Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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David Hartley

First published Mon Nov 25, 2002; substantive revision Tue Apr 28, 2009

Engraving of Hartley
Engraving by William Blake, 1791

David Hartley (1705-57) is the author of Observations on Man, his Frame, his Duty, and his Expectations (1749) — a wide-ranging synthesis of neurology, moral psychology, and spirituality (i.e., our “frame,” “duty,” and “expectations”). The Observations gained dedicated advocates in Britain, America, and Continental Europe, who appreciated it both for its science and its spirituality. As science, the work grounds consciousness in neuro-physiology, mind in brain. On this basis, the central concept of “association,” much discussed by other British philosophers and psychologists, receives distinctive treatment: the term first  names the physiological process that generates “ideas,” and then the psychological processes by which perceptions, thoughts, and emotions either link and fuse or break apart. In keeping with this physiological approach, Hartley offers a conceptually novel account of how we learn and perform skilled actions, a dimension of human nature often left unexplored in works of philosophy. Such actions include those involved in speech — and, by extension, the conduct of scientific inquiry. As a work on the spiritual condition of humanity, Hartley's Observations affirms universal salvation — the assurance that all people will eventually become “partakers of the divine nature.” In this regard, it presents an original model of psychological growth, which describes how the self both forms and transforms, as the person gains in “sympathy” and “theopathy” — put simply, learns to love, both others and God.

The son of an Anglican clergyman, David Hartley was born in June 1705 in the vicinity of Halifax, Yorkshire. His mother died three months after his birth, and his father when David was fifteen. After receiving his B.A. and M.A. from Jesus College, Cambridge, Hartley practiced medicine in Bury St. Edmunds (1730-35), London (1735-42), and Bath, where he died on 28 August 1757. He married twice: in 1730, Alice Rowley, who died in 1731 giving birth to their son David (1731-1813); and in 1735, Elizabeth Packer (1713-78), despite the opposition of her very wealthy family. The couple had two children, Mary (1736-1803) and Wincombe Henry (1740-94). Although severely afflicted with bladder stones, Hartley lived a full and active life: he practiced medicine, engaged in mathematical research, sought a cure for “the stone,” devoted himself to intellectual and philanthropic projects, and wrote the Observations on Man.

1. Reception of the Observations on Man

In the 18th and 19th centuries, Hartley's Observations was valued very highly by people within the realm of religious dissent, scientific progress, and social reform. Writing in 1774, Joseph Priestley, a leading Unitarian and the foremost scientist in Britain, wrote that the Observations “contains a new and most extensive science” and promised that “the study of it … will be like entering upon a new world.” He added: “I think myself more indebted to this one treatise, than to all the books I ever read beside; the scriptures excepted” (1774, xix).

Priestley and his fellow Unitarians gave the Observations a central place in the curriculum in the dissenting academies. (For admission to Oxford and Cambridge Universities, a student had to subscribe to the doctrines of the Church of England — a requirement which excluded Unitarians, who did not accept that Jesus is God; hence the dissenters' need for their own institutions of higher learning.) From one report, we learn that students in one academy studied it for two hours every morning. In addition, in the late 1700s student radicals at Cambridge and Oxford also had their copies.

Thus the Observations was the focus of sustained study and high esteem — if you followed Priestley, the most important book, after the Bible. The poet Samuel Taylor Coleridge, converted to Priestleian Unitarianism at Cambridge, had his portrait painted holding a copy of the Observations, and named his first son David Hartley Coleridge. Other writers offer similar testimonies. Few works discussed in this encyclopedia have been the objects of such deep personal involvement.

While its admirers thought it  “a new science” of human nature, its critics — including Thomas Reid (1785, 84-94) and the later Coleridge ([1817] 1983), no longer the youthful radical — considered Hartley's Observations conceptually wrong and morally hazardous. For example, Sir James Mackintosh, who sympathetically praised “the extraordinary value of Hartley's system” (1836, 253), nonetheless saw in Hartley's belief that consciousness derives from neurological processes an “error … deeper and more fundamental than any other,” sure to “involv[e] all nature in darkness and confusion” (245).

In the nineteenth century, James Mill, John Stuart Mill, and William B. Carpenter (who all had studied the Observations in dissenting academies), along with Alexander Bain, founded the school of thought known as “association psychology.” They credited Hartley with being the precursor of the science they had developed. However, John Stuart Mill wrote in the Preface to the 1869 edition of his father's Analysis of the Phenomena of the Human Mind, that, compared to his father's work, Hartley's Observations “is little more than a sketch, though an eminently suggestive one” (Mill 1869, 1:xi-12). Hardly a recommendation to read the book that the Mills had poured over as students. Why look at the sketch, when the fully drawn portrait is available?

By the late 1800s Priestleian Unitarianism, as a tradition of philosophical practice, had died out; academic philosophers, especially those trained in the Scottish school of common sense (the official philosophy taught, for example, by the Unitarians who ran Harvard), knew that the Observations rested on a fundamental mistake; and association psychologists preserved a memory of this precursor of their science. Formal interest in Hartley's Observations, as a work to be read and pondered, discussed in lectures, written about in articles and books, had collapsed. The last serious engagement with the Observations appears in William James's Principles of Psychology (1890, 1:553), and even there a casual reader could easily miss it.

In the twentieth century, Hartley's Observations remained outside the philosophical curriculum: philosophers-in-training could follow the well-traveled route from the “British empiricists” to Kant without turning aside to pick it up. And even if a person had wanted to, doing so was difficult, for after the editions of 1749, 1775, 1791, 1810, and 1834, and translations into French (1755 and 1802), German (1772), and Italian (1809), no further editions were published. Today, paperback reprints of earlier editions are available, but there is no modern critical edition.

In his Second Treatise of Government, Locke famously stated that “labor fixes property.” It is the labor of people in the fields of philosophy that fixes a philosophical text as a “property” — that marks its bounds and assesses its value. But a work that has remained outside contemporary philosophy's pedagogical economy, as has Hartley's Observations, is in an indeterminate position. A person today who picks the book up would have in hand a long book covering a multitude of topics. How to determine its properties? And how to answer the question of economics: What is its worth? To address these questions, let us imagine how one of Hartley's colleagues, a Fellow of the Royal Society (FRS), might have responded to the book on its appearance in 1749.

2. Hartley's Observations — At First Sight

A FRS in regular attendance at the society's London meetings would be acquainted with Hartley, and would know that he had emerged the victor in a public medical controversy ten years earlier, which established his reputation in medical circles both in Britain and on the Continent. Hartley, working with Stephen Hales, researched the chemical basis for what they thought an effective folk remedy for bladder stones — a painful and hazardous condition that impaired the lives of Hartley himself and many others, including Benjamin Franklin. In the course of the controversy, Hartley had published a self-revealing account of the prolonged and intense suffering he had endured, while undergoing the treatment.

The FRS would know that this orphaned son of a Yorkshire clergyman was now a successful physician, thanks in part to powerful patrons (including the Cornwallis family, and the Duke of Newcastle, who was in effect prime minister), had come into personal wealth, thanks to his second marriage, and that he had devoted himself to various philanthropic projects, including the publication of the shorthand system devised by his friend, John Byrom.

If the FRS knew Hartley as a friend, he would know him to be a mathematician with a special interest in statistics, an amateur violinist, and a vegetarian who saw animals as bearing a “near relation” to humans. He would know him as a husband and father (unlike Descartes, Locke, Hume, and Kant). He would know that Hartley was often in extreme pain, and in danger of losing his life, as he still suffered grievously from bladder stones. And he would know him to be a man with deeply unconventional religious beliefs.

Picking up the Observations, such a reader would see that the book presented itself as Newtonian science — through the use of “Observations” in the title (compare two groundbreaking scientific texts, Franklin's Experiments and Observations on Electricity, 1751, and Priestley's Experiments and Observations of Different Kinds of Air, 1774), and through the geometrical format of propositions and corollaries that structure the text. Were he to page through the opening sections, he would see that the Hartley wrote for a reader already familiar with technical concepts in, for example, anatomy and physiology, and in the speculative physics in Newton's Opticks.

Were the reader to continue beyond the opening propositions of the Observations, he would encounter elements of another, older tradition: references to “perfect self-annihilation, and the pure love of God” (OM 2, prop. 67), and quotations of select biblical passages, especially the promise of becoming “partakers of the divine nature” (2 Pet. 1.4). These place Hartley within the realms of pietism and mysticism.

Specifically, they are expressions of the “everlasting gospel” of universal salvation. For the Observations envisions the restoration of a fallen, fragmented, and self-alienated humanity to “perfect manhood,” in which all people, without exception, will be “members of the mystical body of Christ,” and as such will become “new sets of senses, and perceptive powers, to each other, so as to increase each others happiness without limits” (OM 2, prop. 68; cf. prop. 35).

Neither the scientific approach to “man” nor the affirmation of universal salvation was in itself original. One could find the former in the medical literature, and in Descartes. For versions of the “everlasting gospel” one could turn to various writers, including Peter Sterry, Cromwell's chaplain, in A Discourse of the Freedom of the Will (1675), Sterry's fellow chaplain to Cromwell, Jeremiah White, in The Restoration of All Things (1712), the visionary Jane Lead, the mathematician Thomas Bayes, in Divine Benevolence (1731), and, on the continent, Charles Hector de Marsay.

What is distinctive about Hartley's Observations is the simultaneous presence of the two approaches. Although Hartley affirms that the whole person is a “mechanism,” subject to scientific study, he is no French atheist, no La Mettrie (author of the notorious L'Homme machine, 1748), but a person of deep religious sensibility. Similarly, Hartley affirms universal restoration — but with none of the hallucinatory mysticism of Lead or Marsay. Rather, the doctrine is supported by an application of the latest scientific thinking.

Consider the full title: Observations on Man, his Frame, his Duty, and his Expectations. Hartley attempts a synthesis, by showing that bodily “frame,” moral “duty,” and religious “expectations” all converge on the same point — and that point is the overcoming of the chasm between hell and heaven. Recall that Hartley, like other Unitarians, believed the divinity of Jesus and substitutionary atonement to be doctrines that obscured the original light of Christianity. Thus an explanation of “salvation” as something external and undeserved has no part in his thinking. Rather, he offers a scientific account of how we are framed, both physically and psychologically, so as ultimately to attain the state in which we are all be “partakers of the divine nature, loving and lovely, holy and happy” (OM 2, prop. 56).

3. The Science of Man

The scientific dimension of the Observations is in part methodical and in part substantive. As a matter of method, Hartley proposes the scientific investigation of  “man.” As noted above, this is not unique; physicians had been doing just this for decades, and there were also the examples of Descartes's Passions of the Soul (1649) and Treatise on Man (1664), and of Hume's anonymously published Treatise of Human Nature (1739-40). (There is no evidence that Hartley knew anything about Hume, or Hume about Hartley.) What is distinctive about the Observations is that it extends Newtonian science to the study of human nature.

We should assume, Hartley writes, that the body's “component particles” are “subjected to the same subtle laws” (OM 1, prop. 9) as are all other material entities. The subtle laws are those Newton suggested in the “Queries” to his Opticks, and which Stephen Hales (1677-1761, remembered today as the father of plant physiology and for the measurement of blood pressure) further developed in the chemical theory in his Statical Essays — i.e., Vegetable Staticks (1727) and Haemastaticks (1733). Descartes had earlier proposed a model of neural physiology, but in 1740s Britain the physics the model depended upon would have looked out of date. Hartley, in contrast, presented a “theory of vibrations” that explained, in detail, how the “component particles” that constitute the nerves and brain interact with the physical universe suggested by Newton — a world composed of “forces of attraction and repulsion” and having a minimum of solid matter.

As a matter of substance, Hartley proposes:

Since therefore sensations are conveyed to the mind, by the efficiency of corporeal causes … it seems to me, that the powers of generating ideas, and raising them by association, must also arise from corporeal causes, and consequently admit of an explication from the subtle influences of the small parts of matter on each other, as soon as these are sufficiently understood. (OM 1, prop. 11)

Note the language: “corporeal causes” “generate” and “raise” ideas “by association.” Unlike later “association psychologists” such as James Mill, Hartley does not start with “ideas” as subjective entities already experientially present to the “mind” and then ask how these are linked. Rather, he starts with bodily, specifically neurological processes, and asks: how do such processes generate and raise our perceptions, emotions, thoughts, and actions? This is a proposal for neuroscience, not a  version of philosophical or psychological “empiricism.”

If the responses of a nervous system to its physical environment can generate and raise one “idea,” one flash of consciousness, they can generate any, and all. Thus “the whole superstructure of ideas and associations observable in human life may … be built upon as small a foundation as we please” (OM 1, prop. 11). For Hartley, the foundation is simple: nerves “vibrate” (on a molecular level, not as violin strings), change their frequencies or amplitudes of vibration, and transmit those changes to other nerves. But thanks to the vast number of associative connections between nerves and within the brain, this fundamental mechanism generates all the complexities of action we observe in living beings — both animal and human.

The first volume of the Observations ends with a bold statement: if an organism “could be endued with the most simple kinds of sensation, [it] might also arrive at all that intelligence of which the human mind is possessed” (OM 1, Conclusion).

Such is an expression of the “error … deeper and more fundamental than any other” with which Mackintosh charged Hartley: that of overlooking ontological dualism, “the primordial and perpetual distinction between the being that thinks and the thing which is thought of” (1836, 245). Descartes maintained this distinction by positing a substance dualism of mind and body (and by treating animals as “mere” mechanisms, without consciousness, and humans as rational, sentient beings), and such as Hume and later James Mill respected it (or at least avoided dealing with it) by writing about the contents of conscious minds while keeping well clear of neurophysiology. But Hartley ignores the distinction between “thinking” and “thought of”; he affirms that neurological processes generate consciousness. In his view, animals are conscious beings, endued with sensation and, in neurologically complex species, their own kinds of intelligence: hence he affirms their “near relation” to us — which obligates us “to be their guardians and benefactors,” and is reason to refrain from making them suffer for our sport or convenience, and from killing them for food (OM 1, prop. 93; cf. OM 2, prop. 52).What separates us from animals are simply differences in neuro-anatomy.

Accept that “all that intelligence of which the human mind is possessed”could be arrived at by an organism possessing “the most simple kinds of sensation,” and what follows? To many, a line of thought “involving all nature into darkness and confusion.” To others, with Priestley, the way of “entering upon a new world” of scientific discovery, free of the dualism of spirit and matter.

4. Perception and Action: The Role of “Joint Impression”

Hartley's starting point is the living organism, and specifically the physical “vibrations” present in brain and nervous system and in the universe with which the organism interacts. From this starting point, two important considerations follow. The first is that sensations and ideas are products, not givens, and their “generation” and “raising” require explanation. The second involves the recognition that organisms are active beings. Like other animals, humans move about in, explore, and interact with their environments. What is more, humans become adept at performing various kinds of learned, highly skilled actions — e.g., playing the violin. The “ideas” humans have largely occur within, and guide, such practices.

Concerning the first consideration: although “association” is a central concept in the Observations, it is not primarily a name for the process by which simple and discrete experiential entities link up; rather, the process of neurological association generates ideas, including our categories of perception. In proposition 11, Hartley states that “ideas, and miniature vibrations, must first be generated … before they can be associated.” He adds:

But then (which is very remarkable) this power of forming ideas, and their corresponding miniature vibrations, does equally presuppose the power of association. For since all sensations and vibrations are infinitely divisible, in respect of time and place, they could not leave any traces or images of themselves, i.e. any ideas, or miniature vibrations, unless their infinitesimal parts did cohere together through joint impression, i.e. association. (OM 1, prop. 11)

By stating that “all sensations and vibrations are infinitely divisible,” Hartley is elaborating on a point made by George Berkeley, in his Essay Towards a New Theory of Vision ([1709] 1948), that a being born “blind” to bodily feeling and possessing only sight would have no concept of space and would be unable to perceive a geometrically ordered world. To such a being, sensations would be “infinitely” — i.e., arbitrarily — divisible. No stable, repeatable “ideas” could arise from them.

Hartley also agrees with Berkeley's solution to this problem: we perceive a coherent world thanks to the generation of “ideas” (cognitive, semantic, and pragmatic responses to the world) through the “joint impression” of sensations from distinct sensory modalities — sight, hearing, and especially touch. As does Berkeley, Hartley identifies feeling or touch as “the fundamental source of information in respect of the essential properties of matter” and “our first and principle key to the knowledge of the external world” (OM 1, prop. 30). Thus, Hartley writes, “we call the touch the reality, light the representative.” The sense of sight “may be considered, agreeably to Bishop Berkeley's remark, as a philosophical language for the ideas of feeling” (see Berkeley [1709] 1948, sections 6.4, 6.8, and 9.4).

A “philosophical language” is one “without any deficiency, superfluity, or equivocation” (OM 1, prop. 83), and what makes sight a “philosophical language” for feeling is that the two match each other: “The same qualities are made by means of light to impress vibrations on our eyes, which correspond in great measure to those made on the sense of feeling, so as to vary with their varieties” (OM 1, prop. 30). Feeling and vision flow in tandem, with no missing, extraneous, or equivocal moves. It is thus joint impression, the correlation of the flows of sensation through two (or more) sensory modalities, so that the sensations one  “vary with the varieties” of another, that accounts for the fact that we have ideas at all.

In contrast, a person whose visual inputs are dissociated from his other sensory modalities, and especially his own movement and feeling, is unable to consistently identify any “visual ideas.” Such is the condition of a person suffering from a visual agnosia (see James 1890, 1:48-50).

This first consideration thus naturally leads to the second, for both Hartley, and Berkeley before him, are talking about the actions of an embodied being. A living being's capacities for sensory discrimination, feature detection, and perceptual categorization are all involved with the repertoires of action that being performs, either innately or through learning.

For many animals, the ways in which physical movements vary with the varieties of visual cues is relatively fixed: cats pounce on mice (some of cloth), and swat at moths (or moving shadows on a sunlit wall). For human beings, thanks to the brain's plasticity in forming “joint impressions,” there are many ways in which the “varieties” of one sensation “vary with the varieties” of another: at the sight of notes on a staff, fingers move determinately upon a piano keyboard. Expert musicians, at the sight of the notes, hear the tune in their mind's ear.

But how to explain what it is that the expert musician (or any expert practitioner) does? And how does one learn to do this?

5. The Range of Actions: From “Automatic” to “Decomplex”

In the Observations, Hartley offers a conceptually novel treatment of physical action — a topic largely absent from other treatises, or inquries, devoted to “human nature” or “human understanding.” Even in James Mill's Analysis of the Phenomena of the Human Mind, a work with an acknowledged debt to Hartley, bodily action is touched on only in the last chapter of the book, on “The Will.” But to an attentive “observer of man,” it should be obvious that we live by doing, by performing tasks that depend on repertoires of perfected movement, some (like walking) mastered in infancy, others (like typing) later in life.

Hartley invented to two words to describe physical movements: “automatic” and “decomplex.”

Hartley formed the adjective “automatic” from an existing noun, “automaton,” to describe movements such as  “the motions of the heart, and the peristaltic motion of the bowels” (OM 1, Introduction). Such  “originally automatic” motions are homeostatic: As a heart beats, the alternation of contraction and relaxation is maintained and modified in response to the needs and experiences of the organism (OM 1, prop. 19).

Following the discussion of “originally automatic” motion is this theorem: “If any sensation A, idea B, or motion C, be associated … with any other sensation D, idea E, or muscular motion F, it will, at last, excite d, the simple idea belonging to sensation D, the very idea E, or the very muscular motion F” (OM 1, prop. 20). Through the physical association or neural impulses in the brain, any sensation, idea, or muscular motion can become the stimulus that excites any other idea or muscular motion. One's heart beats faster at the sight, sound, or thought of something one has learned to fear.

The formation of such  novel associations of stimuli to physiological responses means that “originally automatic” motions can transform into motions that are  “voluntary” or “secondarily automatic” (OM 1, prop. 21).

An action is voluntary when its stimulus is an “idea, or state of mind … which we term the will” (OM 1, prop. 21). To illustrate how ideas of the form “the will to …” derive from “originally automatic” motions, Hartley describes how a child gains motor control over parts and functions of her body. “Originally automatic” motions are brought under control through a series of substitutions of the initiating stimulus. An infant grasps the finger placed in her palm, and then the toy she sees, and then grasps at “the sound of the words grasp, take hold, &c., the sight of the nurse's hand, in that state, the idea of a hand, and particularly the child's own hand.” These and “innumerable other associated circumstances … will put the child upon grasping, till, at last, that idea, or state of mind which we may call the will to grasp, is generated and sufficiently associated with the action to produce it instantaneously.”

It is important to note that, in Hartley's account, the performance of a voluntary movement is not a dualistic, two-stage process, with an executive “faculty” of the Mind, the Will, first issuing an instruction that the body then carries out. Rather, a movement becomes voluntary through the living being's interaction with the “innumerable … associated circumstances” of its environment, which interactions bring about a series of substitutions of the initiating stimulus. In this light,  “will” does not name anything substantive: it is a word  we use to describe an “idea, or state of mind.” And it is a word people often use to express bafflement as to what this “state of mind” amounts to. Hartley notes that adults start calling a child willful at the time he learns to walk, because “the child, in some cases, does not walk when desired, whilst yet the circumstances are apparently the same as when he does. For here the unapparent cause of walking, or not walking, is will” (OM 1, prop. 77). But, he adds, “a careful observation … will always shew … that when children do different things, the real circumstances, natural or associated, are proportionally different, and that the state of mind called will depends on the difference.”

Sequences of substitutions transform originally automatic actions into voluntary ones. Hartley recognizes that the process continues, so that voluntary actions in turn become what he terms “secondarily automatic”:

After the actions, which are most perfectly voluntary, have been rendered so by one set of associations, they may, by another, be made to depend upon the most diminutive sensations, ideas, and motions, such as the mind scarce regards, or is conscious of; and which it can therefore scarce recollect the moment after the action is over. Hence it follows, that association not only converts automatic actions into voluntary, but voluntary ones into automatic. For these actions … are rather to be ascribed to the body than the mind, i.e. are to be referred to the head of automatic motions. I shall call them automatic motions of the secondary kind, to distinguish them from those which are originally automatic, and from the voluntary ones. (OM 1, prop. 21)

Think of learning to type or play the piano. At first one develops a repertoire of voluntary motions. But fluency requires that the motions be secondarily automatic.

To his critics, notably Reid and the later Coleridge, Hartley's commitment to “mechanism” impeached the “freedom of the will” and hence moral responsibility. But where such critics were intent on affirming the adult self's executive control over thought and action, Hartley's concern is the opposite: he starts with the infant and asks, How does a child gain control of the originally automatic processes present in infancy? Gain motor control of her hands? Learn to walk, and dance? Play a musical instrument? Transform spontaneous burbling and crying into articulate speech? Hartley's critics accuse him of reducing the human being to a “mere mechanism.” But from a Hartleian perspective, the “mechanism” of “secondarily automatic” actions is an achievement, not a given — and a necessary achievement, if one is to live a complete human life.

Most human competencies, though voluntarily performed, rely upon extensive repertoires of secondarily automatic actions. Such performances are not prespecified and inflexible routines. When people play music, they add flourishes, and  improvise if they are sufficiently skilled. When they do so, the actions they perform are what Hartley calls “decomplex.”

Readers of the Observations would have been familiar with the words “decompound” and “decomposite” — both from the late Latin decompositus, a rendering of the Greek parasynthetos — in which the “de-” prefix signifies “repeatedly” or “further.” They would also know the word “complex,” from Locke's Essay concerning Human Understanding: “Ideas thus made up of several simple ones put together, I call Complex; such as are Beauty, Gratitude, a Man, an Army, the Universe” (Locke [1690] 1975, 2.12.1).

Available to Hartley were both Locke's distinction between “simple” and “complex” and also instances in which the de- prefix meant “further.” On the analogy of “compound” to “decompound,” he wrote of ideas and actions being either “complex” or “decomplex.” In Hartley's theory, the associations in a complex action or idea are synchronic, while the associations in a decomplex action or idea are diachronic. In playing a piano, hitting the D key at the sight of the printed note D is a complex movement, while playing a composition is a decomplex action.

The elements of a secondarily automatic, complex movement are tightly fused. In contrast, those in a decomplex action or idea are more loosely associated (OM 1, prop. 12); this looseness makes it possible to include a repertoire of secondarily automatic movements in a variety of decomplex ones — the same notes in an endless number of tunes. Hartley also observes that people find it impossible to perform decomplex actions — play a tune, say a sentence — backward.

Decomplex actions draw on different kinds of complex movements, involving the association of movements with perceptions in one or more sensory modalities: at the sight of the notes on the staff, or the sound of the tones, the pianist hits the keys. As a person becomes proficient at a type of decomplex action, the guiding sensory modality can change. When learning to dance, Hartley observes, at first “the scholar desires to look at his feet and legs, in order to judge by seeing when they are in a proper position,” but “by degrees he learns to judge of this by feeling” (OM 1, prop. 77). Similarly, a practiced musician plays the harpsichord from “the connexion of the several complex parts of the decomplex motions” (OM 1, prop. 21). One's hands know the tune.

Hartley improvised with language in order to articulate a new understanding of human action. Use of the one word became … automatic. The other never made it into circulation. In a world in which “decompose” means “to rot,” it was doomed. Nonetheless, we lack a widely available word for the concept that “decomplex” names.

Hartley's account draws particular attention to the dependency of our capacities for intentionality, flexibility, and innovation in our decomplex actions upon the repertoires of actions we have made secondarily automatic. It thus centers upon a key insight: “All our voluntary powers are of the nature of memory” (OM 1, prop. 90).

6. Language and Thought

In Hartley's account, at birth we enter the world already humming with “originally automatic” motions. Thanks to the activity of our brain and nerves, these motions are self-regulating and homeostatic, responsive to bodily feedback and external stimuli. Then, as we grow, we gain voluntary control over some of our movements, perfect those that become secondarily automatic, and learn to carry out decomplex actions that draw on repertoires of secondarily automatic components.

In Hartley's account of human nature, the concept of the “association of ideas” plays a central role. But the paradigmatic instances of “association” are, first, the “joint impressions” that generate “ideas” (including complex movements), and second, the flowing cascades of movement that are decomplex actions. Such decomplex actions are central to the lives we lead. And foremost among decomplex actions are the sentences we speak.

For Hartley, language is a highly “decomplex” motor activity that involves the cementing of associations between perceived and created sounds, and, for the literate, perceived and created marks: “impressions made on the ear,” “actions of the organs of speech,” “impressions made upon the eye,” and “actions of the hand in writing” (OM 1, prop. 79). Further connections must be made between perceived or created sounds and features of the world, especially the actions of oneself and of other people. Hartley's approach is nearly the opposite of Locke's, who writes as if language were a dictionary, in which each word marks an idea known prelinguistically to the speaker: “words being voluntary signs, they cannot be voluntary signs imposed by [the speaker] on things he knows not… . Till he has some ideas of his own, he cannot suppose them to correspond with the conceptions of another man; nor can he use any signs for them” (Locke [1690] 1975, 3.2.2).

Thus while Locke seems to be saying that individuals first have ideas, and then turn to language to communicate them to others, Hartley describes a process whereby, as children, we burble and cry and listen — and gradually gain motor control of our burbling and crying, associate it with what we hear and handle and do, and eventually learn the meaning of what we say. Once again, the process of association — here the activity of hearing and speaking, and later reading and writing — generates ideas: we have ideas because we use language, in concrete social interactions; we do not create language to express the ideas we, as lone individuals, already have.

In this regard, consider Hume's assertion that, if we are unsure about the meaning of a word, “we need but enquire, from what impression is that supposed idea derived?” (Hume [1748] 1975, 22), and his recommendation that we abandon words that lack such derivations. From Hartley's point of view, this is manifestly bad advice.

For Hartley, complex and decomplex ideas are wholes that do not “bear any relation to [their] compounding parts.” Specifically, “the decomplex idea belonging to any sentence is not compounded merely of the complex ideas belonging to the words in it” (OM 1, prop. 12). The meaning of an utterance is a property of the whole — of the performance of a specific decomplex action in a social and pragmatic context. Moreover, “both children and adults learn the ideas belonging to whole sentences many times in a summary way, and not by adding together the ideas of the several words in the sentence.” Consequently, children and illiterate adults find it hard to “separate sentences into the several words which compound them” (OM 1, prop. 80).

Thus the meaning of sentences is not simply derivable from the meanings of the words in them, and the meanings of those words is not derivable from the “impressions” to which they refer. When children begin to speak, they utter “sentences” that, though short (Mommy!) are whole, complete, and meaningful expressions. It is only when they learn to read that they realize sentences are composed of individual words. Over time, the sentences increase in decomplexity, as people participate in the activities of life. As adults, people speak a vast variety of highly decomplex expressions — including, for example, those involved in the practice of a science, or a religion.

7. Language as Algebra

Given that meaning is a property of complete expressions, Hartley is quick to point out that individual words often lack definite, shared meanings. Such indefiniteness is, in Hartley's view, hardly a defect, but rather a valuable feature of language. Hartley writes that language is “one species of algebra,” and algebra “nothing more than the language … peculiarly fitted to explain quantity of all kinds” (OM 1, 80).

The algebraic quality of language is especially important in scientific practice. Like x and y in algebra, scientific terms, such as Hartley's “vibrations” or contemporary physicists' “particles,” stand for unknowns, for which vibrating strings or grains of sand provide only loose and highly misleading analogies. Their presence is necessary for the practice of scientific discovery. Scientists employ “algebraic” terms in order to discern correlations and patterns that might otherwise remain unobserved: “Bringing an unknown quantity into a relation answers, in philosophy, to the art of giving names, expressing nothing definite … and then inserting these names … in all the enunciations of the phenomena, to see whether, from a comparison of these terms with each other, something definite in manner, degree, or mutual relation might result” (OM 1, prop. 87).

In such scientific practice, the more algebraic — i.e., free from association with sense “impressions” — words are the better. (Thus “quark” is an inspired choice.)  Hume's advice, to use only terms referring to clear “impressions,” if followed, would bring the practice of a science to a halt.

However, to turn this around, the utility of words for unknowns depends upon their proper use within ongoing practices. For examples of how to conduct scientific inquiry, Hartley turns to mathematical methods, and he includes an extensive discussion of these in proposition 87 of volume 1 of the Observations, which is titled: “To deduce Rules for the Ascertainment of Truth, and Advancement of Knowledge, from the Mathematical Methods of considering Quantity.”

One deduction involves the comparison of scientific investigation to the use of the rule of the false position in arithmetic: “Here a first position is obtained, which, though not accurate, approaches, however, to the truth. From this, applied to the equations, a second position is deduced, which approaches nearer to the truth than the first; from the second a third, etc.” Hartley adds that “this is indeed the way, in which advances in science are carried on; and scientific persons are aware, that it is and must be so” (OM 1, prop. 87).

“I frame no hypotheses.” Thus had Newton famously written in the Principia. Hartley responds directly: “It is in vain,” he writes, “to bid an inquirer form no hypothesis” (OM 1, prop. 87). Remember that Hartley was a practicing physician; on the basis of ambiguous symptoms and fallible medical knowledge, he was every day “framing hypotheses,” making diagnoses. The question, for Hartley, concerns the degree of confidence we may place in our hypotheses. How do we measure how far our “first position” is from the truth, when we don't know what the truth is? And how do we measure the degree to which the degree of error in our second and third positions has diminished?

In this regard, what is most interesting in proposition 87 is Hartley's discussion of probability. Hartley appears to have been one of a small circle of mathematicians who read, and understood, papers making fundamental contributions to the theory of probability by Abraham De Moivre (1667-1754) and Thomas Bayes (1702-61). De Moivre developed a theorem that allows for the determination of the degree of convergence between the frequency of observed events and the underlying probability ratio, for any finite number of events. More important is “the solution to the inverse problem,” which Hartley says “an ingenious friend” communicated to him. This would be Bayes's theorem — customarily attributed to Thomas Bayes — which deals with determining the probability with which probability ratios can be inferred from observed outcomes, and which provides (a still controversial) foundation for statistical inference. In his discussion of probability theory, and other mathematical topics, Hartley is primarily interested in methods for moving from observation to explanation, of assessing the likeliness — i.e, believability — of hypotheses.

Hartley, like Hume, thought that belief was largely a matter of sentiment. “Rational assent” is a matter of the strength of the association between a sentence (or even some of the words in it!) and the word “true” (OM 1, prop. 86) “Practical assent,” a person's willingness to act, depends on the vividness the proposition — and such can even make “an interesting event, supposed doubtful, or even fictitious, … appear like a real one,” thereby pulling rational assent after it. (Hartley notes, dryly, “the foundation of assent is still the same. I here describe the fact only.”) But Hartley was not content to stop here, an exponent of an urbane skepticism. Belief and assent are matters of feeling, of sentiment, yes — but there are mathematical ways of thinking about the probabilities of belief. And people who think mathematically make better physicians and scientists. (How many trials of an unproven treatment for bladder stones does one have to run, to reach a threshold degree of belief in the results?) In this regard, it is fair to say that Hartley was one of the first Bayesians.

One other consequence of Hartley's practice-oriented, “algebraic” approach to language concerns the validity of  alternate languages. In the “popular” language we use every day, we talk of our choices, intentions, and resolutions, but in the “philosophical” language of the Observations, Hartley proposed we think in terms of  “philosophical necessity” — in which every “voluntary” action is “excited by an associated circumstance” (OM 1, 70). Some people had, and have, no use for such talk: it denies the freedom (and indeed, the existence) of the will. Hartley argues that the use of two incommensurable languages, “popular” and “philosophical,” is not a problem, provided that we use them separately and consistently: “insuperable difficulties will arise” only “if we mix these languages” (OM 2, prop. 15). Both languages work, in their own contexts of practice.

Hartley had a warrant for this affirmative approach to languages in his scientific and mathematical training: Newton wrote the Principia in the language of geometry, but the “mathematical principles of natural philosophy” could be equally (and better?) expressed in the “algebraic” language of the calculus — for which there were rival notations. Similarly, Hartley championed a new “notation” for the English language — his friend John Byrom's shorthand, which he saw as a reform that would make our written language  more closely approximate a “philosophical” one. When he began work on the Observations, he conceived of the project as demonstrating that language about “self-interest,” the “common good,” and the “will of God” were different ways of saying the same thing. The project was thus as much moral and religious as it was scientific.

8. Moral Psychology

As noted above, Hartley believed that all people will ultimately become “partakers of the divine nature.” Such is the “everlasting gospel” of universal salvation. Moreover, Hartley sought to show that the gathering together of all humanity into the “mystical body of Christ” is a process inherent in our nature: the psychological dynamic of association, which generates our ideas and perfects our secondarily automatic movements, also “has a tendency to reduce the state of those who have eaten of the tree of the knowledge of good and evil, back again to a paradisiacal one” (OM 1, prop. 14). The question is, how does association accomplish this?

To see how it does, we must look (1) more closely at the concept of association, (2) at Hartley's notion of “transference,” and (3) at the series of psychological orientations association and transference generate. And as we do so, we should keep in mind that many of those who studied the Observations in the dissenting academies appear to have valued Hartley primarily as a moral theorist and exemplar — for, that is, his description of the path of moral transformation. Such is a common theme in their recollections.

(1) We noted above Hartley's collaboration with his friend Stephen Hales to discover a medical treatment that would dissolve bladder stones. Following Newton, Hales believed “forces of attraction and repulsion” to be the basis of physical nature, and through various chemical experiments he demonstrated that solid concretions, including bladder stones, were compounds that had locked within themselves large quantities of “air,” which normally manifests a strongly repelling force. The “air” within a bladder stone could be released, and the stone dissolved, through reaction with an agent that would change the pH of the urine. Such chemicals are plentiful in the laboratory; the two men were looking for one that a person could safely ingest.

In his Statical Essays, Hales proposes that “air” is a component in many “animal, vegetable, and mineral substances”:

 If all the parts of matter were only endued with a strongly attracting power, whole nature would then immediately become one unactive cohering lump; wherefore it was absolutely necessary … that there should be every where intermixed with it a due proportion of strongly repelling elastick particles, … [and] that these particles should be endued with a property of resuming their elastick state, . . . that thereby this beautiful frame of things might be maintained in a continual round of the production and dissolution of animal and vegetable bodies. (Hales 1769, 1:314-15)

A seemingly inert particle of matter contains within itself forces of attraction and repulsion in a dynamic equilibrium. (Hence the readiness of the particles constituting the nerves to “vibrate.”) In such particles concretions and dissolutions occur continuously; the materials within the bodies of living things form, dissolve, and form again — “that thereby this beautiful frame of things might be maintained.”

Hartley extends these chemical concepts to psychology. As an analogy to the forces of “attraction” and “repulsion,” he writes of both “associations” and “counter-associations” at work in generating the frame of a person's self. The role of association is obvious — through “joint impression,” it generates “ideas,” including the complex movements that are the basis of the decomplex actions we perform every day. And as we shall see shortly, psychological associations form (“model”) the basic orientations of the self. But “counter-associations” are equally vital. The counter-associations in our dreams, for example, are “of singular use to us, by interrupting and breaking the course of our associations. For, if we were always awake, some accidental associations would be cemented by continuance, as that nothing could afterwards disjoin them, which would be madness” (OM 1, prop. 91). A sane mind, therefore, is one “maintained in a continual round of the production and dissolution” — in, that is, a dynamic balance of connection and detachment, memory and forgetting, that holds out the possibility of change and transformation.

(2) We noted in the discussion of action that, in Hartley's theory, a child gains voluntary control over his body through a series of substitutions. A similar series of substitutions, or “transferences” of emotion, are at work in the formation of a person's character. For example, Hartley offers a fascinating, detailed account of how the spontaneous gesture by which a frightened, abused child raises his hand to ward off a blow becomes, through a series of such transferences, the blow the abusing adult directs in anger at a helpless child (OM 1, prop. 97). Here, the links by which fear is transferred, and transmuted into anger, include the situational, symbolic, and semantic: from, for example, being struck to the “signs and tokens” of an impending beating — e.g., the bottle of gin, or the words of abuse and affection, the curses and kisses, that attend drunkenness.

(3) Hartley offers an original model of psychological development. The various emotional states (“pleasures and pains”) we experience structure themselves into “six classes”: imagination, ambition, self-interest, sympathy, theopathy, and the moral sense. These form two groups of three, each consisting of two basic orientations and a means of regulating them.

The first group consists of imagination, the orientation toward objects as sources of pleasure or displeasure, and of ambition, whereby pleasure or pain derive from one's awareness of one's standing in the eyes of others. In this group self-interest is the ego, which attempts to manage and satisfy the demands of imagination and ambition. The second group combines sympathy, the orientation of personal intersubjectivity, and theopathy, the person's relationship with the divine. (“Theopathy” appears to be Hartley's invention.) Hartley calls the moral sense (a term then in widespread use) the “monitor” of sympathy and theopathy; it is a higher ego, or self, beyond the ego.

The psychological structure the groups represent is epigenetic and transformative. Like the accounts of twentieth-century psychologists such as Maslow, Erikson, and Kohlberg, Hartley's theory describes a process of moral development as a sequence of transformations of the self.

The process is epigenetic in that the earlier orientations “model” the orientations that follow them. A young child, for example, enjoys a pleasure of imagination when playing with new toys; but when that pleasure transfers to the status that derives from being perceived by others to be a (good) child who has a collection of prized toys, the child is now experiencing a pleasure of ambition. And imagination and ambition then “model” self-interest, as the child weighs the pleasures and pains, benefits and costs, of actually playing with the toys versus keeping them on the shelf for purposes of display. The problem remains in later life, when the pleasures of purchased objects derive more from their symbolic value than from actual use. This is especially the case when the purchases are made to satisfy the pleasures of ambition — of being perceived as the kind of person who can own a Mercedes, or who is fluent in the constantly changing idioms of fashion.

Also contributing to the epigenetic modeling of the self is the fact that imagination, ambition, and self-interest inevitably generate counter-associations — experiences of pain or indifference where one anticipated pleasure. Indulgence in the pleasures of imagination, Hartley writes, often “lead[s] men into such a degree of solicitude, anxiety, and fearfulness, in minute affairs, as to make them inflict upon themselves greater torments, than the most cruel tyrant could invent” (OM 2, 54). Similarly with ambition: keeping up with the “latest” fashion (in cars, clothes, or philosophers) for the sake of winning others' approval is hard work.

“We do, and must, upon our entrance into the world, begin with idolatry to external things, and, as we advance in it, proceed to the idolatry of ourselves” (OM 2, prop. 4). Some thus remain, anxiously pouring their sacrifices over these concretions. In others the inevitable, painful counter-associations act as solvents, and cause the stony idols to disintegrate. Sympathy and theopathy replace imagination and ambition as “primary pursuits,” the fundamental modes of experience and interaction. Hartley calls this reorienting transformation the “annihilation of self.”

This “annihilation” is not quasi-mystical obliteration; rather, it is a reorientation toward, or discovery of, a higher self of sympathy, theopathy, and the moral sense. It involves liberation from what William Blake calls the “mind-forged manacles” of a self-created and self-regarding hell and an awakening to one's true humanity.

Once they are “modeled,” the higher orientations “new-model” the lower. For the person for whom sympathy and theopathy are primary pursuits, imagination and ambition remain modes of interaction, but modes that are transformed. Beauty may now be perceived in people and things previously passed over with indifference or distaste. And one's happiness, indeed one's hopes for one's self, may be linked with the happiness of people one previously sought to avoid.

This does not mean, for Hartley, that life gets easier. Rather he describes the path as increasingly difficult. Although profoundly optimistic about the ultimate future of humanity — he is describing, after all, how association tends “to reduce the state of those who have eaten of the tree of the knowledge of good and evil, back again to a paradisiacal one” — he is acutely aware of the many bypaths of human self-deception and destructiveness. He is especially conscious of the dangers facing those whose primary pursuit concerns being sympathetic, theopathic, and morally perceptive. Such a person can become “a bitter persecuting spirit” (OM 1, prop. 97). In general, the “higher” the level of moral and spiritual attainment, the greater the potential for a crippling, demonic destructiveness. In this regard, reading Hartley one encounters a vision of human nature as deeply conflicted, struggling against itself — a view similar to what one finds in Dostoyevsky or Kierkegaard.

Although Hartley identifies “sympathy” and “theopathy” as basic orientations, the orientations do not necessarily have a positive content. Hartley does not claim that everyone is kind to others, or loves God. In some, these modes are pathological, and theopathy is often only rudimentarily developed. In discussing the “associations [that] may be observed in fact to be heaped upon” the word God, he observes that these begin with the “compound fictitious idea” children form when they “suppose [God] to stand for a man whom they have never seen” and that they end, for many people, when this idea “is quite obliterated, without anything of a stable precise nature succeeding in its room” (OM 1, prop. 98). Many adults live with feelings of fear, aversion, boredom, and sometimes an ardent longing, directed at a blankness — a mental picture, from which the central image has been effaced.

Hartley's model of the self in terms of imagination, ambition, and self-interest, and then of sympathy, theopathy, and the moral sense, is dynamically complex. In his moral psychology, emotions are like electrical charges that easily jump from one object, symbol, word, or thought to another. Through such “transferences” of emotion, the six orientations develop content; like physical concretions, they coalesce, as emotional energies are bonded together. And when the energy in one is sufficiently strong, the orientation becomes the person's “primary pursuit”: it demands accretion of pleasure.

Still, the model is not static, with the self fossilizing into “one unactive cohering lump.” Thanks to the interplay of associations and counter-associations, the six orientations both “model” and “new-model” each other. Psycholgical bodies are, as Hales said of vegetable and animal bodies, in “a continual round of the production and dissolution” — until such time, Hartley believed, as when all shall discover their identity in that “mystical body” in which “all have an equal care for each other's [happiness]; all increase in love, and come to their full stature, to perfect manhood, by that which every joint supplieth” (OM 2, prop. 68; cf. Ephesians 4.16).


Primary Literature

Listed are the two most commonly available editions of the Observations on Man, both of which have been reprinted in paperback. Because the text of all editions is the same, citations in this article are to volume and proposition, rather than to page in any given edition. Users of the one-volume 1791 edition should note that the propositions are numbered consecutively throughout, so that propostion 1 in volume 2 of the 1749 edition is proposition 101. Readers referring to the 1775 abridgement should note that the propositions included in that volume are numbered consecutively in that volume, and hence do not correspond to the other editions.

Selected Other Works by Hartley

Works Cited

Secondary Sources

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Bayes' Theorem | Berkeley, George | Descartes, René | Hume, David | Locke, John | Newton, Isaac | Reid, Thomas