures of the sort he wanted, creatures in his own image, creatures with reliable cognitive faculties. So it is unguided evolution, and metaphysical beliefs that entail unguided evolution, that prompt this worry about the reliability of our cognitive faculties. Now naturalism entails that evolution, if it occurs, is indeed unguided. But then, so the suggestion goes, it is unlikely that our cognitive faculties are reliable, given the conjunction of naturalism with the proposition that we and our cognitive faculties have come to be by way of natural selection winnowing random genetic variation. If so, one who believes that conjunction will have a defeater for the proposition that our faculties are reliable—but if that's true, she will also have a defeater for any belief produced by her cognitive faculties—including, of course, the conjunction of naturalism with evolution. That conjunction is thus seen to be self-refuting. If so, however, this conjunction cannot rationally be accepted, in which case there is conflict between naturalism and evolution, and hence between naturalism and science.

We can state the argument schematically as follows:

  1. P(R | N&E) is low.
  2. Anyone who accepts N&E and sees that (1) is true has a defeater for R.
  3. Anyone who has a defeater for R has a defeater for any other belief she holds, including N&E itself.


  1. Anyone who accepts N&E and sees that (1) is true has a defeater for N&E; hence N&E can't be rationally accepted.

Of course this is brief and merely a schematic version of the argument; there is no space here for the requisite qualifications.

Support for (1) could go as follows. First, in order to avoid influence from our natural assumption that our cognitive faculties are reliable, think not about us, but about hypothetical creatures a lot like us, perhaps existing in some other part of the universe; and suppose N and E are true with respect to them. Next, note that naturalism apparently implies materialism (about human beings); current science does not endorse the existence of immaterial souls or minds or selves. So take naturalism to include materialism. What would a belief be, from this point of view? Presumably something like a long-term event or structure in the nervous system—perhaps a structured group of neurons connected and related in certain ways. Such a neural structure will have neurophysiological properties (‘NP properties’): properties specifying the number of neurons involved, the way in which those neurons are connected with each other and with other structures (with muscles, glands, sense organs, other neuronal events, etc.), the average rate and intensity of neuronal firing in various parts of this event, and the ways in which these rates of fire change over time and in response to input from other areas. If this event is really a belief, however, then it will also have content; it will be the belief that p, for some proposition p—perhaps the proposition naturalism is all the rage these days.

What is the relation between NP properties, on the one hand, and content properties—such properties as having the proposition that naturalism is all the rage these days as content—on the other? Perhaps the most popular position here is “nonreductive materialism” (NRM): content properties are distinct from but supervene on (see the entry on supervenience) NP properties.[13] Supervenience can be either broadly logical or nomic. In the latter case, there would be psychophysical laws relating NP properties to content properties: laws of the sort any structure with such and such NP properties will have such and such content. These laws presumably will be contingent (in the broadly logical or metaphysical sense). In the former case, there will also be such laws, but they will be necessary rather than contingent.

Now take any belief B you like on the part of a member of that hypothetical population: what is the (epistemic) probability that B is true, given N&E and nonreductive materialism—what is P(B | N&E&NRM)? What we know is that B has a certain content (call it ‘C’), and (we may assume or concede) having B is adaptive in the circumstances in which that creature finds itself. What, then, is the probability that C, the content of B, is true? Well, what is the probability that the relevant psychophysical law L connecting NP properties and content properties yields a true proposition as content in this instance? Having B is adaptive, in the circumstances in which the creature finds itself; its displaying the NP properties on which C supervenes causes adaptive behavior. But why think the content connected with those NP properties by L will be true in this creature's circumstances? What counts for adaptivity are the NP properties and the behavior they cause; it doesn't matter whether the supervening content is true. The NP properties are indeed adaptive; but that provides no reason, so far, for thinking the supervening content is true. Having B is adaptive by virtue of its causing adaptive behavior, not by virtue of having true content. Of course if theism is true, then human beings (as opposed to those hypothetical creatures, for whom naturalism is true) are made in the divine image, which includes the capacity for knowledge; so God would presumably have chosen the psychophysical laws in such a way that in the relevant circumstances, the neurophysiology yields true content. But nothing like that is true given naturalism; to suppose that the content properties that are adaptive, for the most part also lead to true content, would be wholly unjustified optimism.

So what is P(B | N&E&NRM)? Well, since the truth of B doesn't make a difference to the adaptivity of B, B could indeed be true, but is equally likely to be false; we'd have to estimate the probability that it is true as about the same as the probability that it is false. But that means that it is improbable that the believer in question has reliable cognitive faculties, i.e., faculties that produce a sufficient preponderance of true over false beliefs. For example, if so, if the believer in question has 1000 independent beliefs, each as likely to be false as true, the probability that, say, 3/4 of them are true (and this would be a modest requirement for reliability) will be very low—less than 10−58. So P(B | N&E&NRM) specified to these creatures will be low. But of course the same would hold for us, if naturalism is true: P(B | N&E&NRM) specified to us is equally low.[14]

That's the argument for the first premise. According to the second premise, one who sees this and also accepts N&E has a defeater for R, a reason to give it up, to cease believing it. The support offered for this premise is by way of analogy from clear cases. Suppose I believe there is a drug—call it XX—that destroys cognitive reliability; I believe 95% of those who ingest XX become cognitively unreliable. Suppose further that I now believe both that I've ingested XX and that P(R | I've ingested XX) is low; taken together, these two beliefs give me a defeater for my initial belief or assumption that my cognitive faculties are reliable. Furthermore, I can't appeal to any of my other beliefs to show or argue that my cognitive faculties are still reliable; any such other belief is also now suspect or compromised, just as R is. Any such other belief B is a product of my cognitive faculties: but then in recognizing this and having a defeater for R, I also have a defeater for B. Of course there will be many other examples: I'll get the same result if I believe that I am a brain in a vat and that P(R | I'm a brain in a vat) is low; the same goes for the classic Cartesian version of the same idea (namely that I've been created by a being who delights in deception) and for other more homely scenarios, for example, the belief that I've gone insane (perhaps by way of contracting mad cow disease). In all of these cases I get a defeater for R.

Now according to the third premise, one who has a defeater for R has a defeater for any belief she takes to be a product of her cognitive faculties—which is, of course, all of her beliefs. She therefore has a defeater for N&E itself; so one who accepts N&E (and sees that P(R | N&E) is low) has a defeater for N&E, a reason to doubt or reject or be agnostic with respect to it. Nor could she get independent evidence for R; the process of doing so would of course presuppose that her faculties are reliable. She'd be relying on the accuracy of her faculties in believing that the alleged evidence is in fact present and that it is in fact evidence for R. Thomas Reid (1785, 276) put it like this:

If a man's honesty were called into question, it would be ridiculous to refer to the man's own word, whether he be honest or not. The same absurdity there is in attempting to prove, by any kind of reasoning, probable or demonstrative, that our reason is not fallacious, since the very point in question is, whether reasoning may be trusted.

The argument concludes that the conjunction of naturalism with the theory of evolution cannot rationally be accepted—at any rate by someone who is apprised of this argument and sees the connection between N&E and R.

As one might expect, this argument has been controversial; a number of objections have been raised against it. (Beilby 1997; Ginet 1995, 403; O'Connor 1994, 527; Ross 1997; Fitelson and Sober 1998; Robbins 1994; Fales 1996; Lehrer 1996; Nathan 1997; Levin 1997; Fodor 1998) There have been responses to the objections (Plantinga 2002a; 2003), responses to those responses (Talbott, forthcoming), and so on; there is nothing like consensus regarding the argument. If the argument is correct, however, and N&E can't rationally be accepted, then there is a conflict between naturalism and evolution; one can't rationally accept them both. Hence there is conflict between naturalism and one of the chief pillars of contemporary science. Insofar as naturalism is a quasi-religion by virtue of performing the cognitive function of a religion, there is a sort of religion/science conflict—not between theistic religion and science, but between naturalism and science.


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behaviorism | cognitive science | consciousness | consciousness: animal | consciousness: representational theories of | emergent properties | evil, problem of | free will | identity theory of mind | incompatibilism: (nondeterministic) theories of free will | knowledge: analysis of | language of thought hypothesis | memory | mental causation | mental imagery | naturalism | neuroscience, philosophy of | perception: epistemological problems of | quantum theory: and consciousness | realism: semantic challenges to | relativism | religion: epistemology of | sociobiology | supervenience | Wundt, Wilhelm Maximilian


For wise counsel and good advice, I am grateful to Brian Boeninger, Thad Botham, EJ Coffman, Robin Collins, Tom Crisp, Chris Green, Jeff Green, Marcin Iwanicki, Nathan King, Dan McKaughan, Dolores Morris, Brian Pitts, Luke Potter and Del Ratzsch.