Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Charles Hartshorne

First published Mon Jul 23, 2001; substantive revision Fri Mar 6, 2009

Charles Hartshorne (pronounced Harts-horne) is considered by many philosophers to be one of the most important philosophers of religion and metaphysicians of the twentieth century. Although Hartshorne often criticized the metaphysics of substance found in medieval philosophy, he was very much like medieval thinkers in developing a philosophy that was theocentric. Throughout his career he defended the rationality of theism and for several decades was almost alone in doing so among English-language philosophers. Hartshorne was also one of the thinkers responsible for the rediscovery of St. Anselm's ontological argument. But his most influential contribution to philosophical theism did not concern arguments for the existence of God, but rather was related to a theory of the actuality of God, i.e., how God exists. In traditional or classical theism, God was seen as the supreme, unchanging being, but in Hartshorne's process-based or neoclassical conception, God is seen as supreme becoming in which there is a factor of supreme being. That is, we humans become for a while, whereas God always becomes, Hartshorne maintains. The neoclassical view of Hartshorne has influenced the way many philosophers understand the concept of God. In fact, a small number of scholars—some philosophers and some theologians—think of him as the greatest metaphysician of the second half of the twentieth century, yet, with a few exceptions to be treated below, his work has not been very influential among analytic philosophers who are theists.

1. Life

Charles Hartshorne was born in the nineteenth century and lived to philosophize in the twenty-first. He was born in Kittanning, Pennsylvania (U.S.A.) on June 5, 1897. He was, like Alfred North Whitehead, the son of an Anglican minister, although many of his ancestors were Quakers. After attending Haverford College he served in World War One in France as a medic, taking a box of philosophy books with him to the front. After the war Hartshorne received his doctorate in philosophy at Harvard, and there he met Whitehead. Most of the major elements of Hartshorne's philosophy were already apparent by the time he became familiar with Whitehead's thought, contrary to a popular misconception. From 1923-1925 a postdoctoral fellowship took him to Germany, where he had classes with both Husserl and Heidegger. But neither of these thinkers influenced his philosophy as much as C.S. Peirce, whose collected papers he edited with Paul Weiss. In addition to many visiting appointments, Hartshorne spent his teaching career at three institutions. From 1928-1955 he taught at the University of Chicago, where he was a dominant intellectual force in the School of Divinity, despite the fact that he was housed in the Philosophy Department, where he was not nearly as influential. He was at Emory University from 1955 until 1962, when he moved to the University of Texas at Austin. Hartshorne eventually became a long-term emeritus professor at Austin and lived there until his death on October 9, 2000. His wife, Dorothy, was as colorful as her husband and was mentioned often in his writings. Hartshorne never owned an automobile, nor did he smoke or drink alcohol or caffeine; he had a passion for birdsong and became an internationally known expert in the field.

2. Method

Three primary methodological devices or procedures are at work in Hartshorne's metaphysics. First, he very often uses a systematic exhaustion of theoretical options—or the development of position matrices, sometimes containing thirty-two alternatives(!)—in considering philosophical problems. This procedure is evident throughout his philosophy, but it is most apparent in his various treatments of the ontological argument. To take another example, he thinks it important to notice that regarding the mind-body problem there are three options available to us, not two, as is usually assumed: some form of dualism, some form of the materialist view that psyche is reducible to body, and some form of the panpsychist (or, as he terms it, psychicalist) view that body is in some way reducible to psyche if all concrete singulars (e.g., cells or electrons) in some way show signs of self-motion or activity. Thomas Nagel famously considers this third option, but Hartshorne actually defends it.

Second, Hartshorne frequently uses the history of philosophy to see which of the logically possible options made available by position matrices have been defended before so as to avail ourselves of the insights of others in the effort to examine in detail the consistency of these positions and to assess their consequences. Nonetheless, those logically possible options that have not historically found support should be analyzed both in terms of internal consistency and practical ramifications. It should be noted that Hartshorne's use of the history of philosophy often involves lesser known views of famous thinkers (like Plato's belief in God as the soul for the body of the whole natural world, or Leibniz's defense of panpsychism) as well as the thought of lesser known thinkers (such as Faustus Socinus, Nicholas Berdyaev, or Jules Lecquier).

Third, after a careful reading of the history of philosophy has facilitated the conceptual and pragmatic examination of all the available options made explicit by a position matrix, the (Greek) principle of moderation is used by Hartshorne as a guide to negotiate the way between extreme views on either side. For example, regarding the issue of personal identity, the view of Hume (and of Bertrand Russell at one stage in his career) is that, strictly speaking, there is no personal identity in that each event in “a person's life” is externally related to the others. This is just as disastrous, Hartshorne thinks, as Leibniz's view that all such events are internally related to the others, so that implicit in the fetus are all the experiences of the adult. (This Leibnizian view relies on the classical theistic, strong notion of omniscience, wherein God knows in minute detail and with absolute assurance what will happen in the future.) The Humean view fails to explain the continuity we experience in our lives and the Leibnizian view fails to explain the indeterminateness we experience when considering the future. The truth lies between these two extremes, Hartshorne thinks. His view of personal identity is based on a conception of time as asymmetrical in which later events in a person's life are internally related to former events, but they are externally related to those that follow, thus leading to a position that is at once partially deterministic and partially indeterministic. That is, the past supplies necessary but not sufficient conditions for human identity in the present, which always faces a partially indeterminate future.

Only the first of these methodological devices or procedures supports the widely held claim that Hartshorne is a rationalist. His overall method is a complex one that involves the other two methods or procedures, where he does borrow from the rationalists, but also from the pragmatists and the Greeks. It must be admitted, however, that Hartshorne was educated in a philosophic world still heavily influenced by late nineteenth and early twentieth century idealism.

3. The Existence and Actuality of God

Philosophers commonly use a metaphor that suggests that the chain of an argument, say for the existence of God, is only as strong as its weakest link. Hartshorne rejects this metaphor on Peircian grounds. He replaces it by suggesting that various arguments for the existence of God—ontological, cosmological, design, etc.—are like mutually reinforcing strands in a cable.

He argues that Hume's and Kant's criticisms of the ontological argument of St. Anselm are not directed at the strongest version of his argument found in Proslogion, chapter 3. Here, he thinks, there is a modal distinction implied between existing necessarily and existing contingently. Hartshorne's view is that existence alone might not be a real predicate, but existing necessarily certainly is. To say that something exists without the possibility of not existing is to say something significant about the being in question. That is, contra Kant and others, Hartshorne believes that there are necessary truths concerning existence. To say that absolute nonexistence in some fashion exists is to contradict oneself; hence he thinks that absolute nonexistence is unintelligible. It is necessarily the case that something exists, he thinks, and, relying on the ontological argument, he also thinks it necessarily true that God exists.

On Hartshorne's view, metaphysics does not deal with realities beyond the physical, but rather with those features of reality that are ubiquitous or that would exist in any possible world. And he does not think that it is possible to think of a preeminent being that only existed contingently since if it did exist contingently rather than necessarily, it would not be preeminent. That is, God's existence is either impossible (positivism) or possible, and, if possible, then necessary (theism). He is assuming here that there are three alternatives for us to consider: (1) God is impossible; (2) God is possible, but may or may not exist; (3) God exists necessarily. The ontological argument shows that the second alternative makes no sense. Hence, he thinks that the prime task for the philosophical theist is to show that God is not impossible.

In addition, Hartshorne's detailed treatment of the argument from design is connected to his view of biology. It is hard to reconcile an omnipotent, classical theistic God with all of the monstrosities and chance mutations produced in nature, but the general orderliness of the natural world is just as difficult to reconcile with there being no Orderer or Persuader at all. Belief in God as omnipotent, he thinks, has three problems: (1) it is at odds with the disorderliness in nature; (2) it yields the acutest form of the theodicy problem; and (3) it conflicts with the notion from Plato's Sophist, defended by Hartshorne, that being is dynamic power (dynamis). An omnipotent being would ultimately have all power over others, who would ultimately be powerless. But any being-in-becoming, according to Hartshorne, has some power to affect, or to be affected by, others; this power, however slight, provides counterevidence to a belief in divine omnipotence. In contrast, God is ideally powerful, on the Hartshornian view. That is, God is as powerful as it is possible to be, given the partial freedom and power of creatures.

Hartshorne's dispute with traditional or classical philosophical theism concerns not so much the existence of God, but rather its assumption that the actuality of God (i.e., how God exists) could be described in the same terms as the existence of God. A God who exists necessarily is not necessary or unchanging in every other respect (e.g., in terms of divine responsiveness to creaturely changes), he thinks. Although Hartshorne believes that the medieval thinkers were correct in trying to think through the logic of perfection, he also thinks that this logic has traditionally been misapplied in the effort to articulate the attributes of a being called “God,” roughly defined as the greatest conceivable being. The traditional or classical theistic logic of perfection sees God as monopolar in that regarding various contrasts (permanence-change, one-many, activity-passivity, etc.) the traditional or classical philosophical theist has chosen one element in each pair as a divine attribute (the former element of each pair) and denigrated the other.

By way of contrast, Hartshorne's logic of perfection is dipolar. Within each element of these pairs there are good features that should be attributed in the preeminent sense to God (e.g., excellent permanence in the sense of steadfastness, excellent change in the sense of preeminent ability to respond to the sufferings of creatures). In each element in these pairs there are also invidious features (e.g., pigheaded stubbornness, fickleness). The task for the philosophical theist, he thinks, is to attribute the excellences of both elements of these pairs to God and to eschew the invidious aspects of both elements. However, it should be noted that some contrasts are not fit for dipolar analysis (e.g., good-evil) in that “good good” is a redundancy and “evil good” is a contradiction. The greatest conceivable being, he thinks, cannot be evil in any sense whatsoever.

Hartshorne does not claim to believe in two gods, nor does he wish to defend a cosmological dualism. In fact, we can see that the opposite is the case when we consider that, in addition to calling his theism dipolar, he refers to it as a type of panentheism, which literally means that all is in the one God by means of omniscience (as Hartshorne defines the term) and omnibenevolence. All creaturely feelings, especially feelings of suffering, are included in the divine life. God is seen by Hartshorne as the mind or soul for the whole body of the natural world (see above regarding Plato's World Soul), although he thinks of God as distinguishable from the creatures. Another way to categorize Hartshorne's theism is to see it as neoclassical in the sense that he relies on the classical or traditional theistic proofs for the existence of God and on the classical theistic metaphysics of being as first steps in the effort to think through properly the logic of perfection. However, these efforts need to be supplemented, he thinks, by the efforts of those who see becoming as more inclusive than being. God is not outside of time, as in the Boethian view that is influential among traditional philosophical theists, but rather exists through all of time, on Hartshorne's view. On the neoclassical view, God's permanent “being” consists in steadfast benevolence exhibited through everlasting becoming.

God is omniscient, on Hartshorne's view, but “omniscience” here refers to the divine ability to know everything that is knowable: past actualities as already actualized; present realities to the extent that they are knowable according to the laws of physics (e.g., what is present epistemically may very well be the most recent past, given the speed of light); and future possibilities or probabilities as possibilities or probabilities. On the traditional or classical conception of omniscience, however, God has knowledge of future possibilities or probabilities as already actualized. According to Hartshorne, this is not an example of supreme knowledge, but is rather an example of ignorance of the (at least partially) indeterminate character of the future.

The asymmetrical view of time, common to process thinkers in general (e.g., Bergson, Whitehead, Hartshorne), in which the relationship between the present and the past is radically different from the relationship between the present and the future, also has implications for Hartshorne's theodicy. A plurality of partially free agents, including nonhuman ones, facing a future that is neither completely determined nor foreknown in detail, makes it not only possible, but likely, that these agents will get in each other's way, clash, and cause each other to suffer. On this view, God is the fellow sufferer who understands.

4. Axiology

Hartshorne views the cosmos as a “metaphysical monarchy,” with God as the presiding, but not omnipotent, head, and he sees human society as a “metaphysical democracy,” with each member as an equal. This makes him a liberal in politics if “liberalism” refers to the egalitarian belief that none of us is God. Although Hartshorne and Whitehead are both political liberals, Hartshorne is, despite his view of panpsychist reality as thoroughly social, more of a libertarian liberal and Whitehead more of a redistributive liberal. In axiology as well as in metaphysics/theodicy, freedom is crucial, on Hartshorne's view.

Hartshorne's panpsychism (or psychicalism) entails the belief that each active singular in nature, even those like electrons and plant cells that do not exhibit mentality, is nonetheless a center of intrinsic, and not merely instrumental, value. As a result, Hartshorne's metaphysics is meant to provide a basis for both an aesthetic appreciation of the value in nature, as well as for an environmental ethics where intrinsic and instrumental values in nature are weighed.

As a published expert on bird song, Hartshorne is the first philosopher since Aristotle to be an expert in both metaphysics and ornithology. He writes specifically of the aesthetic categories required to explain why birds sing outside of mating season and when territory is not threatened—two occasions for bird song that are crucial to the behaviorists' account. Birds like to sing, he concludes.

Hartshorne's criticism of anthropocentrism is due not only to his concern for God, but also for beings-in-becoming who experience in a less sophisticated way than humans. To say that all active singulars feel—leaving out of the picture abstractions like “twoness” or insentient composites of active singulars that do not themselves feel as wholes—is not to say that they are self-conscious or that they think. As before, however, Hartshorne's axiology is ultimately theocentric in character.

5. Critical Evaluation

It seems fair to say that analytic philosophers, in general, even analytic philosophers who are theists, have largely ignored Hartshorne's philosophy. (The point is debateable. There has been a move among many analytic philosophers who are theists away from the eternal, Boethian God who is outside of time altogether. Might it be that Hartshorne's influence is greater than initially appears to be the case when the temporality, or the sempiternity, of the God of many analytic philosophers is concerned?) This is in contrast to his wide influence among theologians, which is odd when it is considered that he is not a theologian and does not rely on sacred scripture or religious authority for his insights. Another oddity is the fact that Hartshorne's influence among theologians is due to the defense he offers of the rationality of belief in a neoclassical God.

There is at least one important philosopher whose work indicates the sort of debate that has occurred between Hartshorne and analytic theists, who tend to rely on traditional or classical versions of the concept of God. That is William Alston. There are two reasons why an evaluation of Hartshorne's philosophy is facilitated by a consideration of Alston's critique. First, Alston is as important a theist as any among analytic philosophers and his criticisms of Hartshorne's thought are like those of other analytic philosophers like Thomas Morris, Richard Creel, Michael Durrant, Colin Gunton, and others. And second, Alston is a former student of Hartshorne's and is thoroughly familiar with Hartshorne's arguments. Alston is a philosopher who is not scandalized by Hartshorne's panentheism, nor by his neoclassical theism. But Alston thinks that the contrast that Hartshorne draws between his neoclassical theism and the classical theism of Thomas Aquinas is too sharp.

Alston thinks that Hartshorne presents neoclassical theism and classical theism as complete packages, whereas it would be better to be able to pick and choose among individual items within these packages. Alston seeks some sort of rapprochement between Thomism and neoclassical theism, a rapprochement that Hartshorne himself would like to bring about to the extent that he is a neoclassical thinker, but that is difficult to accomplish to the extent that he is neoclassical.

A consideration of ten contrasting attributes will best facilitate an initial understanding of Hartshorne's view of God. Consider the first group of attributes treated by Alston.

1. absoluteness (absence of internal relatedness) 1. relativity (God is internally related to creatures by way of knowledge of them and actions toward them)
2. pure actuality (there is no potentiality in God) 2. potentiality (not everything is actualized that is possible for God)
3. total necessity (every truth about God is necessarily true) 3. necessity and contingency (God exists necessarily, but various things are true of God contingently, e.g., God's knowledge of what is contingent)
4. absolute simplicity 4. complexity

Alston distinguishes two lines of argument regarding absoluteness and relativity, which he sees as the key contrast. Alston thinks that only one of these is successful. As indicated in the diagram above, what Hartshorne means by absoluteness is absence of internal relatedness. A relation is internal to a term of a relation just in case that term would not be exactly as it is if it were not in that relationship. Hartshorne's view is that God has internal relations to creatures by way of knowing and acting towards them.

On Alston's interpretation, Hartshorne's first line of argument is to say that if the relation of the absolute to the world really fell outside the absolute, then this relation would necessarily fall within some further and genuinely single entity that embraced both the absolute and the world and the relations between them. Thus, we must hold, according to Hartshorne, that the God-creature relation is internal to God; otherwise we will have to admit that there is something greater or more inclusive than God. Alston does not find this argument convincing because it includes the claim that God “contains” the world due to the internal relations God has with the world. Alston's view is that the entity to which a relation is internal contains the terms only in the sense that those terms enter into a description of the entity, but it does not follow from this that those terms are contained in that entity as marbles are in a box.

Divine inclusiveness, for Hartshorne, is sometimes like the inclusion of thoughts in a mind, but usually it is described as like the inclusion of cells within a living body. It is never like the inclusion of marbles in a box. The inorganic and insentient character of a box is inadequate as a model for divinity, he thinks, and divine inclusiveness is never like the inclusion of theorems in a set of axioms, as it might be for certain idealists. Divine inclusiveness in Hartshorne is organic inclusiveness.

Hartshorne's second argument against absoluteness fares much better, according to Alston. He agrees with Hartshorne's stance regarding the cognitive relation God has with the world; in any case of knowledge, the knowledge relation is internal to the subject, external to the object. When a human being knows something, the fact that she knows it is part of what makes her the concrete being that she is. If she recognizes a certain tree she is different from the being she might have been if she had not recognized the tree. But the tree is unaffected by her recognition. Likewise, according to Alston, one cannot maintain that God has perfect knowledge of everything knowable and still hold that God is not qualified to any degree by relations with other beings.

One might respond to Alston and Hartshorne on this point by saying that since creatures depend for their existence on God, their relations to God affect them, but not God. Richard Creel seems to make this very point. But even if beings other than God depend for their existence on God, it still remains true that if God had created a different world from the one that exists at present, then God would be somewhat different from the way God is at present: God's knowledge would have been of that world and not this one, according to both Alston and Hartshorne.

Alston's concessions to Hartshorne's concept of God extend to contrasts 2-4. The above argument for the internal relatedness of God (as cognitive subject) to the world presupposes that there are alternative possibilities for God, and if there are alternative possibilities for divine knowledge then this implies that there are unrealized potentialities for God. Pure actuality and total necessity cannot be defended as divine attributes, according to Alston and Hartshorne. Alston's version of Hartshorne's argument goes as follows:

(1) (a) “God knows that W exists” entails (b) “W exists.”

(2) If (a) were necessary, (b) would be necessary.

(3) But (b) is contingent.

(4) Hence (a) is contingent.

We can totally exclude contingency from God only by denying God any knowledge of anything contingent, a step that not even traditional or classical theists wish to take. Contrast 4 must also be treated in a dipolar way in that the main support for a doctrine of pure divine simplicity is the absence of any unrealized potentialities in God.

In sum, Alston and Hartshorne agree on contrasts 1-4, except for the fact that Hartshorne's concept of divine inclusiveness, in contrast to Alston's, is organic in character.

Regarding a second group of attribues, however, Alston and many other theists who are analytic philosophers diverge from Hartshorne rather significantly:

5. creation ex nihilo by a free act of will; God could have refrained from creating anything 5. both God and the world of creatures exist necessarily, although the details are contingent
6. omnipotence (God has the power to do anything God wills to do that is logically consistent) 6. God has all the power one agent could have given metaphysical, in addition to logical, limitations
7. incorporeality 7. corporeality (the world is the body of God)
8. nontemporality (God does not live through a series of moments) 8. temporality (God lives through temporal succession, but everlastingly)
9. immutability (God cannot change because God is not temporally successive) 9. mutability (God is continually attaining richer syntheses of experience)
10. absolute perfection (God is eternally that than which no more perfect can be conceived) 10. relative perfection (at any moment God is more perfect than any other, but God is self-surpassing at a later stage of development)

Concerning contrast 5, Alston takes creation ex nihilo to be fundamental to theism because it has deep roots in religious experience. He thinks that to say that God has unrealized potentialities and contingent properties is not to say that God must be in relation with some world of entities other than God. Alston admits that Hartshorne legitimately points out some of the internal contradictions contained in the classical theistic version of creation ex nihilo, but he claims that there is no connection drawn by Hartshorne between divine creation and metaphysical principles regarding relativity, contingency, and potentiality. Alston's belief seems to be that those who accept creation ex nihilo are not saying that there is absolutely nothing at any stage: there is God. Rather, creation ex nihilo only means that there is nothing out of which God creates the universe. Here Alston seems to agree with Norman Kretzmann, Eleonore Stump, and most other theists who are analytic philosophers.

Alston's stance here is problematic for two reasons, from Hartshorne's point of view. First, although belief in some sort of divine creativity has deep roots in the history of religious experience, it is not clear that these roots have to tap into creation ex nihilo. For example, it is not clear that creation ex nihilo is the sort of creation described in Genesis, in that when the Bible starts with the statement that the spirit of God hovered above the waters, one gets the impression that both God and the aqueous muck had been around forever. If one believes in creation ex nihilo, however, as Alston does, one might nonetheless claim that creation ex nihilo does not necessarily mean a temporal beginning to the act of creation. But even on this hypothesis there are problems, and this would seem to be Hartshorne's second point. If Plato and Hartshorne are correct that being is dynamic power, then the sort of unlimited power implied by creation ex nihilo is impossible. Hartshorne would argue, contra Alston, that there is a connection between belief in creation ex hyle (as opposed to creation ex nihilo) and the metaphysical principle that being is dynamic power. Creation ex nihilo, Hartshorne thinks, is a convenient fiction invented in the first centuries B.C.E. and C.E. in order to exalt divine power, but it is not the only sort of creation that religious believers have defended, nor is it defensible if being is dynamic power.

Concerning contrast 6, Alston claims that belief in creation ex nihilo and belief in divine omnipotence are separate beliefs such that to argue against the former is not necessarily to argue against the latter. Hartshorne tries to do too much, he thinks, with the claim that being is power when he uses this claim to argue against divine omnipotence. According to Alston, God can have unlimited power, power to do anything that God wills to do, without having all power in that, if being is power, the creatures also have some power.

On Hartshorne's interpretation of Alston, however, God can have unlimited power, but not all power, because God delegates some power to others. Although God does not have all power, Hartshorne thinks that on Alston's view God could have all power. In effect, what Alston has done, according to Hartshorne, is reduce his stance regarding divine omnipotence to that regarding creation ex nihilo in that the claim that God could have all power is due to the prior belief that God brings everything into existence out of absolutely nothing, a belief that Alston thinks has to be the traditional one and in point of fact is intelligible. It is not quite clear to Hartshorne, however, that it is unquestionably the traditional one, nor is it clear to him that we can develop an intelligible concept of “absolutely nothing.”

Hartshorne's Platonic or Bergsonian argument against creation ex nihilo, in simplified form, looks something like this: one can in fact imagine the nonexistence of this or that, or even of this or that class of things, a fact that gives some the confidence to (erroneously) think that this process can go on infinitely such that one could imagine a state in which there was “absolutely nothing.” However, not every verbally possible statement is made conceptually cogent by even the most generous notion of “conceptual,” according to Hartshorne. At the specific, ordinary, empirical level negative instances are possible, but at the generic, metaphysical level only positive instances are possible, on this view. The sheer absence of reality cannot conceivably be experienced, he thinks, for if it were experienced an existing experiencer would be presupposed.

Contrast 7 deals with divine embodiment. Alston is willing to grant that God is embodied in two senses: (1) God is aware, with maximal immediacy, of what goes on in the world; and (2) God can directly affect what happens in the world. That is, Alston defends a limited version of divine embodiment, similar to that defended by Richard Swinburne. However, Alston is sceptical regarding a stronger version of divine embodiment wherein the world exists by metaphysical necessity such that God must animate it. Alston is willing to accept the idea that God has a body, but only if having such a body is on God's terms. It seems that this weaker version of divine embodiment defended by Alston, as opposed to Hartshorne's stronger version wherein there is essential corporeality in God, stands or falls with the defense of creation ex nihilo. In fact, despite Alston's desire to examine each contrast individually, as opposed to Hartshorne's stark contrast between classical theistic attributes (all ten of them) and neoclassical attributes (all ten of them), he ends up linking his criticisms of Hartshorne regarding contrasts 5-7, at the very least. All three of these classical theistic attributes stand together only with a defensible version of creation ex nihilo.

Contrasts 8-9, concerning nontemporality and immutability, are also linked by Alston. He concedes that if God is temporal, Hartshorne has offered us the best version to date of what divine temporality and divine mutability would be like. Alston dismisses as idle the view that God could remain completely unchanged through a succession of temporal moments, but this admission still leaves us, he thinks, with the following conditional statement: “God undergoes change if God is in time.” Alston's critique of Hartshorne's view also consists in a refusal to grant that contingency and temporality are coextensive in the way mutability and temporality are. Alston believes, contra Hartshorne, that God can be in some way contingent (that any relation in which God stands to the world might have been otherwise) and still be nontemporal.

Alston knows that the notion of a nontemporal God who is qualified by relation to temporal beings will strike Hartshorne as unintelligible. Alston's attempt to make his position intelligible rests on his own Thomistic-Whiteheadian stance, or better, on his Thomistic or Boethian interpretation of Whitehead (strange as this seems). We should not think of God as involved in process or becoming of any sort. The best temporal analogy, he thinks, for this conception is an unextended instant or an “eternal now.” For Alston this does not commit one, however, as Hartshorne would allege, to a static deity frozen in immobility. On the contrary, according to Alston, God is eternally active in ways that do not require temporal succession. God's acts can be complete in an instant. Alston includes God's acts of knowledge, a stance that at least seems to conflict with one of the concessions he made to Hartshorne regarding the first group of attributes.

The Boethian-Thomistic notion of the specious present for God, on the analogue of a human being's perceiving some temporally extended stretch of a process in one temporally indivisible act, is also defended by Alston. For example, one can perceive the flight of a bee “all at once” without first perceiving the first half of the stretch of flight and then perceiving the second. One's perception can be without temporal succession even if the object of one's perception is, in fact, temporally successive. All we have to do, on Alston's view, is expand our specious present to cover all of time and we have a model for God's awareness of the world. This is a much more difficult project for Hartshorne to imagine than it is for Alston. Apparently Alston thinks that it is easy to conceptualize God “seeing” Neanderthal man (or Adam), Moses, Jesus, and Dorothy Day all at once in their immediacy. Here Alston has a view similar to that of William Mann.

But even if it were possible to have nonsuccessive awareness of a vast succession, which Hartshorne would deny, it is even more implausible, from Hartshorne's point of view, to claim, as does Alston, that God could have nonsuccessive responses to stages of that succession. It might make more sense for Alston to say “indesponses” or “presponses” rather than “responses,” as Creel would urge.

It is correct of Alston to notice that there is no loss in God, but this is not incompatible with God's temporality, according to Hartshorne. There can be succession in God without there being loss or perishing due to the fact that God's inheritance of what happens in the world and God's memory are ideal. Hartshorne thinks that the future is incomplete and indeterminate for God as well as from our limited perspective. Alston, by way of contrast, wants to defend a God who is not strictly necessary in actuality, but is contingent, despite the fact that God does not undergo temporal change, nor is God fluent. Hartshorne's defenders, by way of contrast, think that one of the greatest virtues of process thinking is its effort to eliminate what they see as such self-contradiction in philosophical theology.

Alston's treatment of contrast 10, concerning absolute versus relative perfection, follows from what he has said regarding contrasts 8-9. Relative perfection in God, as opposed to absolute perfection, has a point only for a temporal being; hence God is absolutely perfect, according to Alston. A being that does not successively assume different states could not possibly surpass itself. Here, once again, Alston engages in linkage, thereby, at the very least, confirming Hartshorne's belief that we need both to consider the divine attributes together and to determine whether the classical theist's linkage or the neoclassical theist's linkage is more defensible. For the most past, Alston opts for classical theism. Or more precisely, he thinks that the strongest concept of God is acquired when we take a modified version of the neoclassical attributes in contrasts 1-4 and combine them with the classical attributes in contrasts 5-10.

This rapproachement in Alston between classical theism and neoclassical theism is a step beyond James Ross's belief that these are two competing descriptions of God at an impasse. Hartshorne seems to agree with Ross. Neoclassical, dipolar theism already includes the best insights of classical theism, he thinks.

From Hartshorne's point of view the linkage of attributes within the first group and within the second group needs to be corrected by a greater concern for reticulating the attributes in these two groups. He thinks that an explanation is needed regarding how Alston can be committed to both monopolar and dipolar theism. For example, Alston ends up defending the view that God is changed by the objects God knows (pace the neoclassical, dipolar attributes), but these are not changes that occur in time (pace the classical, monopolar attributes). It is one thing, Hartshorne thinks, to say that God exists in a nontemporal specious present, and it is another to say that God is changed by temporal beings in a nontemporal specious present. The former view is at least problematic, he thinks, and the latter seems to be part of the traditional classical theistic view wherein, from a Hartshornian perspective, inconsistency goes in the guise of mystery.


Books by Hartshorne

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Related Entries

Anselm, Saint [Anselm of Bec, Anselm of Canterbury] | cosmology: and theology | immutability | ontological arguments | panpsychism | Peirce, Charles Sanders | process philosophy | religion: epistemology of | theism: process | time | Whitehead, Alfred North