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Henry of Ghent

First published Wed Dec 19, 2007

Henry of Ghent (b. 1217?, d. 1293) is perhaps the most prominent figure at the Faculty of Theology in Paris during the last quarter of the 13th century; that is, of the next generation after the death of Thomas Aquinas. For a long time it was thought that Henry was a conservative theologian, engaged in the defence of the Augustinian tradition against the risks deriving from the spread of Aristotelianism and Arabic philosophy — an impression that seemed to be confirmed by Henry's participation in the commission set up by Bishop Tempier in view of the famous condemnation of March 1277. However, the progress of the new critical edition of the Opera Omnia of Henry — begun in Leuven by Raymond Macken nearly thirty years ago and now continued by an international team — has already demonstrated that this evaluation needs to be substantially revised. Indeed, Henry sought to reconcile traditional Augustinian theories with some of the basic principles of Aristotelian epistemology and Avicennian ontology, thereby giving rise to a complex and original synthesis.

1. Life and Writings

It is not known exactly when Henry was born; his date of birth is usually placed before 1240, perhaps between 1217 and 1223, though without any concrete evidence. Information about his career is also scarce. He was in Paris in 1265; from 1267 he begins to appear in the documents as magister, as well as canon of Tournai, though nothing is known of his presumed teaching activity at the Faculty of Arts. From 1276, the year in which he disputed his first Quodlibet, until his death, Henry was Regent Master at the Faculty of Theology. Manuscript copies of his second Quodlibet, datable to 1277, indicate that he was archdeacon of Bruges. From 1279 he was archdeacon of Tournai. His name was recorded in the death register of Tournai cathedral on 23 June 1293.

During his university career in Paris Henry was personally involved in almost all of the most important events in university and ecclesiastical life. In 1277 he was a member of the commission of theologians set up by Bishop Tempier in order to censure propositions considered erroneous that were being taught at the Faculty of Arts and that would be condemned on 7 March of the same year. Nevertheless, not only did Henry affirm on several occasions that he neither understood nor approved of the condemnation of certain articles, but he himself was pressured by Tempier and the papal legate Simone di Brion to distance himself from the theory of the unicity of substantial form in man (see below, §11).

From 1281, the year of the publication of the papal bull Ad fructus uberes issued by Pope Martin IV, Henry represented the main theological reference point for the faction of prelates (secular clergy) in the clash with the regulars of the Mendicant Orders over the question of the reiteration of confession; in other words, in the prelates’ interpretation, over the obligation for all believers to confess to their parish priest, at least once a year, sins already confessed to a friar. Henry would be engaged in this violent controversy for the rest of his life and it seems that he was even temporarily suspended from teaching for not having heeded the papal legates’ warning not to hold disputes on the interpretation of privileges granted by the pope.

The last great secular master in Paris in the second half of the 13th century (together with Godfrey of Fontaines), Henry is author of a monumental, though incomplete, Summa (the part De creaturis is missing altogether, even though it was part of the work's overall plan), 15 Quodlibeta, disputed and published while writing the Summa (Gómez Caffarena, 1957) a short commentary on the Book of Genesis (Lectura ordinaria super sacram Scripturam), a lengthy treatise on the question of the privileges of Confession (Tractatus super factum praelatorum et fratrum), as well as church sermons. However, his not strictly theological production is of uncertain attribution: probably authentic are a treatise on the Syncategoremata (ms. Brugge, Stadsbibl., 510, ff. 227ra-237va) and a commentary in question form on the Physics (ms. Erfurt, Amplon. F. 349), while there is more doubt concerning an incomplete commentary, again in question form, on the Metaphysics (ms. Escorial, h.II.1; different arguments are presented in Porro 2002a and Pickavé 2007).

2. Knowledge and Truth

Rather unusual in scholastic production, the Summa by Henry does not open with a direct treatment of God, but with a lengthy analysis of the problem of human knowledge, beginning with the sceptic's question par excellence: can man know anything at all (art. 1, q. 1)? Henry refuses to pursue in depth Augustine's radical theory in q. 9 of De diversis quaestionibus 83 that we should not expect sincera veritas from the senses. As generally agreed after the rediscovery of Aristotle's works by the Latin West, since all knowledge originates in the senses, denying any value whatsoever to sensation would mean denying all possibility of knowledge in general. Taking knowledge (scire: to know) in its most generic sense, for Henry it is undeniable that man knows something; Augustine's reservations should be taken to refer to those who claim that judgment is co-extensive with sensation. If we distinguish sensorial apprehension from the intellect's judgment of it, then it is perfectly legitimate to expect truth (or a certain kind of truth) from the senses.

The next question of the same article (q. 2) poses the same initial problem in a more round-about way: can man know anything without divine intervention? Along traditional Augustinian lines, the reply should be negative, since all true knowledge can only come from divine illumination. But a unilateral solution of this type represents for Henry a serious attack on the dignity of the rational soul. The essential operation of the soul is constituted by knowledge; therefore if knowledge were not already included, at least partially, in its natural possibilities, the soul would paradoxically find itself constituted for an aim that it could never achieve. Moreover, since the senses provide true material, the intellect is certainly able to search for truth: “absolute ergo concedere oportet quod homo per suam animam absque omni speciali divina illustratione potest aliqua cognoscere, et hoc ex puris naturalibus.” (“One must therefore concede, in an absolute sense, that through his soul man can know something without any special divine illumination, on the basis of what is purely natural”; Summa, art. 1, q. 2, ed. Wilson, p. 35, ll. 118-120).

However, the above concerns knowledge in general, scire in the broadest sense. Moving on to knowledge in the strict sense, proprie scire or certitudinaliter scire, things get more complicated. As in Augustine's Soliloquia, it is important to distinguish between what is true and truth itself. Sensation only grasps id quod verum est (“what is true,” and something is true in that it is a being on the basis of the simple conversion of transcendentals). Knowledge of the truth implies something more; it implies the knowledge of the nature — the essence — of a thing, a knowledge that can only be obtained by comparing the res to its exemplar (“intentio enim veritatis in re apprehendi non potest nisi apprehendendo conformitatem eius ad suum exemplar” — “the intention of truth in a thing cannot be apprehended without apprehending its conformity to its exemplar”).

Here it is important to distinguish further, since the exemplar is a double one. In the first place, the exemplar is the universal species of the object that the mind obtains by abstraction, on the basis of sensible data. In this case, the truth of the res is the conformity between the really existing thing and its mental representation; this conformity can only be grasped by the dividing and composing intellect, in the classic Aristotelian and Thomist formula, and not by the simplex intelligentia. In the second place, the exemplar is the ideal form present in the divine mind that acts as the formal cause of creatural essences, and from this perspective the veritas of the res is its ontological conformity (Anselm's rectitudo) to its eternal model. This double relation (res-mens, res-exemplar aeternum) thereby produces a double truth, or two different levels of truth: on the one hand, the veritas of Aristotelian science, deriving from the purely natural faculties, through an abstracting process, and on the other, the sincera veritas, obtained only through divine illumination — in other words, by an act of God, not as obiectum cognitum (known object) but as ratio cognoscendi (cause or reason of knowledge).

The first truth does not have the same infallibility, purity and absolute certainty as the second; nevertheless, it is still a form of veritas, no matter how “imperfecta, obscura et nebulosa” (“imperfect, obscure and uncertain”). Indeed, it is a form that is absolutely necessary for the fulfilment of the second: the action of the divine exemplar can only work on a concept already obtained by the intellect through abstraction. For Henry, divine illumination does not directly provide the mind with any content, but rather certifies definitively (with the typical Augustinian image of the seal) the representation of a thing present in the human intellect, as coinciding with the representation existing ab aeterno in the divine intellect.

In this way, Henry creates a unique blend of Aristotle's theory of abstraction and Augustine's doctrine of divine illumination. Truth is the result of the comparison between two exemplars: the Aristotelian universal obtained by abstraction from sensible data, and the archetype present in the divine mind, which is not only the cause of the existence of things, but also their epistemic guarantee, so to speak. The action of divine illumination is therefore neither a direct donation of intelligible contents, independent of the conditions of sensible knowledge, nor is it a simple purification, preparation or refinement of the mind in order to predispose it to intellectual knowledge. Rather, it is the certification of our created exemplar by the uncreated one; in other words, by divine art (ars).

Over the years, however, Henry seems gradually to abandon this theory of the double exemplar in order to make room, on the one hand, for a reworking of the defining process of essences through their progressive determination, as described by Aristotle in the Posterior Analytics (Marrone 1985 and 2001), and on the other, for a reinterpretation of illumination as the constant presence in act, albeit in a recess of the mind (abditum mentis), of the image of God (Quodl. IX, q. 15). Concerning the first aspect, it is worth noting that in the Summa articles dedicated to the knowableness of God, an exact epistemological process is described, according to the scheme of the Posterior Analytics, that begins with the pure acquisition of the name of a thing, proceeds to the ascertainment of its essential being (the fact that a given thing is possible and not a mere figment), and arrives at knowledge of a res in itself through its definition and the successive determination of its other essential features and properties by means of an operation of the composing and dividing intellect. Concerning the second aspect, this theme would find an indirect echo in the doctrine of the ground of the soul elaborated by Dietrich of Freiberg and Meister Eckhart. This presence, to which the mind is constantly directed without any mediation, albeit through an operation of which we are almost always unaware (intelligere abditum), is for Henry what directs the mind itself to all authentic knowledge (Emery 2001).

In this evolution, particularly important is the partial rejection of the function of intelligible species (for example, in Quodl. III, q. 1 and Quodl. IV, q. 7), which anticipates the similar Nominalist solution by a couple of decades at least. More precisely, for Henry, the phantasm itself is made immaterial by the abstraction of the agent intellect and imprints itself on the possible intellect, without the mediation of the intelligible species. In other words, on the basis of the principle of economy, there is no need to have an intelligible species that is numerically distinct from the phantasm itself, as in Aquinas’ standard doctrine. The particular phantasm is made a universal phantasm by means of abstraction, and just as the universal cannot really be distinguished from particular things, so the universal phantasm cannot really be distinguished from the particular. The phantasm is therefore the efficient cause of intellectual knowledge, or better, of the first operation of the intellect (that of simple understanding).

Henry does not eliminate sensible species, however, nor does he eliminate all types of representation in the sphere of intellectual activity. Indeed, after the phantasms are impressed on the possible or potential intellect, making simple understanding possible, the intellect then forms complex judgments and produces its own species, or verbum (mental word), as a result of this activity. Even when Henry expounds the theory of the double exemplar, he always maintains that the divine exemplar acts on the verbum already formed by the intellect at the first level of knowledge, refining and transforming it into a second, more perfect, verbum that can represent the truth at the level of sincera veritas. This clearly differentiates Henry from anti-representationalists like Olivi and Ockham in his later phase, even though (pace Pasnau 1997) Henry remains one of the first authoritative masters to eliminate the mediation of intelligible species explicitly on the basis of the principle of economy (as is made further evident by the reactions of his contemporaries and the masters of the next generation).

3. Being and Thing

For Henry (as for Avicenna) every res possesses its own “certitude” (certitudo) that makes it what it is. Certitudo here means stability, consistency, and ontological self-identity: a triangle is a triangle and nothing else, white is white and nothing else. Certitudo thus expresses the objective content by which every thing is identical to itself and is distinguished from other things; in other words, certitudo expresses the essence or quidditas of a thing (“unaquaeque res habet certitudinem propriam quae est eius quidditas” — “every thing possesses its own certitude, which is its essence”). This content can be considered in itself, as independent from its physical or mental existence. In an absolute sense, every essence possesses a double indifference: with regard to actual existence or non-existence (essence in itself is simply possible), and with regard to universality and particularity. These last two aspects are really conjoined. Essence is particular in that it receives its subsistence in a given suppositum (concrete individual entity) from something-other-than-itself, while it is universal in that it is abstracted by the intellect from these singular supposita, in which it exists as one in many, in order to become predicable by many.

Yet in itself essence is just essence: “essentia est essentia tantum”. Even though for both Avicenna and Henry thing (res) and being (ens) are primary notions (or rather intentions — intentiones — the sense of which we shall soon clarify), intentio de re seems to have a certain precedence over intentio de esse, at least logically, in virtue of its double indifference. Nevertheless, the latter is concomitant with the former, since every res only exists in physical reality or in the mind. Possessing an absolute concept doesn’t mean possessing an absolute, separate existence. More simply, through such a concept, a thing can be considered, leaving aside all that does not form part of its essential content and that therefore constitutes an additional determination. For instance, physical or mental existence, particularity or universality, do not form part of “horseness” as such. Yet for this very reason “horseness” as such does not exist; instead what exists are horses as individual supposita and the universal concept of “horse”, which the mind obtains by abstraction from them. That which possesses an absolute concept can exist in act only through one of its additional dispositions, with respect to which it is nevertheless indifferent (Porro 1996, 2002b).

Indifference only concerns the way in which a thing can be considered. In reality, no essence is indifferent to the point of being equally disposed toward being and non-being. The effective indifference of essences must therefore be taken in a narrower sense (than in Avicenna too): every creatural essence tends naturally toward non-being (in Avicennian terms, no possible essence, in the absence of a cause for its existence, could exist), though this inclination can be reversed by an external cause. No essence of a thing is so rigidly oriented toward nothing that it cannot receive being-in-act through a divine action. Similarly, even when placed, in act no thing ever possesses its being in an ultimate way: if God were to withdraw His support, it would fall into non-being. Indifference as absolute neutrality is therefore only the result of an intentional analysis. In reality, every thing is always either in non-being or in being, and not in the same way, since the first of these conditions is co-extensive with the thing itself, the second depends on God.

We still need to clarify in what sense existence can be said to be concomitant with essence. Being has access to essence from the outside, in the sense that it does not strictly belong to the essential nature of a res, except in the case of God. If this were not the case, a thing (every thing) would not simply be possible in itself, but necesse esse (necessary being) on a par with God. Instead, being seems to be an accident, or rather it has almost the mode of an accident (Quodl. I, q. 9). Nevertheless, it is not an accident in the real sense, since it is not added to something pre-existing, but is rather that by virtue of which a thing exists. In other words, we cannot refer here to the Aristotelian definition of accident (that which has its being in another thing or inheres in a subject), but once again to the broader definition given by Avicenna, according to which anything that belongs to a thing, being external to the intention of its essence, can be called an accident (“Sed intelligendum quod ‘accidens’ accipitur hic largissime, secundum quod iuxta modum loquendi Avicennae ‘accidens’ rei appellatur omne quod convenit ei et est extra intentionem suae essentiae”; Quodl. II, q. 8, ed. Wielockx, p. 48, ll. 21-23). In this sense an accident is anything that is external to the intentio of a res as absolute essence, without ever being really distinct from it. With regard to essence, actual being (that is, ratio suppositi) represents an accident of this type. Being is therefore an intentio that occurs to essence without adding anything real, and so it differs from essence only intentionally.

4. The Intentional Distinction

The term intentio must not be taken in the narrow sense with which, for example, one speaks of intentiones secundae as nomina nominum (individual, genus, species, difference, property, accident, etc.), but rather as a ‘note’ (feature, trait) of the essential content of a res, which does not differ from it in any real sense, nor from its other identifiable ‘notes’, yet can nevertheless be expressed by an independent concept (“appellatur hic intentio aliquid pertinens realiter ad simplicitatem essentiae alicuius, natum praecise concipi absque aliquo alio a quo non differt re absoluta, quod similiter pertinet ad eandem.”; Quodl. V, q. 6, ed. 1518, f. 161rL). Intentio is thus the fruit of an operation of the intellect, which delves inside (for Henry intentio comes from intus tentio) the thing to which the intention itself belongs, by considering its constitutive ‘notes’ and giving rise to different concepts. It can also be said that intentions really exist in a res, but only potentially, whereas their distinction is an operation of the intellect alone.

While two distinct things differ in a real sense, all that gives rise to different concepts, albeit founded in the same simple thing, differs intentionally (“diversa intentione sunt quae fundata in simplicitate eisudem rei diversos de se formant conceptus.”; Quodl. V, q. 12, ed. 1518, f. 171rT). In an intentional distinction, in other words, the very same thing is expressed by different concepts in different ways. From this perspective, an intentional distinction seems akin to a purely logical (or reasoned) distinction, to the point that the two are often confused (“frequenter intentio ratio appellatur.”; Quodl. V, q. 12, ed. 1518, f. 171rV). Nevertheless, in the first case, one of the concepts excludes the other (one can be thought of separately, in the absence of the other), whereas in the case of a distinction based on reason the various concepts are perfectly compatible (“in diversis secundum intentionem unus conceptus secundum unum modum excludit alium secundum alium modum, non sic autem differentia sola ratione.”; Quodl. V, q. 12, ed. 1518, f. 171rV). As Henry explicitly states, this means that everything that differs in intention differs in reason too, but not vice versa. Unlike a purely logical distinction, an intentional distinction always implies a form of composition, even though this is minor with regard to that implied by a real difference.

The clearest examples of this are found in Quodl. X, q. 7, where Henry responds rather sharply to the perplexities raised by Giles of Rome over the concept itself of intentional distinction. “Man” and “rational animal” — the defined and the definition — differ only in terms of reason, whereas “white” and “rational” differ in a real sense, since it is a matter of different natures and not of concepts or intentions founded in the same res. Yet how should we consider the difference between “rational” and “animal”? This is not a distinction of reason, since the two terms are not in a relation of definition to defined, nor is it a real distinction, such as that between substance and accident, since, if this were the case, the species formed by the conjunction of “animal” and “rational” would not be a single one in itself, but only per accidens. Therefore we can only appeal to an intermediate distinction, which is precisely that which Henry defines as intentional.

For Henry there are two levels of intentional distinction: a major and a minor. In the major none of the intentions includes the other or others, even though they are all part of the same thing, and it has two modes: the distinction between the differences in man (rational, sensible, vegetative and so on) and the distinction between genus and specific difference (animal and rational). In the minor the concept of one intention includes the other but not vice versa. And here Henry lists four modes: the distinction between species and genus; the distinction between living and being in creatures; the distinction between a suppositum and its nature or essence; and the distinction between a respectus (relation) and the essence on which it is founded (Macken 1981). The distinction between being and essence belongs to the last mode. Since being is not a real accident inhering in a subject, it makes no sense to speak of a real distinction. Instead, the distinction depends on the fact that the intellect uses different concepts to indicate the being of a thing, on the one hand, and that which a thing is, on the other. Nevertheless, since essence can be thought of independently from its being, and being is not part of its content, we cannot refer here to a distinction based on reason alone. In other words, whereas the concept of actual existence always includes the concept of essence, the contrary is not true, since essence can be thought of without its being (as affirmed by Avicenna). Being and essence are therefore different intentions, not different things (as instead was maintained by Giles of Rome in his long dispute with Henry). This intentional distinction is in itself sufficient to refute the conclusion that every essence is its being.

5. Subjective Possibility and Objective Possibility

How does this conclusion accord with Avicenna's theory that intentio de re precedes intentio de esse? Essence exists in the measure in which it participates in divine being. There are nevertheless two possible interpretations of the concept of participation. In the first, essence is a kind of potential substratum that is filled by existence at the moment of its actualization. In this sense, essence would be in potency to being as matter is to form. However, as Henry often stresses in his debate with Giles, this is a “far-fetched image” (phantastica imaginatio), since likening physical generation to creation seriously compromises the idea of creation from nothing. In generation, form is not educed from nothing, but from pre-existing matter. Similarly, if essence were a potential substratum, being would not be created from nothing, but from essence itself. The second interpretation makes essence the object (that is, the term or result), not the subject of creation: essence is constituted as such in virtue of its relation of participation with the Creator.

Henry here adduces one of the most characteristic and original aspects of his metaphysical system: the distinction between potentia subiective and potentia obiective (Hödl 1963, Porro 1996). Something can be in potency with regard to a given act, either as the subject (subiectum) from which something else can or must be produced (as in the case of matter with regard to form), or as the object (obiectum) that constitutes the result itself of production (as in the case of generation, the form, or more precisely, the combination of matter and form). In the first case, the agent intervenes, impressing itself, or something else (as form), on the already available potential substratum. In the second case, there is no effective potency with regard to the acquisition of another form, but only with regard to the agent. Hence, essence is placed in act through creation, not because a form educed from its potency is impressed on it, but because it constitutes the result itself of the agent's action. Essence is not in potency in relation to being, but in relation to itself, as a totality constituted in being.

Nevertheless, this theory raises a problem. In every transmutation, what changes cannot strictly coincide with the terms themselves of the change. If essence is possibile esse and non esse, and passes from non-being to being through creation, it must be different both from non-being (the state before creation) as well as from being (the state after creation). If, on the other hand, essence were identical to one of the two terms (being, in the case in question), then there would be no change, since essence would never be in non-being. To obviate this problem, Henry seeks to refine further, especially in his later Quodlibeta, the distinction between possibile subiective and possibile obiective, so that, within certain limits (that is, from a logical rather than from an ontological perspective), essence can figure as the subiectum, and not just the terminus, of creation. Even though the passage of essence from non-being to being happens in a single, indivisible instant, it can nevertheless be subdivided logically (secundum rationem) into three different “signs” (signa); an ante litteram example of the theoretical model defined by Kretzmann and Spade as “Quasi-Aristotelianism”, especially in reference to 14th century writers such as Landolph Caracciolo and John of Baconthorpe (Kretzmann 1982, Spade 1982). In the first signum, essence loses its non-being; in the second, essence occupies an intermediate position between the non-being it is abandoning and the being it is acquiring, and in this sense it is the subiectum of the transmutation; finally, in the third, essence has acquired its being, and as such it is the terminus of the change (Summa, art. 59, q. 2, ed. 1520, f. 138vR).

6. Essential Being (esse essentiae)

The above concerns the acquisition of existence, or actual being. Yet independently of existence, and preceding it, essence is already constituted as such in its specific being: the esse proprium that Avicenna attributes to a res in virtue of its certitudo. It is well-known that Henry refers to this being as esse essentiae. Despite the ultra-essentialist interpretation of Henry's metaphysics that began with Suárez, the syntagma esse essentiae does not designate a separate being, but only the fact that a res thus constituted has an objective content and so is objectively possible; that is, it can be placed in act by God. Indeed, not every res conceivable by the human intellect corresponds to a nature that can be actualized. The being of essence thus coincides with the possibility, or the ability, to receive actual existence that a purely imagined res does not have. In other words, esse essentiae is what separates a mere figment from a res proper, an essence, or to use Avicenna's terminology, a “nature”.

Henry here introduces his well-known distinction between res a reor reris and res a ratitudine (cf. above all Summa, art. 21, q. 4; art. 24, q. 3). In the first case, a thing is considered in its purely nominal conception, to which a reality, outside a purely mental one, need not correspond (reor is here synonymous with opinor — to imagine, to suppose). As such, a res a reor reris is in itself indifferent to both being (essentiae and existentiae) and non-being: to cite the most common example, a res a reor reris can be a mythical animal such as a hircocervus or tragelaphus (goat-stag). In the second case, a thing is “certified” (rata) by the fact that it possesses at least the being of an essence. If the nothing that stands in opposition to a res a reor reris cannot even be conceived, the nothing that stands in opposition to a res a ratitudine is not the lack of actual being, hence non-existence in the physical world, but rather the lack of formal constitution: the fact that a thing can be conceived (for example, a chimera or a mountain of gold) without in reality being “certified” as a determined essence. But whence does the being of an essence come? Every essence is what it is in reason of its nature (“Est autem id quod est essentia in unaquaque re communiter loquendo id quod ei convenit ratione naturae suae secundum se.”; Quodl. X, q. 8, ed. Macken, p. 201, ll. 85-87). A stone is a stone because of its own nature, and the same is true for a triangle. Formally, every essence is therefore what it is, in and of itself, albeit through participation (participative), since the very fact of being an essence, content aside, is dependent on God.

Essence is therefore not strictly an “effect” or “product” of God, and yet it is constituted only through a relation of participation in, or imitation of, the divine essence. More precisely, esse essentiae belongs to essence because of its eternal relation with God as formal cause. It is only in virtue of this relation that essences can also come into actual existence, which signals a new relation between a creature and God, the latter now as efficient cause. In the first case, essences depend on the divine intellect, in the second, on the divine will. Being therefore always indicates a relation in creatures, which is simple for essences in themselves (esse essentiae), and twofold for actualized essences (esse essentiae plus esse existentiae). Nevertheless the two types of relation are not perfectly symmetrical. In the first place, while essence can be conceived independently of its existence in the physical world, it cannot be conceived independently of its being-essence, otherwise it would be a mere figment. Consequently, the relation that forges esse existentiae is in some way accidental, whereas that which forges esse essentiae is essential. In the second place, since God chooses, from all the essences eternally constituted as such by His intellect, those that He will actualize over time, on the basis of His free will, one respectus is such from eternity, while the other takes place in time.

Since that which essence is depends on essence itself, while the fact of being an essence derives from a formal dependence (similitudo) on God, it follows that within essence itself there is a composition prior to the one so far described between essence and existence. Even in essence, in other words, we can distinguish between an id quod est and a quo est, in the classic Boethian formulation. Quo est is obviously esse essentiae. It is not so easy, however, to identify id quod est. It is certainly not essence itself, since essence is the result of the composition, not one of its component parts. Yet neither is it strictly speaking a res a reor reris, even though Henry himself had entertained this possibility on one occasion at least (Summa, art. 28, q. 4). In the denomination res a reor reris are included all those essences effectively constituted as such and also figments devoid of any objective content. Consequently, res ratae are more a subcategory of res a reor reris, rather than the possible result of the composition between the latter and esse essentiae. The distinction between res a reor reris and res a ratitudine seems to have mainly an epistemological utility: it corresponds to the scientific progression (mentioned above, §2) from a purely nominal knowledge of a thing (res a reor reris as pure quid nominis) to the recognition of its essential reality (the verification of esse essentiae, quaestio si est de incomplexo), and finally to the determination of its objective content (quid rei, res a ratitudine), according to Henry's essentialist reinterpretation of the scheme of the Posterior Analytics in his Summa (art. 24, q. 3).

But what is this objective content? The most explicit answer is to be found again in q. 7 of Quodl. X: “esse essentiae non proprie dicitur addi essentiae, quia non est essentia proprie nisi illo esse, sed potius dicitur addi aliquo quod est de propria ratione generis sui, quod cum ratione esse constituit essentiam compositam ex quod est et esse, quod est ipsum quo est” (“essential being is not said properly to be added to essence, since essence is none other than that being; rather it is said to be added to something belonging to the ratio of its genus, and this, together with the ratio of being, constitutes the essence composed of quod est and being, which is in itself the quo est,”; Quodl. X, q. 7, ed. Macken, p. 152, ll. 59-63). To return to the earlier example, we must now say that the essence of a stone is constituted by its being an essence (esse essentiae) and by its being a stone (that which belongs to the nature itself of a thing in that the thing belongs to a given genus: “aliquod quod est de propria ratione generis sui”). Henry likewise distinguishes between ratio praedicamenti and res praedicamenti (Quodl. V, q. 2). Ratio praedicamenti is being; it is the reason why every essence generally falls within the predicamental sphere. Res praedicamenti is instead the realitas of every essence; it is what makes essence belong to a given predicament. Without esse essentiae a thing (res) could never belong to the categories, nor could it ever be the object of meaningful scientific statements; yet it is that which is proper to each essence that places it within a given predicament.

Esse essentiae is before every genus and outside every genus: only in that it is composed does it belong to a given genus. From this perspective, it is not being that is added to what is proper to every thing, but the opposite: what determines being supervenes on the latter. Consequently, it is not so much the objective content of an essence that is in potency to being, but rather it is being that is in potency to its subsequent objective determinations (Gómez Caffarena 1958; Porro 1996). This is Henry's theory in the later Quodlibeta, in concordance with the theory in De causis according to which the first of created things is being. The being created first by God is clearly not esse existentiae, but esse essentiae, called esse latissimum, esse communissimum, and esse largissimo modo acceptum in q. 3 of Quodl. XI. All that follows — that is, the determination of essence with regard to its objective content or to its actualization in the physical or mental world — is none other than a delimitation, or specification, of that being. The radical conclusion of Henry's theory is that the only real term of creation is esse latissimum; all the rest is not created from nothing, but is constituted through an in-formation process of that essential being in a strict hierarchical order. Hence, esse essentiae is created first; next comes, through information, esse aliquid per essentiam; finally, the whole essence thus composed is placed in act. Esse existentiae is the actualization of esse essentiae, just as esse aliquid per existentiam is the actualization of esse aliquid per essentiam, though this is not a matter of things, elements or different parts, but only of different intentions.

For Henry even the distinction between esse essentiae and the realitas of an essence is of an intentional type. Such a distinction seems to differ from the distinction between essence and esse existentiae: one of the most salient features of the intentional distinction is that one of the intentions thus distinguished can be conceived even when the other is removed or negated. Essence can be considered in itself, without actuality, and yet it seems more difficult to conceive of it without its own being, since, from a formal perspective, essence is always its being, and the relation of participation in divine essence that constitutes every essence is eternal and indestructible. Therefore Henry was initially tempted to make a distinction based on reason alone between essence and its essential being; as, for example, in the solution adopted in Quodl. I, q. 9. Only later would he abandon this choice to adopt an intentional distinction for this case too. A spectacular example of this change of position is the recasting of q. 4, art. 21 in the Summa. In the final version, Henry rejects what he had previously maintained: that essence is really its being in a strict sense. This inversion is probably due to the need to conserve the distance between the absolute simplicity of the divine essence and the simplicity of created essences, as well as to his new understanding of the priority of essential being, as the first created thing, with regard to all subsequent determinations, beginning with the determination of the content of essences themselves.

7. Creatural Essences and Divine Ideas

Yet how are essences constituted in their being? As mentioned above, essences depend on the divine intellect, which is their exemplary cause. More precisely, essences correspond to divine ideas, which represent their eternal exemplars. This might seem to be the habitual scheme of Christian Platonism, though scholars (especially de Rijk 1991) have pointed out that, beginning with Henry, the term “idea” loses its traditional meaning of “subsisting form” and moves closer to its meaning in Descartes and Locke of “instrument” or “term” of knowledge. According to Henry an idea is in God for the fact that divine essence is in some ways imitable by creatural essences. God's knowledge of what is different from Himself coincides with the knowledge of the different ways in which He considers Himself imitable, since divine knowledge is not determined by the presence of external objects, but rather is itself the formal (exemplary) cause of its own contents. Here, however, the classic question of the relation between divine simplicity and creatural multiplicity again arises. Were God to know immediately the plurality of creatable objects (essences), His simplicity and unity (divine knowledge is not really distinct from divine essence) would be irremediably compromised.

On the other hand, if God did not have access to the multiplicity of all that is distinct from His essence, He would not know anything. So, according to Henry, divine knowledge has a primary object, which is divine essence itself, absolutely simple and indivisible, and a secondary object, which is in some way “other” than divine knowledge. To avoid any excessively brusque passage, the knowledge of this secondary object is then subdivided into two distinct moments: in the first, every creatural essence is coincident with divine essence itself, and expresses a simple respectus imitabilitatis with it; in the second, every such essence is taken as distinct, endowed with a specific modus of being — esse essentiae — which nevertheless always derives from a relation of formal participation in the divine essence. In Henry's lexicon, these two moments indicate respectively the exemplar, which is the divine idea, and the exemplatum (also called ideatum), which is an essence fully constituted in its quidditative content and so able to be placed in act.

Exemplata, or essences, are thus secondary objects of divine knowledge, indeed they are doubly so, and as such they seem to have a purely mental being. In other words, they are diminished beings (entia diminuta), just like the contents of our mind. But the divine intellect obviously does not have the same characteristics as ours, since in order to know something our intellect needs to be informed (per speciem) by its contents, and so is passive in a sense, whereas the divine intellect is itself the cause of its own contents. Hence the level of existence that contents have in the divine intellect is not in any way comparable to that which they have in our intellect. Essences are therefore entia diminuta, though not so diminished that they cannot be something in themselves (Quodl. IX, q. 2). Their being is their quidditative constitution, which also defines the effective possibility of access to actual existence: all essences, as thought of and therefore “ratified” by God, are possible in themselves; that is, they can be placed in act on the basis of divine free will.

One might ask whether God possesses this same freedom in bestowing esse essentiae on possible essences, that is, on (doubly) secondary objects of His knowledge. Unlike what happens for the being of existence, the reply would seem to be negative in this case. As mentioned above, there is an asymmetry between the relation of efficient causality and the relation of formal dependence that conjoin creatures and Creator: while the former is in time, the latter is eternal. This means that the distinction between what is possible and what is not possible is necessarily such from eternity. Moreover, since essences can never cease to be in their essential being (that is, in their being eternally thought by God), they are absolutely necessary. As such, not only can they not be destroyed, but they cannot even be modified. In actual existence, all essences are equally indifferent with regard to the Creator's power, so that God can place in act one res before another as He chooses, without any mediation, whereas in their own being essences are arranged in a hierarchical order that God himself, on whom that order depends, cannot modify.

In order to grasp this difference, we need only consider the first two questions of Quodlibet VIII, in which Henry distinguishes between the purely speculative knowledge that God has of essences and His practical consideration of their possible actualization. Obviously, there is no real difference between these two forms of knowledge, since in God practical ideas exist only as “extensions” of speculative ideas. In other words, the very same rationes ideales that God constitutes in Himself, by considering Himself variously imitable by creatures, can be considered in scientia pratica as the possible effects of His actions (“quaedam operabilia”). The difference between these two forms of knowledge does not lie in the diversity of the object, but rather in the diversity of the aim; that is, in the fact that God can consider a thing as the result of a possible operation of His will. In this sense, God knows what will effectively be placed in act, not by considering an essence in itself (every essence is indeed indifferent to actual existence), but by considering the determination of His will in this regard.

God's will is as immutable and eternal as His knowledge; yet it is not constrained by the essential relation that binds ideas together. God has always known the individual entities that he will actualize in the various species, as well as those that he will not, yet His decision in this regard is absolutely free and does not correspond to any essential order. The concrete, “practical” actualization of individual entities is not the same as the formal, ontological possibility of essences. God constructs the essential framework of the world through ideas and speculative knowledge, while it is through their practical extension that He freely brings into being some of the creatures eternally constituted as possible. Yet there is no correspondence, strictly speaking, between one order and another.

To illustrate this divergence Henry uses a particularly striking image: possible existences are arranged in a circle around God, so that they are all equidistant, while essences are arranged in a straight line, beginning with the noblest creature (the highest angel) and ending with the lowest form of being (prime matter). Creatural essences are thus arranged as a hierarchical and essentially ordered whole; and this is not a mere tautology, since “essentially ordered” refers to those causal series in which the simultaneous presence of all terms is required for the production of an effect and in which, consequently, a missing link in the chain is enough to invalidate any efficacy with regard to the effects. This means that while the second term depends directly and exclusively on the first, the third depends on the first and the second, the forth on the first three, and so on. A series of this type is clearly neither open nor infinite, since if it were there would no longer be an ordered relation between the terms.

Concerning the case in question, this fact has at least two consequences. In the first place, according to Henry, God cannot now introduce ex novo a new essence in any part of the series without irremediably destroying the world order. Even if it were possible to add something at the beginning or at the end of the series — above the highest angel or below prime matter — then other infinite terms would be possible, too, and infinity in itself destroys any ordered relation. From this perspective it is easy to understand Henry's reservation over the possibility of distinguishing between potentia ordinata and potentia absoluta in God, a distinction which he is more willing to accept in relation to papal authority (see below, §11). God can do nothing de potentia absoluta that He cannot also do de potentia ordinata, since He himself is bound by the order that He has eternally established. Supernatural intervention is thus delegated only to the potentia oboedentialis of creatures, though it is never outside the established order and merely indicates the difference, within this order, between what is possible for natural agents and what is possible for a supernatural agent.

In the second place, since there is a perfect correspondence between creatural essences and divine ideas, the latter are numerically finite, like the former (Porro 1993). This theory, which is highly unusual to say the least, is explicitly put forward by Henry on at least two occasions in his Quodlibeta (Quodl. V, q. 3 and Quodl. VIII, q. 8), before being partially retracted, albeit reluctantly, in virtue of an unspecified article condemned in Paris (Quodl. XI, q. 11).

8. God as the First Object of our Knowledge (primum cognitum)

In describing the role of divine illumination in the cognitive process of the human intellect (see above, §2), Henry is always careful to specify that God functions only as ratio cognoscendi and not as obiectum cognitum. From another perspective, however, God is also the first known object of the human intellect, according to one of Henry's most famous and characteristic doctrines (Summa, art. 24, q. 7). The apparent contrast between these two theories is lessened when we recognize that for Henry God is the primum cognitum of our intellect, not because of the evidence, but because of the absolute indeterminacy of our concept of God.

For Henry, the more indeterminate an intelligible, the more quickly it is grasped naturally by our intellect (“…et sic universaliter quanto intelligibile magis est indeterminatum, tanto naturaliter prius ipsum intellectus noster intelligit”; Summa, art. 24, q. 7, ed. 1520, f. 144rG). While God is not the first but the last concept in the order of rational knowledge, after the knowledge of creatures, He is the first object of natural knowledge, which is had in the first intentions and in which our intellect always proceeds from what is most indeterminate. Concerning any thing, our intellect first grasps (by nature) the fact of its being an entity and then the fact of its being that determined entity, even though chronologically the opposite seems true. Actually, we seem to grasp a thing first as a stone and then as a being in general, though in the natural order we can only know something as a stone because we have implicitly recognized it as a being.

Therefore, subsisting and absolute ens is also contained within the indeterminate concept of being, and it is for this reason that, in confounding the privative indeterminacy of the concept of being in general (the mere absence of determination) with the negative indeterminacy (the fact that the absolutely simple and subsisting ens is indeterminable as such), every time an ens is conceived, the ens primum, God, is also conceived, at least on more general levels of knowledge. What is valid for being may also be applied to the other first intentions, though the concept of ens still remains the most indeterminate and hence original.

9. Analogy

The last aspect is clarified particularly in q. 2, art. 21 of the Summa, in which Henry deals with the theme of the relation between the being of creatures and the being of the creator. There is no real identity, or community, between creatural being and divine being, but only a form of community originating in the indeterminacy of the most general concept of being. Divine being is indeterminate and indeterminable; in itself, it eludes all possibility of determination. Being in general initially seems just as indeterminate, though not because it is indeterminable: the process itself of human knowledge aims at an ever more complete determination of being as a res. Nevertheless, at the level of our first, confused knowledge, our intellect, as mentioned above, is not able to distinguish between the negative indeterminacy of God (indeterminatio per abnegationem) and the privative indeterminacy of creatures (indeterminatio per privationem), and so it erroneously forms a single concept.

The equivocal term is thus interpreted by our intellect as an univocal term, and this gives rise to a peculiar form of analogy. The first concept of being (ens largissimo modo acceptum), which is “something analogous common to Creator and creature, containing within itself being as principle and being as produced” (“commune analogum ad creatorem et creaturam, continens sub se ens principium et ens principiatum”; Summa, art. 21, q. 3, ed. 1520, f. 126rD), is actually both equivocal and univocal at the same time. It is equivocal in itself, since it signifies two completely heterogeneous realities: finite and infinite, founded and founder, being in potency and being purely in act. It is univocal for the human intellect, since at this initial level the distinction is hidden from our comprehension.

Even though this commune analogum results from a misunderstanding, or at the very least from an undue superimposition, it is nevertheless a valuable basis for any possible affirmation concerning divine existence. In other words, the absolute transcendence and ineffability of the Divine are paradoxically violated in virtue of a “structural error” of our intellect. Yet it is this very confusion which offers the only positive starting point for a metaphysical demonstration of the existence of God, a demonstration that, in appealing to Avicenna and to Augustine's De Trinitate, proceeds by investigating this falsely univocal concept of entity in order to isolate the notion of God as pure, necessarily existing Being (Summa, art. 22, q. 5; art. 24, q. 6). Henry does not refrain, however, from presenting a posteriori proofs — in the order of efficient, formal and final causes — that nevertheless refer exclusively to the existence of God de complexo; in other words, to the truth of the statement “God exists” (Summa, art. 22, q. 4).

10. Intellect and Will

In his production Henry dedicates no less than 20 quodlibetal questions to an analysis of will and intellect, considered both in general and with particular reference to the human sphere (Macken 1975 and 1977). In Quodl. I, q. 14, the eminence of the will over the intellect is defended, taking into account the habitus, act and object of the two faculties. As in Pauline doctrine, the habitus of the will, which is love (caritas), is preferable to the habitus of the intellect, which is knowledge. Its act, which consists in desiring and loving God, is preferable to the act of reason, which is represented only by knowing God. The object of the will, the supreme Good, is more eminent than the object of the intellect, which is the truth, i.e. the good, of a given thing and is thus a subordinate good. In the next quaestio (Quodl. I, q. 15), however, Henry clarifies that the primacy of one faculty over another can be understood in a double sense: “primacy of essence” should be attributed to voluntas, whereas “primacy of action” should be attributed to ratio.

While it is true that the will is the superior faculty, in order to act it always needs the intervention of reason. This is justified on the basis of the human cognitive process itself: in man, as in other animals, the first form of knowledge is received through the senses. Nevertheless, sensible appetites alone cannot activate the will, which only moves toward the universaliter and simpliciter Good, and not toward a particular good, such as that perceived by the senses. So the intervention of the intellect, which is able to abstract the universal from sensible particulars and thereby permits the motion of the will, is always needed. In this way, the intellect precedes the will. So, in order to avoid the inconvenience of having the motion of the will depend on sensible appetites (determinism of the passions), Henry always recognizes the importance of the role of reason.

Nevertheless, unlike the theory upheld by those intellectualists closer to the Aristotelian tradition in this case, the intellect itself is only a condition, and not the absolute cause, of the motion of the will. For Henry the will is characterized by the capacity for self-motion. After being alluded to in q. 22, Quodl. IV, this theory becomes central to q. 5, Quodl. IX of the Lent Session, 1285: “Utrum voluntas moveat seipsam” (“Whether the will moves itself”). The date is here important, since this Quodlibet was disputed after the famous propositio magistralis of 1285, i.e. the proposition conceded by the Parisian Masters of Theology on the occasion of Giles of Rome's rehabilitation: “si ratio recta, et voluntas recta” (“if reason is right, then the will is also right”). In this question the superiority of the will is vindicated by Henry, since not only does it move all the other faculties, and hence the intellect too, but it also, indeed above all, moves itself, at a level of perfection which is second only to that of God. To the objection based on the well-known Aristotelian principle according to which “all that moves, is moved by something else,” Henry replies that while this principle is valid for the material faculties, it cannot be applied in the same way to the spiritual faculties, since the latter possess a higher degree of perfection.

It is the level of perfection that determines the strength and capacity of that which actualizes something else. Therefore, as the levels of perfection increase, from matter (which, as pure potency, moves nothing) to God (pure act), the distinction between mover and moved diminishes. The will is immediately below the highest level of perfection, represented by God, since it admits a purely “intentional” distinction (see above §4) between mover and moved. And since it is self-moving, it is also free. Thus, in virtue of its nature, the will is induced to seek the good proposed by the intellect, though it remains free in this quest even with regard to the supreme Good.

In Quodlibet X of the Advent Session, 1286, Henry returns to the problem of the self-motion of the will, introducing the notion of virtus ad movendum, through which the spiritual faculties (such as human voluntas) can produce and specify their own acts without an external mover. More especially, through this virtus ad movendum, which corresponds to the substantial form of the subject, the will is able to pass from the potency of desiring to the act of desiring, since it already “virtually” contains this act within itself. Henry thus surprisingly concludes that even the above-mentioned propositio magistralis (“si ratio recta, et voluntas recta”) does not undermine the superiority of the will. The proposition should be interpreted in the sense of simultaneity, and not causality, since the second faculty (ratio) does not necessarily determine the first (voluntas), but is only the conditio sine qua non of its operation. Finally, Henry concedes that the will cannot desire what it does not know, but denies that the will is determined in its choices by the intellect; in other words, that it cannot desire the opposite of what the intellect dictates.

Henry can thus undoubtedly be considered a voluntarist (Müller 2007), even though with regard to the more “radical” voluntarists, such as Walter of Brugge, he does not confine himself to interpreting the role of reason as that of a mere “advisor”, but instead as that of a cause (albeit a causa sine qua non): without the prior knowledge of the intellect (characterized by the same kind of freedom as voluntas), the will cannot desire anything. In other words, for Henry the intellect and the good that it proposes are not the sole or necessary origin of the motion of the will, as is affirmed, on the other hand, by those interpreters closer to Aristotle. Nevertheless, by presenting the objects that this faculty can freely choose, reason is the conditio sine qua non of the action of the will itself, which otherwise would be prey to sensible appetites and the determinism of the passions. Moral action is therefore performed both by the intellect, which presents the kinds of good to choose, and by the will, which freely chooses one of these, yet without being forced to opt for that which is judged best by reason.

11. Other Characteristic Elements: Human Dimorphism, Time, the Active Life, Human Rights, the Special Illumination of the Theologian

Here, we can briefly refer to other characteristic elements of Henry's metaphysical and theological system:

Indeed, one of the central concerns throughout Henry's career was the vindication of the absolutely scientific nature of theology. Moreover, it is the Master of Theology's duty to give, on request, his authoritative opinion on any topic; hence the numerous questions of a pastoral, social, political and even economic kind that make Henry's Quodlibeta one of the richest and liveliest theological works of the entire Scholastic production (Porro 2006; Marmursztejn 2007).


Primary Sources

Ancient editions

Quodlibeta (1518). Parisiis: Vaenundantur ab Iodoco Badio Ascensio; repr. (1961). Louvain: Bibliothèque S. J.

• Summae quaestionum ordinariarum (1520). Parisiis: Vaenundatur in aedibus Iodoci Badii Ascensii; repr. (1953). St. Bonaventure, N. Y.: The Franciscan Institute; Louvain: E. Nauwelaerts; Paderborn: F. Schöningh.

New critical editions

Henrici de Gandavo Opera Omnia (1979 sqq.). Leuven: Leuven University Press (initially also Leiden: E.J. Brill).

Secondary Sources


Selected Studies

Other Internet Resources

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Related Entries

condemnation of 1277 | divine: illumination | Giles of Rome | Godfrey of Fontaines