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Game Theory and Ethics

First published Sat Oct 16, 2004

Game theory is the systematic study of interdependent rational choice. It may be used to explain, to predict, and to evaluate human behavior in contexts where the outcome of action depends on what several agents choose to do and where their choices depend on what others choose to do. (See the entry on game theory) Game theory consequently is relevant to ethics, and it is used in moral and political philosophy in a variety of ways.

We shall concentrate on the influence and use of game theory in ethics and those parts of political theory involving norms or principles of justice, ignoring questions about political and legal institutions on the one hand and questions about issues dealing with moral virtues on the other.

One can distinguish three distinctive kinds of inquiries in the literature. The first we shall call functionalist: game theory is used to identify the function of morality. It is used to describe the problem(s) that would occur in the absence of morality, and inferences about the remedial or ameliorative function of morality are drawn from this description. The second approach, contractarianism, uses game theory (especially bargaining theory) to formalize social contract theory. This older tradition understands political institutions or norms to be justified to the extent that rational agents would agree to them under suitable conditions. Bargaining theory has been used to establish, first, that there will be agreement in such conditions and, secondly, to predict the outcome of this bargaining process. Third and finally, game theory, especially evolutionary game theory, is used to “recover” many traditional moral norms or practices. In what follows, we shall consider each of these approaches and the results and problems they have encountered. We shall start with some historical background.

1. History

In 1954 the British philosopher Richard Braithwaite gave his inaugural lecture entitled Theory of Games as a Tool for the Moral Philosopher (Braithwaite 1955). In his lecture Braithwaite argued that many questions about distributive justice have the same structure as “the bargaining problem”. This problem had been analyzed some years before by John Nash, the later Nobel Prize winner, using game theory (Nash 1950). Braithwaite predicted that game theory would fundamentally change moral philosophy. His prediction came less than ten years after the publication of John von Neumann and Oskar Morgenstern's Theory of Games and Economic Behaviour — a book that started a completely new branch of social science and applied mathematics (Von Neumann and Morgenstern 1944).

The introduction of game theory in ethics was not entirely a new development. Game-theoretic ideas can be found, for instance, in the work of Thomas Hobbes and David Hume (see Gauthier 1969; Vanderschraaf 1998)). Nevertheless, Braithwaite's prediction has not come true. Game theory has not (yet) fundamentally changed ethics. Ten years after Braithwaite, Brian Barry published Political Argument, and a few years later David Lewis' seminal work Convention came out (Barry 1965; Lewis 1969). In the late 60's, the first of a series of publications by David Gauthier appeared. In these he used game theory to develop his moral theory (Gauthier 1967). However, until recently, the influence of game theory in ethics has not been anywhere as great as in the social sciences in general. Notwithstanding this faltering start, the introduction of game theory in moral philosophy has produced a steadily increasing flow of important publications.

2. Functionalism

Game theory has been used to analyze the function of morality. A good example is Edna Ullmann-Margalit's The Emergence of Norms, in which she argues that moral norms enable agents to cooperate and coordinate their actions in situations where the pursuit of self-interest prevents this (Ullmann-Margalit 1977). Her now classic example is that of two artillerymen who face the choice to flee from the advancing enemy or stay and operate their gun. Their gun is located in a strategically important pass. If both stay, they have a significant chance of being injured, but it is certain that the advance of the enemy will be halted. If both flee, the enemy will be able to take the mountain pass, overtake and capture them. If just one of them stays while the other flees, the brave artillerist will die in battle, but the other gunner will have just enough time to escape safely. Supposing that both try to survive this ordeal, preferably unhurt, each soldier has reason to flee. The reason for this is that they are engaged in a prisoner's dilemma (see Figure 1). Each gunner has the choice between fleeing and staying and fighting. This choice is represented in the rows for gunner #1 and the columns for gunner #2. Each cell in the matrix represents the outcome of each possible pair of choices. Each cell has a pair of numbers. The number in the lower left corner of each cell represents how gunner #1 ranks this outcome, relative to the other possible outcomes — ranks represented by “utility” numbers. The number in the upper right corner represents the ranking of this outcome by #2.

Figure 1
Figure 1

Consider the case for #1. Suppose #2 decides to stay and fight. In that case, #1 is best off by fleeing. He will survive without getting hurt. In the formal representation of the matrix, he will secure a higher ranking (3 rather than 2). Suppose #2 decides to flee. Again, #1 does best by fleeing. He will survive the battle, although he will be imprisoned for the duration of the war. If he were to stay and fight, he would certainly die; by fleeing he will secure a higher ranking (1 rather than 0). Gunner #2 is in the same position as #1: for him as well, whatever the other does, he fares best by fleeing. In short, each individual gunner would be better off fleeing, regardless of what the other does. However, it remains true — and to some, paradoxical -- that both would be better off if both stood their ground. The outcome of individually rational action is Pareto-inefficient (or sub-optimal).

Suppose that both understand the structure of their predicament. Since they would see that each has good reasons to flee, they could try to rule out this possibility. For example, they could chain each other to the gun, thus preventing flight. Ullmann-Margalit argued that the situation of the gunners (i.e., the prisoner's dilemma) is structurally equivalent to many everyday interactions governed by morality. Furthermore, just as the mutual chaining commits the gunners to stay and fight, morality commits agents to avoid Pareto-inefficient or sub-optimal outcomes. Morality binds individuals to their guns, as it were. On this view, the function of morality is to prevent the failures of rationality (Mackie 1977).

3. Problems with functionalism

There are several problems with this functional analysis of morality. First, there are some well-known problems with functionalist explanations in the social sciences. The fact that a practice or an institution has a particular function need not explain either its emergence or its maintenance. It might be argued, for instance, that the function of the public education system is to educate the young, the function of the state to serve the interests of the ruling classes, or that of religion to serve as the opiate of the masses. However, until it can be shown that these apparent functions are causally effective in bringing into existence and maintaining the educational system, the state, or religion respectively, no explanation has been provided. Similarly, even if moral norms and practices serve to bring about Pareto-superior outcomes not realizable through uncoordinated individually rational action, no explanation of the existence and persistence of morality is provided unless it is shown that this function somehow motivates human action and or in some other way is causally effective in bringing about mutually beneficial outcomes.

Secondly, it is open to question whether morality coincides with mutually advantageous or Pareto-superior outcomes in the manner suggested. Many thinkers have argued that we often are morally required to act in ways which are disadvantageous to all. An obvious example is the often-affirmed prohibition against selling oneself into slavery. It might very well be advantageous to both slave and master (the slave would be able to pay off his debts and the master would have a practical solution for the daily housework), yet it is morally and legally prohibited.

Third, the functionalist account clearly assumes that the demands of morality conflict with individual rationality. Morality is supposed to correct problems of threatening Pareto-inefficiency which would be the result of unfettered (interdependent) individual rational action. On the functionalist account the moral agent seems ipso facto to be irrational (barring considerations of guilt-avoidance or regret). This then begs the question ‘why be moral?’. Functionalism precludes an answer to this question.

Fourth and finally, the objective of functionalist accounts is of limited interest to moral theorists. Functionalism appears to seek explanations of the emergence and persistence of moral norms and practices. Moral theorists are not interested principally in such explanations. Rather, they usually seek to understand morality with the aim of ascertaining what we should do or what we are obligated to do. It is morality as a guide to action and to life that is the principal interest of the moral philosopher. Morality here is normative, a source of guidance. Suppose that there were a plausible functional explanation of particular moral norms. Does that explanation show that I am, in fact, obligated to follow these norms when they apply to me? There seems to be a difference between (a) determining the function(s) of morality and (b) ascertaining whether a particular set of norms and practices are, in fact, the ones we should follow. It is not clear how this question is answered by functionalist accounts.

4. Bargaining theory and contractarianism

As we saw above, one of the criticisms of functionalism is that it does not explain the connection between individual choice and the emergence and persistence of moral norms. Morality is introduced as something outside of individual rational choice. In response to this difficulty, many theorists have tried to understand morality as the result of individual rational choice. Roughly, we can distinguish two strategies. First, there are those who model morality as the result of a one-time choice of a very large collection of agents, the moral community. Secondly, there are those who approach morality as the result of a series of repeated small-scale interactions. We will discuss this second approach in section 7. Here we discuss the approach that regards morality as the intended result of the interactions between rational agents under equally ideal circumstances. This is an old idea in moral and political philosophy: it is the idea of the social contract (see the entry on contractarianism). Morality is interpreted as the outcome of a bargaining process.

The introduction of game theory, especially those parts of the theory that are concerned with bargaining (so-called cooperative game theory and bargaining theory), has stimulated interest in social contract theory over the last decades. John Harsanyi, Richard Braithwaite, John Rawls, Brian Barry, and David Gauthier have used the game and decision theory to formulate versions of the theory (Harsanyi 1955; Braithwaite 1955; Barry 1965; Rawls 1971; Gauthier 1986). Invoking bargaining theory, they attempted to show (1) that rational agents in a suitably idealized bargaining situation will agree on a specific, unique distribution of the benefits of cooperation, (2) what this distribution looks like, (3) that this distribution determines what is just, and (4), in case of Gauthier, that rational agents will comply with the terms of the bargain.

It is important for these theories exactly how the bargaining situation is characterized. Gauthier, as well as many others, thinks of it as a prisoner's dilemma. That is, the predicament of the parties in the ideal bargaining position is structurally equivalent to the situation of the artillerists as we described above. Without any cooperation the gunners are doomed to flee and spend the remainder of the war in captivity. Suppose that it is possible to make binding agreements in this situation. Does this solve the problem of threatening Pareto-inefficiency? It does not because it is not obvious how the benefits of cooperation will be distributed. It might seem that in this case there is only one way in which these can be distributed, but appearances deceive. The artillerists could decide to follow a mixed strategy. A mixed strategy is a lottery over the available strategies of each individual. For example, the gunners could decide to flee with a probability of, say, 1/3 and stay and fight with a probability of 2/3. (It should be noted that the idea of a mixed strategy usually is introduced in the context of so-called cardinal utilities. Whereas before the numbers in the matrix (0, 1, 2 and 3) only signified the ranking of the outcome, here it is assumed that the numbers provide some information about the relative ranking of the outcome. For example, the utility of ”2” of the cooperative outcome means that the agent is indifferent between this outcome and a gamble which offers her ”0” (the worst outcome) with probability 1/3 and ”3” (her best outcome) with probability 2/3. (For a detailed discussion of cardinal utility theory see Section 3.5 of the entry on interpretations of probability as well as the entry on the St. Petersburg Paradox). From here onwards, we assume that the numbers in the matrix are such cardinal utilities.)

The gunners realize that they each individually can realize at least the one but worst outcome of non-cooperation. This means that the outcome of their agreement should be at least as good as the non-cooperative outcome. Therefore, the distribution that they will agree to should at least be 1. Suppose that the gunners have a pair of dice. Now they can realize cooperative distributions other than 2 each. For example, if they agree to throw both dice and if a total of 6 or less comes up #1 will flee (thus realizing a utility value of 3). However, if the total of both dice is more than 6, #1 will stay and fight the enemy (realizing his worst outcome of 0). The expected utility of this deal for #1 is 5/12·3 + 7/12·0 = 1.25, while #2 can expect 1.75 from this deal. In this way the gunners can realize a whole range of outcomes by varying the chances that improves on the non-cooperative outcome. These outcomes form the bargaining area (see Figure 2).

Figure 2
Figure 2

Intuitively it may seem straightforward that the outcome of the agreement between #1 and #2 will be (2,2). Formally this is anything but straightforward. Every outcome that gives each gunner an expected utility of more than 1 seems rationally acceptable. Which one will rational gunners select? Within bargaining theory, the part of game theory that deals with these problems, there are two approaches that seek to answer this question (Binmore 1998, chapter 1). First, there is the traditional axiomatic approach as developed in the context of cooperative game theory. This branch of game theory assumes that, once rational agents have come to an agreement, they will comply with it. The task of the theorist is to consider the bargaining area and determine which outcome(s) would satisfy a number of reasonable requirements of a rational outcome of the negotiations. Things such as the names of the parties concerned should not matter for the result, whereas their preferences do matter. This approach has been very influential in game-theoretic social contract theory. Harsanyi, Rawls, Barry, and Gauthier all have used axiomatic approaches to justify their favorite version. Their verdict in the case of the gunners is the same: the rational thing to agree to is a distribution that gives each gunner an expected utility of 2. (Note that this verdict does not tell the gunners how they should realize this outcome. There are two ways in which they could secure an expected outcome of (2, 2). They could both stay and fight or they could flip a fair coin to decide who gets to stay and who is allowed to flee.)

The axiomatic approach pays no attention to the structure of the process of negotiation. All it requires as input is information about the pay-offs of the parties. Whereas it is true that sometimes it does not really matter how exactly the negotiation process is structured, sometimes it is very important. For example, if it is the case that #1 can make a claim and all #2 can do is to accept or refuse, #1 does best by offering #2 an expected utility of 1.00001 and claim 2.99999 for himself. Given the rules of the negotiation process #2 will have to accept this since the alternative is (slightly) worse. On the other hand, if the rules allow for exchanges of claims and offers the situation is quite different. Therefore, if you want to predict what the result of the negotiation process between rational agents will be, it is crucial to know the rules of negotiation in detail as well as the bargaining area. In addition, it is important to know whether the parties will keep to the agreement. For if this is not the case, it is unlikely that the parties concerned will accept the agreement instead of an agreement that will turn out to be binding.

Therefore, it is better to think of the bargaining process as a series of possible moves in a game that precedes the game that the gunners face. This is the second approach, which regards bargaining processes as non-cooperative games. The solution to such a game then corresponds to the solution of the bargaining process. On this approach, one needs to pay a lot of attention to detail. Consequently the analysis is complicated and often messy. (This is another reason why the axiomatic approach is so attractive to some.)

However, it is very well possible that the solution to the game and the solution based on the axiomatic approach are identical. In fact, this is what you would expect if the proposed axiomatic solution is at all plausible. This intuition is the driving force of the so-called Nash program (Nash 1950). This program aims at evaluating axiomatic solutions by checking whether the outcome of a negotiation game leads to the same outcome. The success of the Nash program is crucial for the plausibility of the classic axiomatic theories of the social contract. Such theories regard morality as the result of (hypothetical) negotiations between ideally rational agents but do not bother to spell out exactly how the parties reach this result. Consequently, if there is not at least the promise of such a detailed analysis, as is promised by the Nash program, the result they present lacks plausibility. (See also Rubinstein 1982 and Binmore 1998 for more recent treatments of the bargaining problem.)

5. Morals by agreement

One of the most influential contractarian theories currently around is that of David Gauthier. His theory, however, is different from other contractarian approaches, not only in its extensive use of game- and bargaining theory, but also in the following respect. One of the difficulties we signaled with regards to the functionalist approach is that it provides no answer to the question “Why be moral?” It is here that Gauthier's contractarian theory distinguishes itself from those of Rawls, Harsanyi, and others. Gauthier not only uses bargaining theory to determine, as Rawls and Harsanyi sought to do, the content of fundamental moral principles; he also tries to show that rational agents will act morally. For this reason we discuss it in more detail than the others.

Gauthier's moral theory, “morals by agreement” (Gauthier 1986), is a theory about the nature and rationality of morality. (See also Section 3 of the entry on contractarianism). It consists of four parts. The first is an account of practical reason and the natural condition of humankind, much of it familiar to rational choice theorists and to contractarian moral theorists (Gauthier 1986, chapters 2-4). Next is an account of the principles of conduct that rational agents would hypothetically agree to — a kind of “social contract” (Gauthier 1986, chapter 5). The third element is a controversial revisionist account of practical rationality essential to his argument aiming to show that virtually everyone under normal circumstances has reason to accept and to abide by the constraints imposed by these principles (Gauthier 1986, chapter 6). Lastly, Gauthier argues that the principles in question are principles of morality, an argument which makes implicit reference to a functionalist account of moral norms (Gauthier 1986, chapters 7-8). The third part is Gauthier's answer to the question “Why be moral?”. It touches upon some very fundamental issues in game- and decision theory, which is why we discuss it a bit further here.

As Hobbes already realized, it is one thing to come to an agreement; it is quite another thing to perform one's part of an agreement. Morality, at least as it is traditionally conceived, often requires us to sacrifice our interests or aims. This is, at least on the face of it, contrary to what rationality requires. Gauthier's response to this is to argue that we misconceive practical rationality, even instrumental rationality, if we think the aim of rationality determines in any straightforward way the manner in which we should reason or deliberate. The aim of rationality — to do as well as possible — does not necessarily determine our principle of decision — for instance, to choose the best alternative at each moment of choice. In terms of the utility-maximizing conception of rationality which he has accepted until recently (Gauthier, forthcoming), Gauthier argues that the aim of maximizing utility does not mean that we should, at each decision point, maximize utility. Instead we should reason in ways which are utility maximizing. Just as it is sometimes the case that we do best or at least well by not aiming to do best or well, so it may sometimes be that the utility maximizing course of action is not to maximize utility at each decision point. Given that our mode of reasoning or deliberation itself affects our prospects, our aims or purposes are sometimes best served by our not seeking to do best at every decision point.

Gauthier's discussion in Morals by Agreement is conducted in terms of “dispositions to choose” and specifically of “constrained maximization”, the disposition to cooperate with other cooperators even in circumstances where defecting is more advantageous. In later work Gauthier develops his revisionist account of practical rationality in terms of rational plans and intentions and of modes of deliberation. If we grant that agents may do better in any number of circumstances by acting in ways that are not “straightforwardly maximizing”, the problem is to determine how acting as a constrained maximizer is rational. In the book Gauthier assumes that if our dispositions to choose is rational, then our choices determined by these dispositions are also rational. A number of theorists have followed Thomas Schelling in arguing that it is often rational to do things that are irrational, but they argue that the latter do not in the circumstances cease being irrational. Gauthier thinks that if a course of action is better than any other in its effects, then it may under certain conditions be rational to adopt it and to intend to carry out its element even if some of them are not, from the standpoint of the moment of execution, the best thing to do in terms of one's aims or purposes. He seeks therefore to establish that if a mode of deliberation or a plan of action is rational, then acting according to it can be rational even if so acting requires doing things that are not, considered from the standpoint of the moment of action, optimal. Principled action constrains one's action, and it is rational to be so constrained. Thus, if Gauthier is right, it can be rational to abide by certain norms or principles, even when they require acting in ways that are not best from the standpoint of the time of action. Much of Gauthier's work since Morals by Agreement develops and defends this revisionist account of practical rationality. (See Gauthier 1994, 1996, 1998a and b. For an alternative revisionist account, see McClennen 1990).

Gauthier's defense of “constrained maximization” constitutes a major revision of standard game- and decision theory. Orthodox theory focuses upon the rationality of actions at the time of choice. The mode of deliberation itself about actions falls out of the scope of the theory. (Or rather, orthodox theory presents itself as such a mode of deliberation.) Some critics have argued against including the mode of deliberation in the scope of the theory (for example, Velleman 1997). Most game theorists, however, argue instead that if it is feasible to choose the mode of deliberation, this choice itself can be modeled as a move in a more complex decision game, thus including Gauthier's proposal into standard theory (for example, Binmore 1994, p. 179-182).

6. Some problems with the contractarian approach.

The contractarian approach — and Gauthier's theory is not different in this respect — presumes a fundamental connection between rationality and morality, just like functionalism. However, unlike the functionalist project, the contractarian approach has a sophisticated argument as to why this should be so. Moral norms (or institutions, or whatever is the object of the theory in question) are rationally acceptable according to the contractarian tradition only if there is no feasible alternative arrangement where all parties concerned would be better off. We can make this claim more vivid. Imagine that parties are bargaining over what norm to use to share a cake. Rational parties would not agree to a norm that would leave some cake on the table going to waste. Similarly with moral norms: rational agents would not agree to a norm that could be expected to leave mutual advantages unexploited. Therefore, according to the contractarian's conception of morality, it is necessarily the case that the correct morality leads to Pareto-efficient outcomes. For this reason, rational choice contractarianism is often regarded as revisionist in its implications. The claim is not that common sense or ordinary morality leads to Pareto-efficient results (if followed). Instead, the claim of rational choice contractarianism is that the correct account of binding moral norms is one that implies that if these norms are followed, the outcomes will be Pareto-efficient.

Critics have long argued that it's not clear why the outcome of hypothetical agreement should influence what agents outside of the idealized circumstances of “the social contract” should do. Some have argued that hypothetical contracts (or promises) do not bind. However, this is to misunderstand the nature of these theories; hypothetical rational agreement is not meant to be promissory. Rather, it is first of all heuristic, a mechanism designed to determine the nature and content of mutually beneficial, fair principles.

Whereas the remarks above address all forms of contractarianism, there are some specific problems with versions that rely as heavily on game-theoretic bargaining theory as that of Gauthier and the others. The most fundamental seems to be the plausibility of the Nash program: is there really a rational solution to all bargaining problems that can be specified and tested with the use of non-cooperative game theory? Similarly, how can we be sure that there is always one unique solution, or are bargaining problems to some extent underdetermined? The plurality of bargaining solution concepts that are discussed in bargaining theory is a bad omen in this regard. There are reasons to doubt that the game-theoretic approach to bargaining can really help us predict the outcome of the negotiations of rational agents. Both the axiomatic approach and the non-cooperative game approach proceed from the assumption that there is a unique, rational outcome of such negotiations. While that may be plausible in some situations, it is far from obvious that this is always the case. That is, the outcome of negotiations often seems rationally underdetermined (Sugden 1991). Non-rational factors, such as salience, precedence, etc., are far more important for determining the result of such negotiations than standard bargaining and game theory lead us to believe.

7. Evolutionary game theory and ethics

There is also another kind of worry, one which leads naturally to the third major movement in game theory and ethics. Contractarians like Gauthier understand the fundamental norms that govern us as issuing from a (hypothetical) choice situation which would have a very large number of agents bargaining over different principles or social arrangements. However, it is an open question whether that is an appropriate way to model the rational choice process that leads to the emergence of morality.

At this point, there is a fundamental difference with the third way in which game theory had been applied to ethics. This third way is evolutionary game-theory. Rather than regarding morality as the intended result of a complex large scale bargaining process between fully informed and fully rational agents, the evolutionary approach moves away from all these assumptions. First, morality is seen as the unintended side-effect of the interactions of agents. Secondly, morality emerges from a series of repeated interactions between small groups of agents (most models deal with two-person interactions only). To put this in functionalist terms: morality is not to solve one problem, but frequently re-occurring problems. Third, rather than assuming full information and full rationality, evolutionary game theory makes less demanding assumptions of the cognitive and deliberative skills of the agents. This can lead to fundamentally different results.

We can illustrate this as follows. Rousseau describes the state of nature as one that resembles the so-called Stag Hunt (Rousseau 1964, p. 166-167). (See Skyrms 2004 for a contemporary treatment of this game.) Imagine two hunters who can choose to hunt for hare. Their chances of catching a hare are not affected by the actions of others. However, both prefer to have venison for dinner, but if they were to hunt for stag, they will only be successful if the other does so as well.

Figure 3
Figure 3: The stag hunt

Suppose #1 and #2 coordinate on (Hare, Hare). This equilibrium is strictly Pareto-inferior to (Stag, Stag). Whereas contractarian choice would have it that (Stag, Stag) is the correct norm to settle upon, evolutionary game theory teaches us that it is unlikely that the Pareto-efficient equilibrium will be selected in a process of repeated interactions. What is more, the Pareto-efficient equilibrium is unstable: occasional deviations from this equilibrium will lead the population as a whole to coordinate on (hare, hare) rather than (stag, stag).

Presumably this is true of some of our actual norms — social, legal, or moral. They may be deficient relative to other norms, especially those that issue from the sorts of idealized social choice situations of contractarian moral theory. However, most of our actual norms are often stable, and it is not clear that we have reason to depart from them. Therefore, we are left wondering if the norms discovered by game theoretic bargaining theory are norms that are feasible for most societies, communities and groups. Since “ought” implies “can”, we have reason to doubt that the contractarian approach gives us a correct account of the morality we ought to follow.

The main result of the evolutionary approach so far is the “recovery” of many existing moral intuitions and norms. Thus, evolutionary game theorists writing about ethics (as well as moral philosophers using evolutionary game theory) have shown that among not-so-fully rational agents many of the norms of coordination and cooperation can emerge that are the object of inquiry of the more traditional moral theories. (For example, Sugden 1986; Binmore 1994, 1998; Skyrms 1996.) Furthermore, Skyrms (1996) and others have demonstrated that otherwise self-interested agents will develop reasoning heuristics such as the Golden Rule (do to others as you want to be done by) and a version of Gauthier's “constraint maximization” under appropriate circumstances. That is, they show that evolution favors not only the emergence of patterns of behavior that conform to moral standards, but also favor the development of cognitive heuristics that have all the characteristics of moral reasoning.

8. Some remarks on the evolutionary approach

Most authors who have embraced the evolutionary approach, are quick to point out that this approach avoids much of the criticism raised against the previous two approaches. First, the evolutionary approach provides a genuine explanation of the emergence and persistence of moral norms. Norms are the unintended side-effect of the actions of (boundedly) rational agents and emerge in the process of repeated interactions. On the evolutionary approach, the “function” of a moral norm is to select a stable equilibrium, in a situation in which there is more than one. Thus stable norms can be Pareto-inefficient. There is no fundamental link between efficiency and morality on the evolutionary approach. Its focus is on equilibrium and not on efficiency. This is also the reason why an agent in such a population should follow that norm. That is, the fact that the other members of a population follow a norm explains why, and justifies that, an individual in such a population will do so as well. As a consequence, the evolutionary approach provides an answer to the question “Why be moral?” Following an existing norm is individually rational. Furthermore, no unorthodox revisions of choice theory need to be accepted to achieve this result, which is a big advantage over Gauthier's claims for “constrained maximization”.

However, there is also some reason to be wary of the success of the evolutionary approach. For just like the functionalist approach and unlike the contractarian project, its focus is on explanation. Evolutionary game theory is primarily used to explain the emergence and stability of existing norms. It does not supply the instruments to be critical of the content of these norms. It provides no justification of a code of conduct as one that is decidedly moral (however, see Binmore 1994, 1998).

This tendency is especially worrisome when we see in the literature on the evolution of behavior explanations for nasty dispositions such as the propensity of men to rape, the human inclination to make status distinctions based on race, and the like. So it is not clear to what extend this approach provides an alternative to existing moral theories. It is probably best understood as a form of social theory, albeit one that is ambivalent as to whether it is an empirically informed theory or a form of a priori theorizing (Sugden 2001). Of course, one may come to think that evolutionary game theory is not an alternative to moral theory as much as a vehicle for undermining or debunking moral claims. If the source of our moral dispositions and judgments is essentially the same as the nasty inclinations mentioned above, then perhaps we should conclude that our moral judgments are false or unjustified and our moral dispositions untrustworthy. Evolutionary game theory, on this interpretation, would support a kind of moral skepticism (see Section 1 of the entry on moral skepticism). Some answers to this skepticism may be found, for instance, in Gibbard (1990).

9. Some abstract implications of the use of game theory in ethics

Regardless of the merits of the three approaches we discussed above, there are some remarkable insights that the application of game theory offers to the moral theorist. As we noted above, there are many games with multiple equilibria. This is especially the case with iterated plays of particular games such as the prisoner's dilemma. One of the implications of this fact is that insofar as these games are helpful representations or models of our social interactions, we have reason to expect much indeterminacy in the world. As a consequence, we have reason to be wary of moral theorists that claim universality and generality for their specific normative recommendations (Hardin 1988, 2003).

Secondly, game theory makes clear that in any sufficiently large population we can expect determinate mixes of behavioral dispositions. Consider the well-known Hawk-Dove game (Smith 1982):

Figure 4
Figure 4: the Hawk-Dove game

The two equilibria in pure strategies in the simple 2 X 2 game result from each player adopting a different strategy. If we think of “Hawk” and “Dove” strategies as representing moral dispositions or characters, then we may have reason to expect that human populations will consist of agents with different characters, so to speak (see also Frank 1988; Smith 1982; Skyrms 1996). What is more, given this analysis it is far from clear that the moral theorist is in any position to recommend the same disposition, i.e., the same virtue, for all agents in this population: some should be “Hawks” others “Doves” (see also Kuhn 2004).

Whereas the latter two observations point to original insights for moral theorists, we cannot avoid mentioning some of the criticisms that have been formulated against the application of game theory to ethics. The most fundamental ones concern the implicit anthropology of the rational agent. The question is whether everything that is relevant for moral theory about the agent can be captured by the rather one-dimensional picture of rational man as proposed by game theory. The agent is supposed to be completely characterized by his preference rankings over outcomes and his beliefs at each stage of the game. However, morally important distinctions — e.g., between differences in character — have no place in this characterization.

We can illustrate this worry with the way the concept of reputation is used in models of altruistic cooperation. Recent game theory has made use of the notion of a player's reputation in efforts to explain cooperation in iterated plays of games such as the prisoner's dilemma (Kreps and Wilson 1982). In many repeated prisoner dilemma games it pays to have a reputation to be cooperative. However, it is not clear what exactly it means to have a reputation in these contexts. Ordinarily, a reputation is what is generally believed about a person's character. In these models, on the other hand, a reputation is simply a history of the player's moves in similar games. There is a morally relevant difference between the two. What do we believe when we learn that a merchant is honest? Ordinarily we suppose this means that he is the kind of person who will not cheat others, for instance, customers, even in situations where it might pay him to do so. Why might the merchant do this? While another merchant doesn't cheat because (or when) it does not pay, our merchant is honest and does not cheat because of his honesty, that is, his character. Ordinarily, this makes a big difference in how we would judge on these two merchants. Both behave cooperatively, but only the latter is praiseworthy for his honesty. Game theory and utility theory generally has no room for this distinction (see Morris 1999). (Of relevance here is Brennan and Pettit, 2004.)

10. Conclusion

Most contemporary authors in ethics who use game theory in their work are either contractarians or evolutionary theorists. The two approaches represent two different combinations of game theory and ethics. The contractarian tradition, with its emphasis on fully rational agents and bargaining, represents a more traditional use of game theory. The evolutionary approach, on the other hand, with its emphasis on bounded rational agents and repeated interactions, is a more recent arrival. To most experts in the field a synthesis of these approaches seems highly desirable. (Binmore 1994, 1998 is to date the only attempt.)


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contractarianism | functionalism | game theory | game theory: evolutionary | prisoner's dilemma