Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Johann Georg Hamann

First published Sat Jun 29, 2002; substantive revision Fri Jul 20, 2007

Johann Georg Hamann (1730-1788) lived and worked in Prussia, in the context of the late German Enlightenment. Although he remained outside ‘professional’ philosophical circles, in that he never held a University post, he was respected in his time for his scholarship and breadth of learning. His writings were notorious even in his own time for the challenges they threw down to the reader. These challenges to interpretation and understanding are only heightened today.

Nevertheless an increasing number of scholars from philosophy, theology, aesthetics and German studies are finding his ideas and insights of value to contemporary concerns. His central preoccupations are still pertinent: language, knowledge, the nature of the human person, sexuality and gender and the relationship of humanity to God. Meanwhile, his views, which in many respects anticipate later challenges to the Enlightenment project and to modernity, are still relevant and even provocative.

1. Life

Johann Georg Hamann was born in Königsberg in 1730, the son of a midwife and a barber-surgeon. He began study in philosophy and theology at the age of 16, changed to law but mainly read literature, philology, and rhetoric, but also mathematics and science. He left university without completing his studies and became the governor to a wealthy family on a Baltic estate. During this time he continued his extraordinarily broad reading and private research. He took up a job in the family firm of a friend from his Königsberg days, Christoph Berens, and was sent on an obscure mission to London, in which he evidently failed. He then led a high life until he ran out of friends, money and support. In a garret, depressed and impoverished, he read the Bible cover to cover and experienced a religious conversion.

He returned to the House of Berens in Riga, where they evidently forgave him his failure. He fell in love with Christoph Berens' sister, Katharina, but was refused permission to marry her by his friend, on the grounds of his religious conversion; Berens was an enthusiastic follower of the Enlightenment and was nauseated by the more pious manifestations of Hamann's new-found religiosity. Smarting from this blow and its motivations, Hamann returned to his father's house in Königsberg, where he lived for the rest of his life until his final months.

In Königsberg, he never held an official academic post, nor an ecclesiastical one; this may in part have been due to his pronounced speech impediment, which inhibited him from either lecturing or preaching. Eventually, through the intercession of his acquaintance, Immanuel Kant, he found employment as a low-level civil servant working in the tax office of Frederick the Great; a ruler Hamann in fact despised. Nevertheless his principal activity was as an editor and a writer; he was considered one of the most widely-read scholars of his time (greatly aided by his fluency in many languages), as well as a notorious author. During this time, despite his committed Christianity, he lived with a woman whom he never married but to whom he remained devoted and faithful, having four children on whom he doted, and who occasionally feature in his writings (principally as unruly distractions to the author's scholarship).

At the end of his life he accepted an invitation to Münster from one of his admirers, Princess Gallitzin. He died in Münster in 1788.

Hamann had a profound influence on the German ‘Storm and Stress’ movement, and on other contemporaries such as Herder and Jacobi; he impressed Hegel and Goethe (who called him the brightest head of his time) and was a major influence on Kierkegaard. His influence continued on twentieth century German thinkers, particularly those interested in language. His popularity has increased dramatically in the last few decades amongst philosophers, theologians, and German studies scholars around the world.

2. Writings

Hamann's writings are all short; he was not given to extensive treatises. They are also usually motivated by something very specific: someone else's publication, or particular circumstances and events. When responding to these, he presupposes considerable knowledge on the part of the reader; typically his responses to the work of others involves adoption of their terminology and style, blending into mimicry and parody as a rhetorical and argumentative device. Moreover, woven into these writings is an extraordinary breadth and quantity of citations and allusions; and by no means are these all clear and obvious. Thus, when he chooses, his essays are a tapestry of multicolored threads of the ideas, language, and imagery of thinkers, be they ancient, biblical, or contemporary. These are woven across a woof of a love of irony, which as ever adds a layer of interpretative complexity.

Hamann's writings also frequently appear under the name of various fanciful characters: Aristobolus, the Knight of the Rose-Cross, the Sibyl, Adelgunde. It cannot be assumed that such characters faithfully represent Hamann's own views; The opinions of Aristobolus, for example, are a device to deconstruct and drive to absurdity a number of views which Hamann opposes.

These factors combine to make Hamann's writings notoriously difficult to understand and interpret. Goethe observed that when reading Hamann, “one must completely rule out what one normally means by understanding” [Goethe, 550]. Even if one has – or painfully acquires, or borrows from other current scholars – the breadth of reference to understand the source of an allusion or citation, it is not always clear what the citation is doing there, and what Hamann means to suggest by referring to it. He delighted in sporting with his reader; preferring to present a balled fist and leave it to the reader to unroll it into a flat hand (to borrow one of his own images; cf. the end of the “Metacritique of the Purism of Reason”, 1780).

This impenetrability has been taken by some to signify an incapacity for clear expression on Hamann's part. Hegel remarked: "The French have a saying: Le stile c'est l'homme meme (“The style is the man himself”); Hamann's writings do not have a particular style but rather are style through and through" [Hegel, 209]. Others, however, have pointed to the clarity and concision of his letters, in contrast to the puzzling style he uses to address the public. They suggest that Hamann's challenging style forms are an important part of Hamann's hermeneutics and his understanding of the relationship between the writer and reader: two halves of a whole who must relate themselves to one another and unite for a common goal (“Reader and Critic”, 1762). The reader cannot be passive and must work to reconstruct Hamann's meaning. As Hamann observed, “A writer who is in a hurry to be understood today or tomorrow runs the danger of being misunderstood the day after tomorrow.”

Consequently, Hamann is highly susceptible to misinterpretation. For example, one can find in recent English-language treatments the understanding of Hamann as an ‘irrationalist’, and one who simply opposed the Enlightenment with all his might; this however is not supported by the majority of Hamann scholars and is seen as a failure to understand the complexity of his thinking.

His principal writings include: Biblische Betrachtungen [Biblical Reflections], Gedanken über meinen Lebenslauf [Thoughts on the Course of my Life], Brocken [Fragments], Sokratische Denkwürdigkeiten [Socratic Memorabilia], Wolken [Clouds], Kreuzzüge des Philologen [Crusades of the Philologian], a collection of essays including Aesthetica in Nuce, Versuch über eine akademische Frage [Essay on an academic question], and Kleeblatt Hellenistischer Briefe [Cloverleaf of Hellenistic Letters]; Schriftsteller und Kunstrichter [Author and Critic], Leser und Kunstrichter [Reader and Critic], Fünf Hirtenbriefe [Five Pastoral Letters], Des Ritters von Rosencreuz letzte Willensmeynung über den göttlichen und menschlichen Urprung der Sprache [The Knight of the Rose-Cross' Last Will and Testament on the divine and human origin of language], Philologische Einfälle und Zweifel [Philological Ideas and Doubts], Hierophantische Briefe [Hierophantic Letters], Versuch einer Sibylle über die Ehe [Essay of a Sibyl on Marriage], Konxompax, Metakritik über den Purismum der Vernunft [Metacritique of the Purism of Reason], Golgotha und Scheblimini [Golgotha and Scheblimini], Fliegender Brief [Flying Letter].

3. Metacritique

At the end of his life, Hamann chose to designate his authorship as “Metacritique”, a word he coined for his engagement with Kant's Critique of Pure Reason. Instead of creating a systematic theology, or an epistemology, he seems to have seen his work as one that examines the foundations and nature of philosophical and theological critique itself. Rather like the late Wittgenstein, his work was deconstructive; he belongs in the camp of philosophers whom Richard Rorty has described as “edifying and therapeutic” rather than “constructive and systematic” (Rorty, 5-6). He brings to any issue in philosophy not a constructive account, but an approach, a set of convictions, something akin to ethical principles. He anticipated Rorty's emphasis on the curative aspects of this task; at the end of his life, he wanted his collected works to be published under the title “Curative Baths” (“Saalbadereyen” — a reference to healing practices of the time and an allusion to his father's profession.) Each volume was to be called a ‘Tub’. This project was sadly never realized, not even under a more conventional title.

One abiding characteristic of Hamann's many responses to the philosophy of his time, therefore, is this ‘metacritical’ instinct: not to construct a rival account, but to go for the jugular; not to set up a rival critique, but to insist that critique itself must be subject to meta-critique, which concerns itself with the issues that must be attended to in relation to the act of philosophical reflection itself. It consists of attention to the fundamental stance or position on issues or insights that must underlie any work on philosophy or theology. According to Hamann, often “the difficulties lie in womb of the concepts” (N III, 31, 21). Hamann's writing therefore is not so much ‘unsystematic’ as is sometimes said, but ‘presystematic’. He addresses issues that must be recognized in any self-critical reflection, matters that must be presuppositions for any system. Thus one of the most salient features of his “Metacritique of the Purism of Reason”, his unpublished response to Kant's Critique of Pure Reason, was to focus on the question of language. Through a tissue of imagery, he suggests that a proper view of language implies that the alleged ‘purity’ of a priori reason is untenable.

These metacritical issues, for Hamann, principally include language, knowledge, and the nature of the human person. Hamann also, most urgently and most controversially (then as now), did not believe that any of these issues can be answered outside a theological perspective; that is, without reference to God as humanity's creator and dialogue partner.

4. Relation

A second feature of Hamann's approach is a tendency which Goethe saw as holism. This is perhaps not the best way to describe Hamann's insight, as Hamann characteristically emphasised the brokenness of human experience, and fragmentariness of human knowledge: “Gaps and lacks … is the highest and deepest knowledge of human nature, through which we must climb our way up to the ideal — ideas and doubts — the summum bonum of our reason” (ZH 3, 34:33-35). Hamann essentially disliked attempts to isolate the phenomenon under consideration from other aspects with which he felt it to be intimately connected; this precludes a deep and true understanding of our existence. Taken as far as he did, this means that philosophy of language must include a discussion of God, and a discussion of God must make reference to sexuality and vice versa.

Thus in “Essay of a Sibyl on Marriage”, which he takes as an opportunity to write about sex, a proper understanding of human sexuality and erotic enjoyment cannot be understood without seeing humanity as the creature of God, made in God's image. He plays with the Christian idea of God as a Trinity to depict a trinity of woman-man-God in the moment of lovemaking; and reworks the account of the creation of Adam in Genesis to describe the act of coitus itself. The woman on perceiving her lover in his excitement sees ‘that rib’ and cries out in enthusiastic appropriation, ‘That is bone of my bone and flesh of my flesh!’ The man then ‘fills the hole of the place with flesh’ (as Genesis describes God doing with Adam after the creation of Eve). In doing so the lover also acknowledges that the origin of a man is in woman's body: the ‘Sibyl’ describes this moment of lovemaking as ”he entered in whence he once came forth.” Indeed, as Christ was born of a woman, the salvation of humanity proceeds from a woman's sexual body; the vagina is also described as the place that the Saviour came forth as the body's healer (the German language permits Hamann here to pun on ‘healer’ and ‘saviour’). This inclination to combine topics more often kept separate (such as ‘the concept of God’ and ‘having sex’) is salient throughout his work.

5. The Union of Opposites

Hamann's tool for conceiving the interrelation of these dimensions of human life increasingly was the Principle of the Union of Opposites. He writes approvingly of this principle to his friends; particularly after his encounter with Kant's new epistemology, claiming to value it more than the principles of contradiction and of sufficient reason, and indeed more than the whole Kantian Critique (ZH 5, 327:12ff; ZH 4, 462:7-8). Contradictions and apparent oppositions fill our experience:

Yes, daily at home I have the experience that one must always contradict oneself from two viewpoints, [which] never can agree, and that it is impossible to change these viewpoints into the other without doing the greatest violence to them. Our knowledge is piecemeal — no dogmatist is in a position to feel this great truth, if he is to play his role and play it well; and through a vicious circle of pure reason skepsis itself becomes dogma (ZH 5, 432:29-36). (This is in the context of a discussion of Kant.)

Far from being a pre-condition for truth, the absence of contradiction is in Hamann's eyes a pre-condition for dogmatism. Knowledge must not proceed on the basis of unanimity and the absence of contradiction, but must proceed through the dialogue and relation of these different voices. (Hamann does not think in terms of Hegel's later dialectical synthesis.) When Hamann speaks of ‘opposition’ and contradictions, however, he does so in an ironic tone; for it is clearly his conviction that there is a fundamental unity in things, and the oppositions and contradictions that we perceive are chiefly of our own making. He insists that his perception is ‘without Manichaeism’ (ZH 5, 327:16-17). Body and mind, senses and reason, reason and passion are not truly opposed. These are contrasting elements of the same unified — unified but not homogenous — reality. Hamann tries to steer a course between Scylla and Charybdis: between the dogmatic, even tyrannical extermination of opposition and contradiction; and the elimination of contradiction through a false synthesis or fusion achieved by an apparent acceptance of antithetical realities.

The Principle of the Union of Opposites as a tactical tool, therefore, does not imply that Hamann sees the world in terms of divisions and dualism. It is his strategy for coping with the schematic antitheses abundant in Enlightenment philosophy.

Nothing seems easier than the leap from one extreme to the other, and nothing so difficult as the union to a center. … [The Union of Opposites] always seems to me to be the one sufficient reason of all contradictions — and the true process of their resolution and mediation, that makes an end to all feuds of healthy reason and pure unreason. (ZH 4, 287:5-17)

6. ‘Prosopopoeia’

Hamann used the notion of ‘Prosopopoeia’, or personification, as an image of what can happen in philosophical reflection. In a medieval morality or mystery play, the experience of being chaste or being lustful is transformed from a way of acting or feeling into a dramatic character who then speaks and acts as a personification of that quality. So too in philosophy, Hamann suggests. The philosopher distinguishes differing aspects in the phenomenon under scrutiny and exaggerates their difference. These aspects are ennobled into faculties, and through ‘prosopopoeia’ are hypostasized into entities. Thus in the act of reflecting on something, ‘reasoning’ is distinguished from ‘feeling’, and turned from a verb or gerund into a noun — ‘reason’—which is then named as a constituent of our being. Reason then becomes a thing to which we can ascribe properties. (This shows perhaps a streak bordering on nominalism in Hamann.)

The best example of this, and of Hamann's response, is his treatment of the word ‘reason’. Since he handles it with a kind of skepticism or even distaste, he is often called an ‘irrationalist’. It is clear however that Hamann puts a high value on certain ways of being reasonable and of reasoning activity. “Without language we would have no reason, without reason no religion, and without these three essential aspects of our nature, neither mind [Geist] nor bond of society” (N III, 231, 10-12).

Hamann's treatment of reason instead is a deconstruction, both of the prosopopoeic use of the word and the Enlightenment valuation of it. There is no such thing as reason — there is only reasoning. Reasoning, as something we do, is as fallible as we are, and as such is subject to our position in history, or own personality, or the circumstances of the moment. ‘It’ is therefore not a universal, healthy and infallible ‘faculty’ as Hamann's Enlightenment contemporaries often maintained:

Being, belief and reason are pure relations, which cannot be dealt with absolutely, and are not things but pure scholastic concepts, signs for understanding, not for worshipping, aids to awaken our attention, not to fetter it. (ZH 7, 165:7-11)

7. Enlightenment

Hamann is sometimes portrayed simply as an opponent of ‘the Enlightenment’. This presupposes of course that ‘the Enlightenment’ constitutes a unified stance on a number of philosophical issues, an assumption which is questionable. The majority of Hamann scholars today see his position in a more complex way. Hamann opposed many of the popular convictions of his time. However, Hamann fought his contemporaries on many fronts; often with areas of considerable agreement with some of his opponents. One example would be the way that he deployed Hume as a weapon against Enlightenment rationalism, not least against Kant (although Hamann was the one who introduced Kant to Hume's writings in the first place). Although Hamann, as a Christian, had profound disagreements with Hume's thought in its atheistic aspects, nevertheless he used Humean skepticism in his own deconstructive writings. Hume's doubts about the reliability and self-sufficiency of reason were grist to Hamann's mill. Hume's insistence that ‘belief’ underlies much of our thinking and reasoning was adopted and deployed by Hamann, often with a linguistic sleight of hand. By using the word ‘Glaube’ (which in German includes both ‘belief’ in an epistemic sense and ‘faith’ in a religious sense), Hamann could assert that ‘faith’, not rational grounds, underlies his contemporaries' high valuation of reason. Thus even the enthusiastic advocates of impartiality and ‘reason’, who are also skeptics about ‘blind faith’, have ultimately only faith as the ground for their convictions.

In one sense, however, Hamann can certainly be seen as a critic—or metacritic—of the Enlightenment. The question of what ‘Enlightenment’ consists in was a challenge Hamann through down to his contemporaries, from his debut with Socratic Memorabilia (1759) to the end of his life. It is instructive to juxtapose Kant's famous essay “An Answer to the Question: What is Enlightenment?” (1784) with Hamann's response in a letter to his acquaintance Christian Jacob Kraus. Kant defines enlightenment as the exit from ‘self-incurred minority’ (or ‘immaturity’ or ‘tutelage’), which arises from laziness and cowardice. (The ‘entire fairer sex’ in particular is said by Kant to regard the transition to maturity and thinking for oneself as difficult and dangerous). ‘Sapere aude!’ (‘Dare to know!’), Kant instructs the reader. However, while Kant urges the ‘public’ use of reason (use of reason as a scholar), he nevertheless claims that ‘private’ (we would perhaps say, ‘professional’) use of reason must be circumscribed, for example, for the clergyman, soldier, or taxpayer; they must simply obey. Moreover, Kant heaps praise on their monarch, Frederick the Great, whom Hamann deemed immoral and despotic.

The irony of being instructed to think for oneself, and being told to have the courage to know, was not lost on Hamann. More painful is the irony in being told to appreciate the freedom to think, but “believe, march, pay if the devil is not to take you” (Hamann's depiction of Kant's insistence that clergymen, soldiers and taxpayers must just obey orders). “What good to me is the festive garment of freedom when I am in a slave's smock at home?” Hamann asks, referring to Kant's approval of public use of reason but ‘private’ requirement to obey. In Hamann's view, the scholarly freedom to reflect, which Kant commends, is a luxury compared to the ethical imperative to question and debate in the professional and political sphere, which Kant restricts. “Thus the public use of reason and freedom is nothing but a dessert, a sumptuous dessert. The private use is the daily bread that we should give up for its sake. The self-incurred immaturity is just such a sneer as he makes at the whole fair sex, and which my three daughters will not put up with.”

Most urgently, therefore, Hamann objects to the allegation that this immaturity is ‘self-incurred’, rather than imposed on the people firstly by a despotic monarch, and secondly by intellectuals like Kant, with the ‘prattle and reasoning of those emancipated immature ones, who set themselves up as guardians’. ‘True enlightenment,’ Hamann concludes sarcastically, with an eye to the likes of Kant and Frederick, “consists in an emergence of the immature person from a supremely self-incurred guardianship.”

8. Language

Language is one of Hamann's most abiding philosophical concerns. From the beginning of his work, Hamann championed the priority which expression and communication, passion and symbol possess over abstraction, analysis and logic in matters of language. Neither logic nor even representation (in Rorty's sense) possesses the rights of the first-born. Representation is secondary and derivative rather than the whole function of language. Symbolism, imagery, metaphor have primacy; “Poetry is the mother-tongue of the human race” (N II, 197). To think that language is essentially a passive system of signs for communicating thoughts is to deal a deathblow to true language.

For all Hamann's emphasis in his earlier writings on passion and emotion, he does not equate language with emotional expression. This became clear in his engagement with the writing of his younger friend Herder on the origin of language. Language has a mediating relationship between our reflection, one another, and our world; and as it is not simply the cries of emotion of an animal, so too it is not a smothering curtain between us and the rest of reality. Language also has a mediating role between God and us. Hamann's answer to a debate of his time, the origin of language — divine or human?—is that its origin is found in the relationship between God and humanity. Typically he has the ‘Knight of the Rose-Cross’ express this in the form of a ‘myth’, rather than attempting to work out such a claim logically and systematically. Rewriting the story of the Garden of Eden, he describes this paradise as:

Every phenomenon of nature was a word,—the sign, symbol and pledge of a new, mysterious, inexpressible but all the more intimate union, participation and community of divine energies and ideas. Everything the human being heard from the beginning, saw with its eyes, looked upon and touched with its hands was a living word; for God was the word. (NIII, 32: 21-30)

This makes the origin of language as easy and natural as child's play.

By the end of his life, because of his engagement with Kant, the most urgent question among the relationships that constitute language is the relationship of language to thinking or ‘reason’. In his view, the central question of Kant's first Critique, the very possibility of a priori knowledge and of pure reason, depends on the nature of language. In a passage full of subtle allusions to Kantian passages and terms, he writes:

Indeed, if a chief question does remain: how is the power to think possible?—The power to think right and left, before and without, with and above experience? then it does not take a deduction to prove the genealogical priority of language…. Not only the entire ability to think rests on language... but language is also the crux of the misunderstanding of reason with itself. (N III, 286:1-10)

Language is forced to take part in the ‘purification of philosophy’, as he describes it in his Metacritique of Kant: the attempt to expunge experience and tradition from rational reflection. Language itself is the final victim in this threefold ‘purification’. It is for this reason however that language can constitute the cure for philosophy. Language is the embodiment of experience and tradition; as long as the ability to think rests on language, neither ‘reason’ nor ‘philosophy’ can be pure of the empirical, of experience, and of the experience of the others to whom we relate. It itself, for Hamann, embodies a relation: it itself is a ‘union of opposites’, of the aesthetic and the logical, the bodily and the intellectual; it unites the divisions Kant's Critique creates.

For Hamann, in contrast to Kant, the question is therefore not so much ‘what is reason?’ as ‘what is language?’, as he writes in a letter. This is the ground of the paralogisms and antinomies that Kant raises in his Critique. Sharing Hume's empiricism and Berkeley's suspicion of universals and abstract terms, he concludes: “Hence it happens that one takes words for concepts, and concepts for the things themselves” (ZH 5, 264:34-265:1). Language then has a fundamental role to play in unmasking the philosopher's tendency to ‘prosopopoeia’. The relation of language to reason he certainly did not feel had solved, however, as he wrote to a friend:

If only I was as eloquent as Demosthenes, I would have to do no more than repeat a single word three times. Reason is language—Logos; I gnaw on this marrowbone and will gnaw myself to death over it. It is still always dark over these depths for me: I am still always awaiting an apocalyptic angel with a key to this abyss. (ZH 5, 177:16-21)

9. Knowledge

For Hamann, knowledge is inseparable from self-knowledge, and self-knowledge inseparable from knowledge of the other. We are visible, as in a mirror, in each other; “God and my neighbor are therefore a part of my self-knowledge, my self-love” (N I, 302:16-23). He writes in a letter: “Self knowledge begins with the neighbor, the mirror, and just the same with true self-love; that goes from the mirror to the matter” (ZH 6, 281:16-17). Sometimes this exploration of self-knowledge through interpersonal intimacy takes a sexual form, as in the Sibyl's Essay on Marriage (already discussed).

All forms of knowledge, of learning and development even of the most natural functions, require the help of another. (The ‘Knight of the Rose Cross’, while jesting with Hume, tells us ironically that even eating and drinking, and indeed excretion, are not instinctual or innate but require teaching.) (N III, 28:26-28; N III, 29:7-10) This is conceived not only in such immediately interpersonal ways, but also more widely in the context of the community. The indispensability of ‘the other’ for knowledge is also the reason that Hamann gives the importance he does to tradition in the formation of knowledge. “Our reason arises, at the very least, from this twofold lesson of sensuous revelations and human testimonies” (N III 29:28-30). Years before Kant's first Critique, Hamann attempts to relate the senses and the understanding and their roles in knowledge, using a characteristically concrete metaphor: the senses are like the stomach, the understanding like blood vessels. Not only do the blood vessels need the stomach to receive the nourishment that they distribute; the stomach also needs the blood vessels to function. This insistence on the mutual dependency and interrelation of sense experience and understanding (as opposed to many Enlightenment views that plumped for either reason or the senses as the dominant party) was refined in his engagement with Kant's critique. Throughout his life, he was neither materialist, purely empiricist or positivist, nor idealist, rationalist or intellectualist in his epistemology. Rather, he is firmly against dividing knowledge or ways of knowing into different kinds. “The philosophers have always given truth a bill of divorce, by separating what nature has joined together and vice versa” (N III, 40: 3-5). With Kant's critique, the problem becomes still more urgent; Kant's treatment of the issue is a “violent, unwarranted, obstinate divorce of what nature has joined together”. Revising Kant's metaphor of sensibility and understanding as two stems of human knowledge, he suggests we see knowledge as a single stem with two roots. Thus he rejects the division of what can be known a priori from what can be known a posteriori, and many of the consequences of such a stance. Here again he reaches for the ‘Principle of the Union of Opposites’ in his deployment of imagery to suggest a different approach. The relation of the senses and understanding is a ‘hypostatic union’, a ‘communicatio idiomatum’ (phrases borrowed from Christian theological discussion of how the two natures of divine and human are united in Christ). This mysterious union can only be revealed and understood by ‘ordinary language’. (In suggesting that the problems in philosophy can be cured by attending to ‘ordinary language’, he clearly anticipates the late Wittgenstein).

In this engagement with Kant, Hamann returns and deepens the lesson he had learnt much earlier in his reading of Hume: that belief or faith is an essential precursor for knowledge. Everything is dependent or grounded on faith; there is no privileged position for any kind or form of knowledge (a priori, scientific, etc.) In Hamann's epistemology, the hard division between ‘knowledge’ and ‘belief’ or ‘faith’ becomes eroded. Both knowledge and faith rest on a foundation of trust; neither rest on a foundation of indubitability. “Every philosophy consists of certain and uncertain knowledge, of idealism and realism, of sensuousness and deductions. Why should only the uncertain be called belief? What then are—rational grounds?” (ZH 7, 165:33-37) ‘Sensuousness’ translates Sinnlichkeit (Kant's ‘sensibility’). Belief and reason both need each other; idealism and realism are a fantasized opposition, of which the authentic use of reason knows nothing. The unity that lies in the nature of things should lie at the foundation of all our concepts and reflection (ZH 7, 165:7-17).

10. Interpretation and Understanding

From his ‘debut’ work, Socratic Memorabilia, Hamann began to promulgate a particular view of what it means to understand something. From the beginning of that essay he emphasized the importance of passion and commitment in interpretation; undermining the more conventional assumption that objectivity and detachment are prerequisites of philosophical reflection and understanding. In Aesthetica in Nuce, wearing the authorial mask of the ‘kabbalistic philologian’, he provocatively maintained that initiation into orgies were necessary before the interpreter could safely begin the hermeneutical act. The idea that one must rid oneself of presuppositions, prejudices, and predilections in order to do justice to the subject matter he characterizes as ‘monastic rules’—i.e. an excessive asceticism and abstinence. He goes so far as to compare such individuals to self-castrating eunuchs (N II, 207:10-20).

Hamann's skepticism about neutrality and objectivity does not make him a ‘subjectivist’, however. The stance and disposition of the interpreter is integral, helpful, indeed, indispensable and must be acknowledged; but limitless subjectivity arouses Hamann's scorn. Those who ‘flood the text’ with glosses and marginalia, “dreaming up one's own inspiration and interpretation,” Hamann likens to the blind leading the blind (N II, 208:3ff).

The constraints which Hamann places on the interpreter's subjectivity are not those usually advocated, therefore: an avoidance of prejudice and pre-conceptions; an amnesia for one's own history, tradition and culture; an obedience to exegetical rules. The first restraint on subjective distortion is the interpreter's own common sense; the last is the reaction of the text itself: “what are you trying to make of me?” The interpreter's freedom is inextricable from the interpreter's respect and responsibility, in Hamann's view.

The responsible interpreter is conscious of standing within something larger than oneself: a tradition. The wise interpreter is a kabbalist, one who interprets an ancient text, and a rhapsodist—the original meaning of the latter being one who stitches something together from pre-existing materials. (In Ancient Greece the ‘rhapsodist’ was one who recited poems cobbled together from prior sources, usually bits of Homer.) In creating interpretations, the interpreter enjoys the freedom to create anew, as Hamann created his characteristic prose from pre-existing texts, while creating a new meaningful piece. Hamann's use of this genre itself makes the point: the demand that only one meaning may exist for a text arises from an impoverished notion of meaning and creativity; one that misunderstands the nature of composition and the nature of interpretation alike.

Hamann's rejected both exegetical ‘materialism’ and ‘idealism’, as he called them — literalism and excessive flights of fancy. In thus insisting on the integrity of ‘the letter and the spirit’, he means to preserve the place of author, text and reader alike. Both meaning and interpretation rest in a three-way relationship.

For Hamann, the depth and meaning of a text go beyond the author's own contribution, and are the responsibility of the interpreter: “Few authors understand themselves, and a proper reader must not only understand his author but also be able to see beyond him” (ZH 6, 22:10-12). And yet this recognition that the author's opinions and intentions do not exhaust the possibilities of the text does not annihilate the place of the author. At the very least, the ‘beyond’ of the text includes a territory which, if unknown to the author, is not unrelated: that is, the author's own unconscious workings and meanings. It is not accidental that Hamann observes not that few authors understand their own text, but that few authors understand themselves. This suggests a picture of creation in which more of the author is expressed in a text and entrusted to the interpreter than the author's conscious intentions and opinions. This in turn suggests a picture of interpretation—of “understanding one's hero” as Hamann put it when writing about Socrates—in which greater sensitivity, insight, and fidelity is demanded of the interpreter than would otherwise be the case. Above all, the interpreter must have the courage to be a kabbalist; that is, to say more than the text does, not to express oneself but to say what the author left unsaid. The fruits of such faithful creativity may be impossible to ‘justify’ or ‘verify’ to the demands of the objectivist, however.

Fundamentally, for Hamann hermeneutics consists in perceiving the underlying relationship beneath the phenomenon in question; at the least, of course, the relationship between the author and the interpreter which requires such fidelity. Given Hamann's religious views, this at once introduces a theological dimension. Ultimately, this means that for Hamann proper hermeneutics rests on one thing: perceiving God revealed within the phenomenon, whether that be nature or history (cf. Socratic Memorabilia and Aesthetica in Nuce for examples). Even the interpretation of ourselves is a revelation of God; a recognition of whose image solves all the most complicated knots and riddles of our nature (N II, 206:32-207:2; 198:3-5).

11. Humanity

The topics examined so far all have their anthropological implications. Hamann's critique of the socio-political implications of Kant's vision of ‘enlightenment’ rests on a conviction about our social and political destiny. Hamann sees our socio-political vocation as consisting firstly in ‘criticism’ (or ‘critique’)—recognizing and appropriating, or hating and rejecting, the true vs. the false, good vs. evil, beautiful vs. ugly; and secondly in ‘politics’, which is increasing or reducing them. This is not the prerogative of the ruler; every one is at once their own ‘king’, their own ‘legislator’; but also the ‘first-born of their subjects’. It is our “republican privilege” to contribute to this destiny, “the critical and magisterial office of a political animal” (N III, 38-39).

The concepts of knowledge and language and their many facets also imply a particular anthropology: the diversity yet integration of the human being. For Hamann, the truest picture of humanity is of diversity in unity; a number of different, often contrasting aspects and features together composing the human person. Hamann consequently did not confine his attention to epistemology and reason when considering what human beings are, and passion, the thirst for vengeance, and sexual ecstasy form a part of his picture as well. (In response to the Enlightenment aesthetic of art as the imitation of ‘beautiful nature’, Hamann's ironic observation was: “The thirst for vengeance was the beautiful nature which Homer imitated” (ZH 2, 157:12).)

The theme of interdependence between human beings, which was emphasized in his epistemology, also has its roots in his understanding of what it is to be human. We are not self-sufficient; but for Hamann, even our lacks and failings have a positive thrust, this signifier of dependency making us all the more suited for the enjoyment of nature and one another.

If there is a fundamental key to his thinking on humanity, it is the idea that the human being is the image of God. This is admittedly more theological than philosophical, but is essential for understanding Hamann's philosophical anthropology. Hamann's treatment of this perennial theme is hardly conventional in the history of Christian thinking. While the experience of sinfulness and wickedness is a powerful theme, particularly in his earlier, post-conversion writing, the fundamental thrust of his thinking is the easy exchange between the human and the divine. In this exchange, language is “the sign, symbol and pledge of a new, mysterious, inexpressible but all the more intimate union, participation and community of divine energies and ideas” (N III, 32:21-24). Despite his reputation for being an irrationalist, reasoning too relates us to God; God, nature and reason are described as having the same relation as light, the eye and what we see, or as author, text and reader (ZH 5, 272:14-16).

One must also remember that Hamann confessed that he could not conceive of a Creative Spirit without genitalia; indeed, he was quite happy to assert that the genitals are the unique bond between creature and Creator. So sexuality in divine-human relations has two aspects. First, as paradigm of creativity, it is the way in which our God-likeness can most strikingly be seen. Secondly, as the point of the most profound unity, it is the locus for our union both with another human being and with the divine. Provocatively, Hamann sees original sin and its rebellion as embodied not in sexuality, but in reason. Overweening reason is our attempt to be like God; meanwhile, prudery is the rejection of God's image, while trying to be like God in the wrong sense (bodilessness). (See Essay of a Sibyl on Marriage and Konxompax.) One should therefore distinguish ‘likeness to God’ from ‘being equal to God’. In the Sibyl's essay, the male version of grasping at equality with God (cf. Phil. 2:6) is the attempt to be self-sufficient, to be the God of monotheism: the sole ruler, who possesses self-existence. Instead, the encounter with the opposite sex should engender in the man an attitude of profound respect towards the woman's body, as the source of his own existence, from his mother. As the source of his own joy, lovemaking also is an acknowledgement of his own dependence, his lack of self-sufficiency and autonomy. But this dependence on another paradoxically is the Godlikeness of the Creator, the father, the one who humbles himself in self-giving (a favourite Hamannian theme in his discussion of God). Meanwhile, the woman's temptation is to an artificial innocence; a secret envy of God's incorporeality and impassibility. The defence of one's virginity is another cryptic attempt at self-sufficiency. Instead, the woman must brave the ‘tongues of fire’ in a ‘sacrifical offering of innocence’, in order to realize her Godlikeness; which is not to be found in bodilessness and the absence of passion, but in passionate creativity; in the willingness to be incarnate. Thus, if human beings are in the image of God, it is a trinitarian image of God, a mutual relation of love of ‘Father’, ‘Son’ and ‘Spirit’; found in creating, in saving, and in tongues of fire.


Hamann's writings

Hamann's works, including those unpublished in his lifetime, are reprinted in the collection edited by Josef Nadler:

Citations from this source, in conformity with common practice for Hamann references, are given above as: N II, 13:10. This means “Nadler's edition, volume two, page thirteen, line ten.” This same mode of reference also applies to the translations in Gwen Griffith Dickson (see below), wherein the pages are laid out in as close an approximation as possible to Nadler's edition.

Hamann's Letters

Citations from this source are given as: ZH 4 etc. as above.

All translations from Hamann's works and letters in the above article are from Gwen Griffith Dickson (see below) except for the translation from the letter to Kraus, which is cited in the translation by Garrett Green, in Schmidt, James (ed.). What is Enlightenment? Eighteenth-Century Answers and Twentieth-Century Questions. Berkeley and Los Angeles: University of California Press, 1996.

Other selections

Other editions and commentaries, in German

English translations and commentaries

Monographs and studies in English

Literature reviews

The International Hamann-Colloquium

The International Hamann-Colloquium meets every few years. Collections of its papers are some of the most important contributions to Hamann scholarship:

Secondary Sources

Other Internet Sources

Related Entries

Berkeley, George | Hegel, Georg Wilhelm Friedrich | Herder, Johann Gottfried von | Hume, David | Jacobi, Friedrich Heinrich | Kant, Immanuel | Kierkegaard, Søren | Rorty, Richard