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Richard Rorty

First published Sat Feb 3, 2001; substantive revision Sat Jun 16, 2007

Richard Rorty (1931–2007) developed a distinctive and controversial brand of pragmatism that expressed itself along two main axes. One is negative—a critical diagnosis of what Rorty takes to be defining projects of modern philosophy. The other is positive—an attempt to show what intellectual culture might look like, once we free ourselves from the governing metaphors of mind and knowledge in which the traditional problems of epistemology and metaphysics (and indeed, in Rorty's view, the self-conception of modern philosophy) are rooted. The centerpiece of Rorty's critique is the provocative account offered in Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature (1979, hereafter PMN). In this book, and in the closely related essays collected in Consequences of Pragmatism (1982, hereafter CP), Rorty's principal target is the philosophical idea of knowledge as representation, as a mental mirroring of a mind-external world. Providing a contrasting image of philosophy, Rorty has sought to integrate and apply the milestone achievements of Dewey, Hegel and Darwin in a pragmatist synthesis of historicism and naturalism. Characterizations and illustrations of a post-epistemological intellectual culture, present in both PMN (part III) and CP (xxxvii-xliv), are more richly developed in later works, such as Contingency, Irony, and Solidarity (1989, hereafter CIS), in the popular essays and articles collected in Philosophy and Social Hope (1999), and in the four volumes of philosophical papers, Objectivity, Relativism, and Truth (1991, hereafter ORT); Essays on Heidegger and Others (1991, hereafter EHO); Truth and Progress (1998, hereafter TP); and Philosophy as Cultural Politics (2007, hereafter PCP). In these writings, ranging over an unusually wide intellectual territory, Rorty offers a highly integrated, multifaceted view of thought, culture, and politics, a view that has made him one of the most widely discussed philosophers in our time.

1. Biographical Sketch

Richard Rorty was born on October 4th, 1931, in New York City. He grew up, as he recounts in Achieving Our Country (1998, hereafter AC), "on the anti-communist reformist Left in mid-century" (AC 59), within a circle combining anti-Stalinism with leftist social activism. "In that circle," Rorty tells us, "American patriotism, redistributionist economics, anticommunism, and Deweyan pragmatism went together easily and naturally." (AC 61) In 1946 Rorty went to the University of Chicago, to a philosophy department which at that time included Rudolph Carnap, Charles Hartshorne, and Richard McKeon, all of whom were Rorty's teachers. After receiving his BA in 1949, Rorty stayed on at Chicago to complete an M.A. (1952) with a thesis on Whitehead supervised by Hartshorne. From 1952 to 1956 Rorty was at Yale, where he wrote a dissertation entitled "The Concept of Potentiality." His supervisor was Paul Weiss. After the completion of his Ph.D., followed by two years in the army, Rorty received his first academic appointment, at Wellesley College. In 1961, after three years at Wellesley, Rorty moved to Princeton University where he stayed until he went to the University of Virginia, in 1982, as Kenan Professor of the Humanities. Rorty left the University of Virginia in 1998, accepting an appointment in the Department of Comparative Literature at Stanford University. In the course of his career, Rorty received several academic awards and honours, including a Guggenheim Fellowship (1973-74) and a MacArthur Fellowship (1981-1986). He held a number of prestigious lectureships, giving, among others, the Northcliffe Lectures at University College, London (1986), the Clark Lectures at Trinity College, Cambridge (1987), and the Massey Lectures at Harvard (1997). Rorty died June 8, 2007.

2. Against Epistemology

On Rorty's account, modern epistemology is not only an attempt to legitimate our claim to knowledge of what is real, but also an attempt to legitimate philosophical reflection itself—a pressing task, on many accounts, once the advent of the so-called new science of the sixteenth and seventeenth century gradually gave content to a notion of knowledge obtained by the methodological interrogation of nature herself. Because the result of this kind of interrogation, theoretical empirical knowledge, is so obviously fruitful, and also carries with it seemingly uncontentious norms of progress, its mere presence poses a legitimation challenge to a form of thought, and claim to knowledge, that is distinct from it. Cartesian epistemology, in Rorty's picture, is designed to meet this challenge. It is sceptical in a fundamental way; sceptical doubts of a Cartesian sort, that is, doubts that can be raised about any set of empirical claims whatever, and so cannot be alleviated by experience, are tailor-made to preserve at once a domain and a job for philosophical reflection. Rorty's aim in PMN is to undermine the assumptions in light of which this double legitimation project makes sense.

2.1 Epistemological Behaviorism

That any vocabulary is optional and mutable is the basic conviction behind Rorty's attack on representationalist epistemology carried out in PMN. It informs, for instance, the genealogy (chapter one) and deconstruction (chapter two) of the concept of mind offered in the book's first part, "Our Glassy Essence." This historicist conviction, however, is not itself a central theme of PMN, and it emerges for explicit discussion only in the final section of the book, "Philosophy," which is the shortest and in some ways least developed of its three parts. The argumentative core of PMN is found in its second part, "Mirroring". Here Rorty develops and extends a diverse lot of arguments—notably from Wilfrid Sellars, Willard van Orman Quine, Thomas Kuhn, Ludwig Wittgenstein, and Donald Davidson—into a general critique of the defining project of modern epistemology, viz. the conceptions of mind, of knowledge and of philosophy bequeathed by the 17th and 18th centuries. Rorty's key claim is that "the Kantian picture of concepts and intuitions getting together to produce knowledge is needed to give sense to the idea of ‘theory of knowledge’ as a specifically philosophical discipline, distinct from psychology." (PMN 168). According to Rorty,

This is equivalent to saying that if we do not have the distinction between what is "given" and what is "added by the mind," or that between the "contingent" (because influenced by what is given) and the necessary (because entirely "within" the mind and under its control), then we will not know what would count as a "rational reconstruction" of our knowledge. We will not know what epistemology's goal or method could be. (PMN 168-9)

Epistemology, in Rorty's account, is wedded to a picture of mind's structure working on empirical content to produce in itself items—thoughts, representations—which, when things go well, correctly mirror reality. To loosen the grip of this picture on our thinking is to challenge the idea that epistemology—whether traditional Cartesian or 20th century linguistic—is the essence of philosophy. To this end, Rorty combines a reading of Quine's attack on a version of the structure-content distinction in "Two Dogmas of Empiricism" (1952), with a reading of Sellars' attack on the idea of givenness in "Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind" (1956/1997). On Rorty's reading, though neither Sellars nor Quine is able fully to take in the liberating influence of the other, they are really attacking the same distinction, or set of distinctions. While Quine casts doubt on the notion of structure or meaning which linguistically-turned epistemology had instated in place of mental entities, Sellars, questioning the very idea of givenness, came at the distinction from the other side:

…Sellars and Quine invoke the same argument, one which bears equally against the given-versus-nongiven and the necessary-versus-contingent distinctions. The crucial premise of this argument is that we understand knowledge when we understand the social justification of belief, and thus have no need to view it as accuracy of representation. (PMN 170)

The upshot of Quine's and Sellars' criticisms of the myths and dogmas of epistemology is, Rorty suggests, that "we see knowledge as a matter of conversation and of social practice, rather than as an attempt to mirror nature." (PMN 171) Rorty provides this view with a label: "Explaining rationality and epistemic authority by reference to what society lets us say, rather than the latter by the former, is the essence of what I shall call ‘epistemological behaviorism,’ an attitude common to Dewey and Wittgenstein." (PMN 174)

Epistemological behaviorism leaves no room for the kind of practice-transcending legitimation that Rorty identifies as the defining aspiration of modern epistemology. Assuming that epistemic practices do, or at least can, diverge, it is not surprising that Rorty's commitment to epistemological behaviorism should lead to charges of relativism or subjectivism. Indeed, many who share Rorty's historicist scepticism toward the transcending ambitions of epistemology—friendly critics like Hilary Putnam, John McDowell and Daniel Dennett—balk at the idea that there are no constraints on knowledge save conversational ones. Yet this is a central part of Rorty's position, repeated and elaborated as recently as in TP and PCP. Indeed, in TP he invokes it precisely in order to deflect this sort of criticism. In "Hilary Putnam and the Relativist Menace," Rorty says:

In short, my strategy for escaping the self-referential difficulties into which "the Relativist" keeps getting himself is to move everything over from epistemology and metaphysics into cultural politics, from claims to knowledge and appeals to self-evidence to suggestions about what we should try. (TP 57)

That epistemological behaviorism differs from traditional forms of relativism and subjectivism is easier to see in light of Rorty's criticism of the notion of representation, and the cluster of philosophical images which surround it.

2.2 Antirepresentationalism

Rorty's enduring attitude to relativism and subjectivism is that both are products of the representationalist paradigm. Though the theme is explicit in PM and CP ("Pragmatism, Relativism, Irrationalism"), it is with Rorty's later and further appropriation of Davidson that his criticism of the idea of knowledge as representation becomes fully elaborated (ORT "Introduction" and Part II). Drawing on Davidson's criticism of the scheme-content distinction ("On the Very Idea of a Conceptual Scheme") and of the correspondence theory of truth ("The Structure and Content of Truth"), Rorty is able to back up his rejection of any philosophical position or project which attempts to draw a general line between what is made and what is found, what is subjective and what is objective, what is mere appearance and what is real. Rorty's position is not that these conceptual contrasts never have application, but that such application is always context and interest bound and that there is, as in the case of the related notion of truth, nothing to be said about them in general. Rorty's commitment to the conversationalist view of knowledge must therefore be distinguished from subjectivism or relativism, which, Rorty argues, presuppose the very distinctions he seeks to reject. Equally, Rorty's epistemological behaviorism must not be confused with an idealism that asserts a primacy of thought or language with respect to the unmediated world, since this, too, is a position that is undercut by Rorty's Davidsonian position. In light of the view of truth and of meaning that Rorty appropriates from Davidson, his conversationalism is not a matter of giving priority to the subjective over the objective, or to mind's power over world's constraint. Rather it is the other side of his anti-representationalism, which denies that we are related to the world in anything other than causal terms. Differently put, Rorty argues that we can give no useful content to the notion that the world, by its very nature, rationally constrains choices of vocabulary with which to cope with it. (TP "The Very Idea of Human Answerability to the World: John McDowell's Version of Empiricism").

2.3 Rationality, Science, and Truth

Attacking the idea that we must acknowledge the world's normative constraint on our belief-systems if we are to be rational subjects, Rorty has drawn a great deal of criticism that takes science, particularly natural science, as its chief reference point. Two general kinds of criticisms are often raised. The first insists that science consists precisely in the effort to learn the truth about how things are by methodically allowing us to be constrained in our beliefs by the world. On this view, Rorty is simply denying the very idea of science. The other kind of criticism seeks to be internal: if Rorty's view of science were to prevail, scientists would no longer be motivated to carry on as they are; science would cease to be the useful sort of thing that Rorty also thinks it is (see, eg., Bernard Williams, "Auto da Fe" in Malachowski). However, Rorty's view of science is more complicated than he himself sometimes implies. He says: "I tend to view natural science as in the business of controlling and predicting things, and as largely useless for philosophical purposes." ("Reply to Hartshorne," Saatkamp 32) Yet he spends a good deal of time drawing an alternative picture of the intellectual virtues that good science embodies (ORT Part I). This is a picture which eschews the notion that science succeeds, when it does, in virtue of being in touch with reality in a special way, the sort of way that epistemologists, when successful, can clarify. It is in this sense specifically that Rorty disavows science as philosophically significant. Good science may nevertheless be a model of rationality, in Rorty's view, exactly in so far as scientific practice has succeeded in establishing institutions conducive to democratic exchange of view.

The provocative and counterintuitive force of Rorty's treatment of rationality and science in terms of conversational ethics is undeniable. It is important to realize, though, that Rorty is not denying that there is any bona fide use of notions like truth, knowledge, or objectivity. Rather his point is that our ordinary uses of these notions always trade for their content and point on particular features of their varying contexts of application. His further point is that when we abstract away from these different contexts and practices, in search of general notions, we are left with pure abstract hypostatizations incapable of providing us with any guide to action at all. The upshot, Rorty holds, is that we simply do not have a concept of objective reality which can be invoked either to explain the success of some set of norms of warrant, or to justify some set of standards over against others. This is perhaps clearest in Rorty's treatment of the concept of truth. With regard to truth, Rorty's rhetoric and philosophical strategy has indeed shifted over the last three decades. As late as in 1982 (in CP) he still attempted to articulate his view of truth by drawing on William James's famous definition in terms of what is good in the way of belief. Soon after this, however, Rorty comes to doubt the point of any theory of truth, and, following Davidson's lead explicitly rejects all attempts to explicate the notion of truth in terms of other concepts. Rorty's mature view of the point and significance of the concept of truth is first elaborated in "Davidson, Pragmatism and Truth," in ORT. Recent expressions are found in the first of the two Spinoza Lectures given at the University of Amsterdam in 1997, "Is it Desirable to Love truth?", in the paper, "Is Truth a Goal of Inquiry? Donald Davidson versus Crispin Wright" (TP), as well as in the introductions to, respectively, TP and PSH. In these writings Rorty argues that while "truth" has various important uses, it does not itself name a goal towards which we can strive, over and above warrant or justification. His argument is not that truth is reducible to warrant, but that the concept has no deep or substantive criterial content at all. That is, there are only semantic explanations to be offered for why it is the case that a given sentence is true just when its truth conditions are satisfied. So aiming for truth, as opposed to warrant, does not point to a possible line of action, just as we have no measure of our approximation to truth other than increasing warrant. Indeed, for Rorty, this is part of what makes the concept so useful, in a manner not coincidentally analogous with goodness; it ensures that no sentence can ever be analytically certified as true by virtue of its possession of some other property. Rorty's attitude to the concept of truth has been much criticized, often on the grounds that the very notion of warrant, indeed the concept of belief in general, presupposes the notion of truth. However, it may be that we can do justice to these connections without supposing that the notion of truth thus involved backs up the notions of belief and warrant with any substantive normative content of its own. Indeed, that neither the concept of truth, nor those of objectivity and of reality, can be invoked to explain or legitimate our inferential practices and our standards of warrant, is the essence of Rorty's conversationalism, or epistemological behaviorism.

3. Pragmatized Culture

Taking epistemological behaviorism to heart, Rorty urges, means that we can no longer construe the authority of science in terms of ontological claims. Though many disagree, this is not, for Rorty, to denigrate or weaken the authority of science. Indeed, a prominent feature of Rorty's post-metaphysical, post-epistemological culture, is a thoroughgoing Darwinian naturalism.

3.1 Naturalism

To be a naturalist in Rorty's sense,

is to be the kind of antiessentialist who, like Dewey, sees no breaks in the hierarchy of increasingly complex adjustments to novel stimulation—the hierarchy which has amoeba adjusting themselves to changed water temperature at the bottom, bees dancing and chess players check-mating in the middle, and people fomenting scientific, artistic, and political revolutions at the top. (ORT 109)

In Rorty's view, both Dewey's pragmatism and Darwinism encourage us to see vocabularies as tools, to be assessed in terms of the particular purposes they may serve. Our vocabularies, Rorty suggests, "have no more of a representational relation to an intrinsic nature of things than does the anteater's snout or the bowerbird's skill at weaving." (TP 48)

Pragmatic evaluation of various linguistically infused practices requires a degree of specificity. From Rorty's perspective, to suggest that we might evaluate vocabularies with respect to their ability to uncover the truth, would be like claiming to evaluate tools for their ability to help us get what we want—full stop. Is the hammer or the saw or the scissors better—in general? Questions about usefulness can only be answered, Rorty points out, once we give substance to our purposes.

Rorty's pragmatist appropriation of Darwin also defuses the significance of reduction. He rejects as representationalist the sort of naturalism that implies a program of nomological or conceptual reduction to terms at home in a basic science. Rorty's naturalism echoes Nietzsche's perspectivism; a descriptive vocabulary is useful insofar as the patterns it highlights are usefully attended to by creatures with needs and interests like ours. Darwinian naturalism, for Rorty, implies that there is no one privileged vocabulary whose purpose it is to serve as a critical touchstone for our various descriptive practices.

For Rorty, then, any vocabulary, even that of evolutionary explanation, is a tool for a purpose, and therefore subject to teleological assessment. Typically, Rorty justifies his own commitment to Darwinian naturalism by suggesting that this vocabulary is suited to further the secularization and democratization of society that Rorty thinks we should aim for. Accordingly, there is a close tie between Rorty's construal of the naturalism he endorses and his most basic political convictions.

3.2 Liberalism

Rorty is a self-proclaimed romantic bourgeois liberal, a believer in piecemeal reforms advancing economic justice and increasing the freedoms that citizens are able to enjoy. The key imperative in Rorty's political agenda is the deepening and widening of solidarity. Rorty is sceptical toward radicalism; political thought purporting to uncover hidden, systematic causes for injustice and exploitation, and on that basis proposing sweeping changes to set things right. (ORT Part III; EHO; CIS Part II; AC) The task of the intellectual, with respect to social justice, is not to provide refinements of social theory, but to sensitize us to the suffering of others, and refine, deepen and expand our ability to identify with others, to think of others as like ourselves in morally relevant ways. (EHO Part III; CIS Part III) Reformist liberalism with its commitment to the expansion of democratic freedoms in ever wider political solidarities is, on Rorty's view, an historical contingency which has no philosophical foundation, and needs none. Recognizing the contingency of these values and the vocabulary in which they are expressed, while retaining the commitments, is the attitude of the liberal ironist. (CIS essays 3,4) Liberal ironists have the ability to combine the consciousness of the contingency of their own evaluative vocabulary with a commitment to reducing suffering—in particular, with a commitment to combatting cruelty. (CIS essay 4, ORT Part III) They promote their cause through redescriptions, rather than arguments. The distinction between argumentative discourse and redescription corresponds to that between propositions and vocabularies. Change in belief may result from convincing argument. A change in what we perceive as interesting truth value candidates results from acquiring new vocabularies. Rorty identifies romanticism as the view that the latter sort of change is the more significant one. (CIS "Introduction", essay 1).

Rorty's romantic version of liberalism is expressed also in the distinction he draws between the private and the public. (CIS) This distinction is often misinterpreted to imply that certain domains of interaction or behaviour should be exempted from evaluation in moral or political or social terms. The distinction Rorty draws, however, has little to do with traditional attempts to draw lines of demarcation of this sort between a private and a public domain—to determine which aspects of our lives we do and which we don't have to answer for publically. Rorty's distinction, rather, goes to the purposes of theoretical vocabularies. We should, Rorty urges, be "content to treat the demands of self-creation and of human solidarity as equally valid, yet forever incommensurable." (CIS xv) Rorty's view is that we should treat vocabularies for deliberation about public goods and social and political arrangements, on the one hand, and vocabularies developed or created in pursuit of personal fulfilment, self-creation, and self-realization, on the other, as distinct tools.

3.3 Ethnocentrism

Rorty's liberal ironist, recognizing—indeed, affirming—the contingency of her own commitments, is explicitly ethnocentric. (ORT "Solidarity or Objectivity") For the liberal ironist,

…one consequence of antirepresentationalism is the recognition that no description of how things are from a God's-eye point of view, no skyhook provided by some contemporary or yet-to-be-developed science, is going to free us from the contingency of having been acculturated as we were. Our acculturation is what makes certain options live, or momentous, or forced, while leaving others dead, or trivial, or optional. (ORT 13)

So the liberal ironist accepts that bourgeois liberalism has no universality other than the transient and unstable one which time, luck, and discursive effort might win for it. This view looks to many readers like a version of cultural relativism. True, Rorty does not say that what is true, what is good, and what is right is relative to some particular ethnos, and so in that sense he is no relativist. But the worry about relativism, that it leaves us with no rational way to adjudicate conflict, seems to apply equally to Rorty's ethnocentric view. Rorty's answer is to say that in one sense of "rational" that is true, but that in another sense it is not, and to recommend that we drop the former. Rorty's position is that we have no notion of rational warrant that exceeds, or transcends, or grounds, the norms that liberal intellectuals take to define thorough, open-minded, reflective discussion. It is chimerical, Rorty holds, to think that the force or attractiveness of these norms can be enhanced by argument that does not presuppose them. It is pointless, equally, to look for ways of convicting those who pay them no heed of irrationality. Persuasion across such fundamental differences is achieved, if at all, by concrete comparisons of particular alternatives, by elaborate description and redescription of the kinds of life to which different practices conduce.

4. Rorty and Philosophy

The broad scope of Rorty's metaphilosophical deconstruction, together with a penchant for uncashed metaphor and swift, broad-stroke historical narrative, has gained Rorty a sturdy reputation as an anti-philosopher's philosopher. While his writing enjoys an unusual degree of popularity beyond the confines of the profession, Rorty's work is often regarded with suspicion and scepticism within academic philosophy.

4.1 Critical Responses

As we have seen in connection with Rorty's attitude to science, it is particularly Rorty's treatment of truth and knowledge that has drawn fire from philosophers. While a great variety of philosophers have criticized Rorty on this general score in a great variety of ways, it is not very difficult to discern a common concern; Rorty's conversationalist view of truth and knowledge leaves us entirely unable to account for the notion that a reasonable view of how things are is a view suitably constrained by how the world actually is. This criticism is levelled against Rorty not only from the standpoint of metaphysical and scientific realist views of the sort that Rorty hopes will soon be extinct. It is expressed also by thinkers who have some sympathy with Rorty's historicist view of intellectual progress, and his critique of Kantian and Platonist features of modern philosophy. Frank B. Farrell, for instance, argues that Rorty fails to appreciate Davidson's view on just this point, and claims that Rorty's conversationalist view of belief-constraint is a distorted, worldless, version of Davidson's picture of how communication between agents occurs. Similarly, John McDowell, while also critical of Davidson's epistemological views, claims that Rorty's view of the relation between agent and world as merely causal runs foul of the notion that our very concept of a creature with beliefs involves the idea of a rational constraint of the world on our epistemic states.

However, critics are concerned not only with what they see as a misguided view of belief, truth, and knowledge, whether relativist, subjectivist, or idealist in nature. An important reason for the high temperature of much of the debate that Rorty has inspired is that he appears to some to reject the very values that are the basis for any articulation of a philosophical view of truth and knowledge at all. Rorty is critical of the role of argument in intellectual progress, and dismissive of the very idea of theories of truth, knowledge, rationality, and the like. Philosophers such as Hilary Putnam and Susan Haack have increasingly focussed on this aspect of Rorty's views. Haack, in particular, frames criticism of Rorty along these lines in moral terms; to her mind, Rorty's efforts to abandon the basic concepts of traditional epistemology are symptoms of a vulgar cynicism, which contributes to the decline of reason and intellectual integrity that Haack and others find to be characteristic of much contemporary thought. The charge of intellectual irresponsibility is sometimes raised, or at last implied, in connection with Rorty's use of historical figures. Rorty's reading of Descartes and of Kant i PMN have often been challenged, as has his more constructive uses of Hegel, Nietzsche, Heidegger, and Wittgenstein. The kind of appropriation of other writers and thinkers that Rorty performs will at times seem to do violence to the views and intentions of the protagonists. Rorty, however, is quite clear about the rhetorical point and scholarly limitations of these kinds of redescriptions, as he explains in "The Historiography of Philosophy: Four Genres."

4.2 Claim to Pragmatism

One particularly contentious issue has arisen in connection with Rorty's appropriation of earlier philosophers; prominent readers of the classical American pragmatists have expressed deep reservations about Rorty's interpretation of Dewey and Peirce, in particular, and the pragmatist movement in general. Consequently, Rorty's entitlement to the label "pragmatist" has been challenged. For instance Susan Haack's strong claims on this score have received much attention, but there are many others. (See, for example, the discussions of Rorty in Thomas M. Alexander, 1987; Gary Brodsky, 1982; James Campbell, 1984; Abraham Edel, 1985; James Gouinlock, 1995; Lavine 1995; R.W: Sleeper, 1986; as well as the essays in Lenore Langdorf and Andrew R. Smith, 1995.) For Rorty, the key figure in the American pragmatist movement is John Dewey, to whom he attributes many of his own central doctrines. In particular, Rorty finds in Dewey an anticipation of his own view of philosophy as the hand-maiden of a humanist politics, of a non-ontological view of the virtues of inquiry, of a holistic conception of human intellectual life, and of an anti-essentialist, historicist conception of philosophical thought. To read Dewey his way, however, Rorty explicitly sets about separating the "good" from the "bad" Dewey. (See "Dewey's Metaphysics," CP, 72-89, and "Dewey between Hegel and Darwin", in Saatkamp, 1-15.) He is critical of what he takes to be Dewey's backsliding into metaphysics in Experience and Nature, and has no patience for the constructive attempt of Logic: The Theory of Inquiry. Rorty thus imposes a scheme of evaluation on Dewey's works which many scholars object to. Lavine, for instance, claims that "scientific method" is Dewey's central concept (Lavine 1995, 44). R.W. Sleeper holds that reform rather than elimination of metaphysics and epistemology is Dewey's aim (Sleeper 1986, 2, chapter 6).

Rorty's least favourite pragmatist is Peirce, whom he regards as subject to both scheme-content dualism and to a degree of scientism. So it is not surprising that Haack, whose own pragmatism draws inspiration from Peirce, finds Rorty's recasting of pragmatism literally unworthy of the name. Rorty's key break with the pragmatists is a fundamental one; to Haack's mind, by situating himself in opposition to the epistemological orientation of modern philosophy, Rorty ends up dismissing the very project that gave direction to the works of the American pragmatists. While classical pragmatism is an attempt to understand and work out a novel legitimating framework for scientific inquiry, Haack maintains, Rorty's "pragmatism" (Haack consistently uses quotes) is simply an abandonment of the very attempt to learn more about the nature and adequacy conditions of inquiry. Instead of aiding us in our aspiration to govern ourselves through rational thought, Rorty weakens our intellectual resilience and leaves us even more vulnerable to rhetorical seduction. To Haack and her sympathisers, Rorty's pragmatism is dangerous, performing an end-run on reason, and therefore on philosophy.

4.3 Analytic Philosophy

Nevertheless, the founding impulses of Western philosophy clearly express themselves in Rorty's fundamental concern with the connection between philosophical thinking and the pursuit of human happiness. Rorty's relationship to the traditions of Western philosophy is more nuanced than his reputation might suggest. So, too, is Rorty's relation to analytical philosophy in particular. Rorty is sometimes portrayed as a renegade, as someone who went through a transformation from bona fide analytical philosopher to something else, and then lived to tell a tale of liberation from youthful enchantment. This portrayal, however, distorts both Rorty's view of analytical philosophy and the trajectory of his thinking.

In the mid nineteen sixties, Rorty gained attention for his articulation of eliminative materialism (cf., "Mind-Body Identity, Privacy and Categories," 1965). Around that time, he also edited, and wrote a lengthy introduction to, a volume entitled The Linguistic Turn (1967, reissued with a new introduction in 1992). Though the introduction to the 1967 volume and the early papers in philosophy of mind show Rorty adopting frameworks for philosophical problems he has since dispensed with, these writings at the same time clearly bear the mark of the fundamental metaphilosophical attitude which becomes explicit in the next decade. In the "Preface" to PMN, referring to Hartshorne, McKeon, Carnap, Robert Brumbaugh, Carl Hempel, and Paul Weiss, Rorty says,

I was very fortunate in having these men as my teachers, but, for better or worse, I treated them all as saying the same thing: that a "philosophical problem" was a product of the unconscious adoption of a set of assumptions built into the vocabulary in which the problem was stated—assumptions which were to be questioned before the problem itself was taken seriously. (PMN xiii)

This way of stating the lesson, however, appears to leave open the possibility that certain philosophical problems eventually may legitimately be taken seriously—that is, at face value in the sense that they require constructive solutions—provided the assumptions which sustain their formulation stand up to proper critical scrutiny. Taken this way, the attitude Rorty here expresses would be more or less the same as that of all those philosophers who have diagnosed their predecessors' work as mixtures of pseudo-questions and genuine problems dimly glimpsed, problems which now, with the proper frame of questioning fully clarified, may be productively addressed. But the full force of the lesson Rorty learned emerges only with the view that this notion of proper critical scrutiny is illusory. For Rorty, to legitimate the assumptions on which a philosophical problem is based, would be to establish that the terms we require to pose it are mandatory, that the vocabulary in which we encounter it is in principle inescapable. But Rorty's construal of the linguistic turn, as well as his proposals for eliminating the vocabulary of the mental, are really at odds with the idea that we might hope to construct a definitive vocabulary for philosophy. Even in his early days, Rorty's approach to philosophy is shaped by the historicist conviction that no vocabularies are inescapable in principle. This means that progress in philosophy is gained less from constructive solutions to problems than through therapeutic dissolution of their causes, that is, through the invention of new vocabularies by the launch of new and fruitful metaphors. (PMN "Introduction"; ORT "Unfamiliar Noises: Hesse and Davidson on Metaphor")

To hold that no vocabulary is final is also to hold that no vocabulary can be free of unthematized yet optional assumptions. Hence any effort to circumvent a philosophical problem by making such assumptions visible is subject to its own circumvention. Accordingly, the fact that Rorty often distances himself from the terms in which he earlier framed arguments and made diagnoses is in itself no reason to impose on him, as some have done, a temporal dichotomy. It may be that Rorty's early work, inspired by a less critical, less dialectical reading of Quine and Sellars than that offered in PMN, is more constructive than therapeutic in tone and jargon, and therefore from Rorty's later perspective in an important sense misguided. However, what ties together all Rorty's work, over time and across themes, is his complete lack of faith in the idea that there is an ideal vocabulary, one which contains all genuine discursive options. Rorty designates this faith Platonism (an important theme in CIS). That there are no inescapable forms of description is a thought which permeates Rorty's work from the 1960s right through his later therapeutic articulations of pragmatism. These characterizations of pragmatism in terms of anti-foundationalism (PMN), of anti-representationalism (ORT), of anti-essentialism (TP) are explicitly parasitic on constructive efforts in epistemology and metaphysics, and are intended to high-light the various ways that these efforts remain under the spell of a Platonic faith in ideal concepts and mandatory forms of descriptions.

Rorty's use of Quine and Sellars to make his fundamental points against the idea of philosophy as a knowledge legitimation project, as well as his articulation of his critique in terms of typically "analytical" philosophical problems, has contributed to an impression of PMN as an internal indictment of analytic philosophy as such. Many—some gleeful, some chagrined—have read PMN as a purported demonstration of the bankruptcy of one of the two contemporary main streams of Western philosophy. Such readers draw support for this view also from the fact that much of Rorty's writings since PMN has been concerned to show the virtues in thinkers like Heidegger and Derrida. (EHO) Twenty years later, however, it seems better not to superimpose the analytic-continental divide onto the message of PMN, or on Rorty. In PMN, his central point is that philosophy needs to break free from the metaphor of mind as a medium of appearances, appearances that philosophy must help us sort into the mere and the reality-corresponding ones. Rorty made this point in a vocabulary that was developed by Anglo-American (whether by birth, naturalization, or late adoption) philosophers in the course of the preceding half-century. It is not necessary, and probably misleading, to see Rorty's criticism of epistemology and the assumptions that make it appear worthwhile as a criticism of a particular philosophical style of philosophy or set of methodological habits. Reading PMN in conjunction with the essays in CP (see particularly essay 4, "Professionalized Philosophy and Transcendentalist Culture", essay 12, "Philosophy in America Today", and also "Introduction"), one quickly sees that the target of PMN cannot be a putative school or branch of the subject called "Analytic Philosophy". Because Rorty thinks philosophy has no essence, has no defining historical task, fails to mark out a special domain of knowledge, and is not, in short, a natural kind (CP 226), he leaves no ground from which to level that sort of critique. Nor is it his intention to do so. Around the time of the publication of PMN, Rorty's view of the matter was ‘that "analytic philosophy" now has only a stylistic and sociological unity’ (CP 217). He then qualifies this point as follows: "In saying….[this], I am not suggesting that analytic philosophy is a bad thing, or is in bad shape. The analytic style is, I think, a good style. The esprit de corps among analytic philosophers is healthy and useful." (CP 217) However, while Rorty apparently bears no prejudice against analytic philosophy in particular, the very reason for his tolerance—his antiessentialist, historicist view of philosophy and its problems—has for many critics been a point of objection. After his faint praise, Rorty goes on:

All I am saying is that analytic philosophy has become, whether it likes it or not, the same sort of discipline as we find in the other "humanities" departments—departments where pretensions to "rigor" and to "scientific" status are less evident. The normal form of life in the humanities is the same as that in the arts and in belles-lettres; a genius does something new and interesting and persuasive, and his or her admirers begin to form a school or movement. (CP 217-218)

This is perfectly consonant with the attitude to the notion of philosophical method Rorty expresses 20 years later: "So-called methods are simply descriptions of the activities engaged in by the enthusiastic imitators of one or another original mind—what Kuhn would call the "research programs" to which their works gave rise." (TP 10) Rorty's metaphilosophical critique, then, is directed not at particular techniques or styles or vocabularies, but toward the idea that philosophical problems are anything other than transient tensions in the dynamics of evolving, contingent vocabularies. If his critique has bite specifically against analytic philosophy, this may be because of a lingering faith in philosophical problems as lasting intellectual challenges that any honest thinker has to acknowledge, and which may be met by making progress in methodology. Rorty himself, however, nowhere says that this faith is part of the essence of analytical philosophy. On the contrary, it would seem that analytical philosophers, people like Sellars, Quine, and Davidson, have provided Rorty with indispensable critical tools in his attack on the epistemological legitimation-project which has been a central concern in philosophy since Descartes.


Works by Rorty


[PMN] Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press, 1979.
[CP] Consequences of Pragmatism. Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1982.
[CIS] Contingency, Irony, and Solidarity. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1989.
[ORT] Objectivity, Relativism, and Truth: Philosophical Papers, Volume 1. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991.
[EHO] Essays on Heidegger and Others: Philosophical Papers, Volume 2. [EHO] Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991.
[TP] Truth and Progress: Philosophical Papers, Volume 3. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998.
[AC] Achieving Our Country: Leftist Thought in Twentieth Century America. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press,1998.
[PSH] Philosophy and Social Hope. Penguin, 2000.
[PCP] Philosophy as Cultural Politics. Cambridge, UK, 2007.

Other Works by Rorty

Secondary Literature

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Davidson, Donald | Dewey, John | liberalism | naturalism | postmodernism | pragmatism | Sellars, Wilfrid