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Godfrey of Fontaines

First published Fri Aug 17, 2001; substantive revision Fri Oct 13, 2006

Godfrey of Fontaines was one of the major philosopher-theologians to serve as Regent Master at the University of Paris in the final quarter of the thirteenth century, along with Henry of Ghent and Giles of Rome. After completing philosophical studies in the Faculty of Arts and beginning to study theology probably by August, 1274, he became Regent Master in Theology in 1285 and retained this position until 1303/1304. His greatest contributions to philosophy were in the area of metaphysics. He was positively influenced by Thomas Aquinas, but differed with him on various major points, and also seems to have been influenced by the Arts Master, Siger of Brabant. His might well be described as a metaphysics of act and potency, since he often turns to this in seeking to resolve metaphysical problems such as, for instance, the relationship between essence and existence and between possible and actual being, the distinction between substance and accidents and between the soul and its powers, the causes of intellection and volition, or the nature of prime matter and its relationship to substantial form. Overall his philosophical thought and especially his metaphysics is somewhat more Aristotelian and less influenced by Neoplatonism than that of many of his contemporaries, including Aquinas.

1. Life and Writings

Godfrey of Fontaines was born in present day Belgium in the principality of Liège, very likely at the chateau of the noble family of which he was a member, at Fontaines-les Hozémont, probably shortly before 1250. This approximate date can be inferred from the fact that he conducted his first quodlibetal dispute as a Master of Theology at Paris in 1285, and that one could not become a Master in this faculty before reaching the age of 35. While nothing is known with certainty about his life prior to his arrival at Paris, he must have pursued philosophical studies there in the Faculty of Arts in the early 1270s. University statutes required one to spend at least eight years in studying theology before becoming a Master, and it is also known that he was inscribed at the Sorbonne before August 15, 1274. Hence his theological studies should have begun by that date (De Wulf, 1904, 3-16; Wippel, 1981, xv-xviii).

Evidently a great lover of books, among the surviving 37 manuscripts Godfrey left to the Sorbonne is a valuable "Student Notebook" (Paris: Bibl. Nat. lat. 16.297) which he himself compiled during his student days at Paris, and into which he entered many writings in his own hand. While not completed until ca. 1280 rather than by 1274 or earlier as previously proposed, it reflects his interests in the 1270s and includes works by Thomas Aquinas, Siger of Brabant, Boethius of Dacia, other anonymous Questions on various works of Aristotle which are clearly by some Master(s) of Arts of the time, still others by Giles of Rome, some extracts from Albert the Great and from Henry of Ghent, as well as some other purely theological writings (Wippel, 2001, 360-67; Duin, 1959). His interest in the writings of Radical Aristotelian Arts Masters at Paris in the 1260s and 1270s is also indicated by other works of Arts Masters included in additional manuscripts in his library (Bibl. Nat. lat. 15.819, 16.096). Also noteworthy is the inclusion in his Student Notebook of one of the oldest and most reliable copies of Thomas Aquinas's controversial De aeternitate mundi, which itself dates from 1270.

Godfrey continued to teach as a Master of Theology at the University until ca. 1303/1304 when he conducted his fifteenth and last Quodlibetal Disputation. He may have been away from Paris for some more extended periods after completing Quodlibet XIV ca. 1298-1299. It is known that he maintained close connections with Liège during his career at Paris and, indeed, that he served as Canon of Liège. He also served as Canon of Tournai and as Provost of San Severin at Cologne, and was elected Bishop of Tournai in 1300 but renounced his rights to the See when the election was contested. The year of his death is probably 1306 or 1309, but the day is known, i.e., October 29.

Godfrey selected the quodlibetal disputation as his major vehicle for publication. These solemn disputations were conducted twice during the academic year, i.e., before Christmas and before Easter. They were open to all members of the learned public and questions could be put to the presiding Master by anyone in attendance. During the first day's disputation, preliminary answers would be given to these many and disparate questions. On the following day or at least on some following day, the Master, having in the meantime imposed some logical organizing plan upon the various questions, would return for another session where he would present his definitive response or "determination" for each of them. Subsequently he would prepare this version for publication and, when it was completed, would submit it to the University Bookseller. Masters were not required to conduct these open disputations and since they were regarded as onerous, not all did. Godfrey's 15 Quodlibets have all been edited, although only reportationes of the first four remain, i.e., copies taken down by an auditor. Brief versions (abbreviationes) of Quodlibets III and IV have also been edited. Since medieval times there has been some difficulty about the literary form of Quodlibet XIV concerning whether it really is a Quodlibet or some other kind of disputed question. Wippel (2006) concludes it is more probable that it is indeed a Quodlibet, but one that is unique in terms of its organizing plan and structure. As a Master of theology Godfrey also conducted ordinary Disputed Questions, and some of these have been preserved.

2. Subject of Metaphysics

Godfrey was surely familiar with the controversy concerning whether one should with Avicenna stress the nonparticular and therefore the universal character of being as being and hence make this the subject of metaphysics or rather with Averroes emphasize it as the science which has the highest kind of being, the divine, as its subject. On this Godfrey clearly agrees with Avicenna, even though he devotes little explicit attention to the controversy itself. Thus in Quodlibet X, q. 11 he holds that being as being is the object (or subject) of metaphysics (PB 4.349), and in Quodlibet VI, q. 6 that the concept of being is first and simplest because it enters into every other concept (PB 3.137). Therefore it is also the most general concept or, one may say, transcendental. At times Godfrey also describes the object of the intellect as being as being (Quodlibet II, q. 8). He denies that God is the subject of metaphysics, even though God is the first and primary being and must be studied within metaphysics (Quodlibet I, q. 5). He distinguishes a metaphysical study of God, which he says may be described as a kind of theology, from the theology that is based on Sacred Scripture. This does not have being as being as its subject, but God himself (Quodlibet IX, q. 20; Wippel, 1981, 3-15).

3. Division of Being

In opposition to Henry of Ghent's division of real being into essential being (esse essentiae) and existential being (esse existentiae), in Quodlibet VIII, q. 3 Godfrey proposes his own division. Being (esse) may be divided into being in the mind ("cognitive" being) which is a lesser or diminished being, and real being, i.e., being outside the mind or knower. Real being is subdivided into real being in potency and real being in act. A thing possesses real being in potency insofar as it has being by reason of its cause or causes. It has real being in act insofar as it is realized in its own nature in completed or perfected form. A thing may have real being in potency either by reason of its intrinsic cause (e.g., if matter preexists which may enter into the thing's constitution), or by reason of an extrinsic cause (e.g., if an agent preexists which can produce it). Godfrey illustrates this with the example of a rose that does not yet actually exist. Prior to the creation of the world and hence of matter it possessed real being in potency only by reason of God, its extrinsic cause. After creation it possessed real being in potency by reason of preexisting matter as well, an intrinsic cause. And now it may also possess real potential being by reason of some created extrinsic cause (or causes). Both before and after the world's creation it enjoys cognitive being insofar as it was and is known by the divine mind (PB 4.38-40; Wippel, 1981, 15-17).

4. Analogy of Being

In describing being as being as the object of the intellect in Quodlibet II, q. 8, Godfrey also states that being is taken analogically and not univocally. It is affirmed first and foremost of substance, especially of first substance, and of everything else as related to substance. Hence both substance and accident are included under this analogous notion of being and this single object of the intellect (PB 2.135-36; Wippel, 1981, 19-24). In Quodlibet III, q. 1 he attempts to establish the analogical character of being by arguing at some length that it cannot be either univocal or purely equivocal. Central to his rejection of univocity of being is his denial that it is a supreme genus. It must apply not only to the generic and specific aspects in which different things share, but also to the differences, including the individual differences between them (PB 2.162-63). In Quodlibet XV, q. 3, while responding to an objection perhaps taken from Meister Eckhart's Parisian Disputed Question 1, he maintains that, if being is applied to accidents insofar as they are related to substance in some way, this does not mean that being is not intrinsically present in accidents. So, too, when it is applied to creatures viewed as effects and to God their cause, it applies intrinsically to God. There is an analogy and proportion in reality between these different instantiations of being and corresponding to this, there is analogy in meaning as well. It is this that is grasped by the analogous concept of being (PB 14.18-20; Wippel, 2001, 381-82).

5. Transcendentals

In Quodlibet III, q. 1 Godfrey identifies the one, the true, and the good as properties of being that are really identical and convertible with it, and hence as transcendental characteristics of being. These properties are not really distinct from being itself (PB 2.163-64). In Quodlibet VI, q. 16 he distinguishes between the one or the kind of unity that serves as a principle for number and which is based on discrete quantity (numerical unity in the strict sense), and the kind that is convertible with being. While the former is restricted to corporeal being, the latter applies to every subsisting substance and to every accident that exists in such a substance. Hence it alone is transcendental (PB 3.256-58). Regarding the true, in Quodlibet VI, q. 6 Godfrey indicates that truth adds nothing real to being but only a (conceptual) relationship to mind or intellect. To assign this kind of truth to a thing is simply to acknowledge that it can be grasped by intellect or that it is intelligible. Consequently, Godfrey holds that truth is present in being virtually insofar as it has the capacity (virtus) to produce truth in the intellect. But he favors the view that when taken formally truth resides in the intellect (PB 3.137-41; Wippel, 1981, 25-34). Hence here he is recognizing the distinction later referred to as that between ontological truth and logical truth.

6. Essence and Existence

Already during Godfrey's student days in Arts and in Theology at Paris there was considerable discussion concerning the exact relationship between essence and existence in finite or created beings. Closely associated with the metaphysical thought of Aquinas was the view that in all finite beings there is a real, i.e., not merely a conceptual or mind-dependent distinction and composition of an essence principle and an act of existing (esse) or existence principle. Already in the 1270s Giles of Rome was developing his own theory of real distinction between essence and existence, and was soon engaged in ongoing controversy with Henry of Ghent. At times Giles referred to essence and existence as distinct "things" (res) and, while he denied that either could exist in separation from the other or that existence is an essence, his terminology left its mark on the theory and open to such misinterpretations; for it invited critics to view existence or the act of being as an entity rather than as a principle of an existing entity, as Aquinas had envisioned it. While Henry of Ghent rejected any real distinction between essence and existence, he defended something more than a merely conceptual distinction between them, namely a new and third type that would fall between the real distinction and the merely conceptual, an "intentional" distinction (Wippel, 1981, 40-45).

Godfrey briefly refers to this issue in Quodlibet II, q. 2, while attempting to determine whether the essence of a creature is indifferent to existence and nonexistence. He comments that either essence is really identical with existence and differs from it (1) only conceptually or (2) intentionally, or else (3) existence is a distinct thing, i.e., the act of the essence and really distinct from it (PB 2.60). In Quodlibet IV, q. 2, he was asked to determine whether to hold that predicamental things are eternal by reason of their quiddity is also to hold that the world is eternal. In preparing his response he presents in greater detail these three different views on the relationship between essence and existence (esse). According to some they are really distinct from one another and enter into real composition with one another. But one is not separable from the other so as to be able to exist apart from it. Consequently, if a thing lacks or loses its existential being, it also lacks or loses its essential being. According to a second view they are really identical, but differ intentionally. Hence when a thing loses its existential being, its essence cannot be said to exist; but it does retain its true predicamental or essential being (esse essentiae). Finally, a third position, which Godfrey himself embraces, maintains that they are really identical and differ only conceptually. They do not enter into composition with one another. Therefore, to the extent that something enjoys essential being, to that same degree it enjoys actual existence. And, adds Godfrey, whatever is understood of one is also understood of the other (PB 2.235).

In Quodlibet III, q. 1, dating from 1286, Godfrey considers the argumentation offered for each of these positions. First he presents the theory that distinguishes really between essence and existence in language that reflects the terminology of Giles of Rome. Thus he refers to existence both as "something" (aliquid) and as a "thing" (res) that is added to essence. He then presents a number of arguments in support of this view which seem to be taken from Giles, especially from his Quaestiones disputatae de esse et essentia, q. 11. One of these is reminiscent of the first part of Aquinas's much discussed reasoning in De ente et essentia, c. 4, which begins from the fact that one can understand what something is without knowing whether it actually exists. However, Giles's presentation (and Godfrey's repetition) of the argument makes a stronger claim. One can understand what something is and also know that it does not exist. But because nothing can be understood with the opposite of itself, essence and existence must be really distinct. After presenting a series of arguments against this theory and refuting the arguments he had initially offered in support of it, Godfrey resolutely rejects any real distinction between essence and existence. For him they are identical, and differ only in the way they signify, just as the concrete noun "a being" (ens), the abstract noun "essence" (essentia), and the verb "to be" or "to exist" (esse) differ in their mode of signifying, but designate one and the same reality (PB 3.304 [brief version]; Wippel, 1981, 45-66).

In presenting Henry's theory of intentional distinction Godfrey traces this back in large measure to what he regards as an incorrect interpretation of Avicenna's notion of nature or essence when it is considered simply in itself or "absolutely" rather than as existing in the mind or in an individual entity. As Godfrey explains in his later Quodlibet VIII, q. 3, according to Henry's position real being is divided into essential being (esse essentiae) and existential being (esse existentiae). A thing possesses essential being from eternity insofar as it corresponds to its appropriate exemplar idea within the divine intellect. Because of this it is a true or real quiddity or essence from eternity and falls into its appropriate predicament even though it is not an actual existent. Existing entities receive actual existence only in the course of time when the divine will intervenes to cause this. Within an actually existing being, therefore, its essence and existence are not really distinct. But Henry denies that they are identical. They are "intentionally" distinct (Wippel, 1981, 67-79; Marrone, 2001, 39-52; Porro, 1996, 211-53). Godfrey rejects Henry's new and intermediary kind of distinction out of hand. A distinction must either be real or purely conceptual. Accordingly, in Quodlibet III, q. 1 he argues at length against Henry's application of the intentional distinction to essence and existence Wippel, 1981, 85-88).

As already noted, for Godfrey essence and existence are really identical and only differ conceptually. Whatever is true of essence is true of existence, and vice versa. It is not necessary to posit two really distinct or even two intentionally distinct principles to account for the fact that one may be aware of something as a possible existent when it does not actually exist. It is enough to distinguish between potential being and actual being. If something is in potency in terms of its essence, it is in potency in terms of its existence. And if it is actual in terms of its essence, it is actual in terms of its existence.

Godfrey proposes a different kind of act-potency "composition" in order to meet one argument in support of real distinction between essence and existence. If, as Aquinas, Giles, and Godfrey all hold, the angels of Christianity are purely spiritual and not composed of (spiritual) matter and form, then it seems that they must be composed of essence and existence. Otherwise they would be perfectly simple and equal to God. Godfrey responds that one and the same being, even if purely spiritual, may be regarded as actual insofar as it exists, but as potential insofar as it falls short of the actuality enjoyed by a higher being and, above all, by the First Being, God. He quotes Proposition 2 from Proclus's Elementatio theologica: "What participates in the One is both One and not-One." As Godfrey reads this, anything that is different from the One can fall short of it only by approaching (accessus) the not-one. Hence it is simply by reason of the fact that such a being recedes from the One that it is not the One itself. In this way more perfect beings such as angels are distinct from the One, or God, without being composed either of matter and form or of essence and existence. Nonetheless, actuality and potentiality are present in them because they possess a certain intermediary nature and hence are likened or "assimilated" to something higher and more actual, and to something lower and more potential. Therefore they are "composed" of potency and act, not really, but conceptually. This composition is not merely imaginary. It applies to such entities by their being related to something higher and to something lower (Quodlibet III, qq. 1, 3; Quodlibet VII, q. 7; Wippel, 1981, 90-97).

Godfrey's library contains two likely sources for this theory, first a rudimentary version found in the abbreviated text of Siger of Brabant's Quaestiones in Metaphysicam included in Godfrey's Student Notebook, and second, an anonymous set of questions on the Posterior Analytics contained in the manuscript Bibl. Nat. lat. 16.096. While Godfrey literally borrows certain parts of his theory from the second text, he does not follow this anonymous Radical Aristotelian Arts Master when he goes on to argue that separate entities do not depend upon God as their efficient cause, but only as their final cause (Wippel, 1984), 231-44.

7. Philosophical Knowledge of God's Existence

According to Godfrey, insofar as a natural knowledge of God is accessible to human reason, it belongs more properly to metaphysics than does knowledge of any other being. And he clearly holds that God's existence can be established by philosophical reasoning. But Avicenna and Averroes had differed concerning whether it belongs to natural philosophy (physics) or to metaphysics to demonstrate this conclusion. Avicenna had maintained that this task pertains to metaphysics and only to metaphysics, whereas Averroes had defended the opposite position that only physics can demonstrate the existence of God, the First Mover (Wippel, 1981, 102-3). As will be seen more fully in the following section, Godfrey defends something of a compromise position. In Quodlibet XI, q. 1 he mentions that the metaphysician's consideration of God in himself is more perfect than that of the natural philosopher, who simply views him as the First Mover of the first mobile being, i.e., the outermost heavenly sphere. But, Godfrey adds, by reason of all that God is in himself, he is also the First Mover (PB 5.3). In Quodlibet V, q. 10 he writes that one can know by reasoning from natural things that God is the first being which depends on nothing whatsoever and upon which everything else depends and, therefore, that he is the causal and productive principle of all other things (PB 3.41; Wippel, 1981, 105). And in Quodlibet IX, q. 20, he refers to different things that natural reason can know in metaphysics with certainty about God—that because he is the first being he is simple; that he is being in actuality; that he is an intellectual being, etc. (PB 4.288).

8. Quidditative Knowledge of God and the Divine Attributes

In Quodlibet VII, q. 11 Godfrey considers the view of some, presumably Thomas Aquinas, who say that in this life we can know that God is, but not what he is. Godfrey makes a clear but implicit reference to ST I, q. 3, a. 4 where Thomas writes that even when we recognize that God is, the "is" which we understand is not the act of being whereby God subsists in himself, but only that indicating that the proposition "that he is" is true (PB 3.383).

Godfrey finds this too restrictive. And so after offering a detailed explanation of the different ways in which one can know of something "what it is" and "that it is," he writes that just as in knowing material things we move from more confused to less confused knowledge, so it is in the case of our natural knowledge of God. Just as we find that some things are the principal causes of others, and some are governed by others, so we impose the name "God" to signify something in the universe which is the one first cause of everything else and than which nothing greater can be thought. But such nominal knowledge is not enough to prove that what we express by the name "God" exists in reality or "that he is." Next we may follow Aristotle's procedure in Physics VII where by eliminating recourse to an infinite regress of moved movers he concludes that one First Mover or God exists. And from the continuous motion of the first mobile sphere Aristotle shows in Physics VIII that God is perpetual and pure act. This tells us that God is in reality, but not what he is in any real sense. In the Metaphysics (Bk XII), continues Godfrey, Aristotle accepts the knowledge "that God is" as proved in the Physics and now proceeds to show that certain perfections are present in God to the preeminent degree. According to Godfrey, Aristotle uses these perfections as quasi-differences and thereby progresses from knowledge "that God is" to knowledge "what he is" by passing from a confused and quasi-generic knowledge to a more determined and quasi-specific knowledge. And so, too, proposes Godfrey, we may reason, for instance, first by knowing him as a substance, then as an incorporeal substance, then as a living and intelligent incorporeal substance. He acknowledges that God does not really fall into any genus or species. Nonetheless, he maintains against Aquinas that we can know "what God is" in some real sense, even though he recognizes that in this life such knowledge will always be imperfect (PB 3.384-86; Wippel, 1981, 108-15).

Consistent with the above, Godfrey defends the presence of a plurality of attributes in God even though, because of the divine simplicity, these are only conceptually distinct from the divine essence and from one another. In Quodlibet VII, q. 1 he distinguishes two ways in which the term "attribute" may be taken. It may be used to signify a divine perfection in the sense that some perfection in a creature which does not imply any imperfection in and of itself, in other words a pure perfection, is assigned to God to an eminent degree. Or it may be taken as signifying a pure perfection which is realized in God as a "quasi-quality" which perfects the divine substance in a "quasi-accidental" fashion. Godfrey comments that it is in this second sense that attributes are usually applied to God, even though this is not intended to imply any real distinction or composition of substance and attribute in him. When taken in this second sense, Godfrey holds that there are many such quasi-qualities which perfect God in this quasi-accidental way, and therefore, many divine attributes. They are assigned to God in preeminent fashion because of his infinite perfection (PB 3.265).

In this same question Godfrey was asked to resolve a still more fundamental issue. Because of God's absolute simplicity, divine attributes signify perfections that are really identical with the divine essence and with one another. The conceptual distinction between them can only arise from an intellect's consideration. But what is the ultimate foundation for this conceptual distinction? Does it arise from a consideration of God simply as he is in himself, or does it only result from some reference to really distinct realizations of these perfections in creatures? Godfrey replies that if one takes an attribute in the first sense as implying that every pure perfection present in creatures is to be assigned to God to an infinite degree, the answer is clear. The intellect, especially a created intellect, can arrive at such a conceptual distinction of divine attributes only by reasoning from the really distinct instantiations of such perfections in creatures (PB 3.267-70; Wippel, 1981, 116-18). But what about the divine intellect? Godfrey then refers to and rejects the view of Henry of Ghent, according to whom attributes, when taken in the second sense, can be recognized as distinct and as multiple by God himself insofar as he views himself directly and without any reference to creatures. Against Henry, Godfrey maintains that not even God himself can be aware of this conceptual distinction between the divine attributes without referring to other beings in which these perfections are present in really distinct fashion. To hold otherwise would be to introduce too much distinction and diversity into the divine essence itself and would thereby compromise the divine simplicity (PB 3.267-73; Wippel, 1981, 118-23; Maurer, 1999, 192-200).

9. Eternity of the World

Together with his Christian contemporaries, Godfrey believed that the world began to be. But much debated was the question whether natural reason can prove this, or whether it can be held solely on the grounds of religious faith. Probably best known for holding that it cannot be demonstrated that the world began to be was Thomas Aquinas who in his De aeternitate mundi went a step beyond his earlier writings and maintained not only this but also that an eternally created world is possible (Wippel, 1984a, 203-14). Bonaventure had presented a series of arguments to prove that the world began to be, and many others strongly defended this position, including Henry of Ghent (Dales, 1990; Wippel, 1981, 153-58). Thus it is not surprising that in his Quodlibet II, q. 3 of Lent, 1286, Godfrey was asked to determine whether the world or any creature could be or exist from eternity.

Godfrey develops his position in conscious opposition to Henry of Ghent, and with a considerable but unacknowledged dependency on Aquinas's De aeternitate mundi which, as noted above, was contained in his Student Notebook. But after he has, with Aquinas, shown that there is no contradiction in holding that something can be created and still have begun to be, Godfrey considers certain objections against this position. One of these objections clearly gives him pause. If the world had been created from eternity, on every given day extending backward into a beginningless past God could have created some material object such as a stone. But if that had happened, an actual infinity of stones would now exist and God could unite all of them into one infinite body. But an infinite body is an impossibility, and so too is an infinity of simultaneously existing finite bodies and, therefore, so is an eternally created world (PB 2.68-69, 76; Wippel, 1981, 160-63).

Godfrey comments that this objection can also be formulated more forcefully in terms of human souls, i.e., the actual infinity of human souls that would have resulted from an eternal world eternally populated by human beings with immortal souls. Aquinas had considered this form of the objection in his De aeternitate mundi, and had noted that it has not yet been demonstrated that God could not produce an actual infinity of spiritual beings. Godfrey does not adopt this solution, presumably because he is convinced that an actual infinity of entities whether spiritual or material is impossible. Instead he proposes as a possible alternative an eternally populated world involving the transmigration of a finite number of souls to an infinity of bodies, and ordered only to their natural perfection. But because this world seems to be intended primarily for human beings destined to enjoy eternal happiness in soul and body, Godfrey grants that it may be argued with probability that this world could not have been created from eternity under the present dispensation by God's ordained power. But, he also remarks, this does not prove that no creature or no world could have been eternally created. He concludes that it cannot be demonstrated either that an eternal world is not possible, or that it is possible. Either side may be regarded as probable, and neither is to be rejected as theologically erroneous (PB 2.79-80; Wippel, 1981, 167-68).

10. Substance, Accidents, Human Action

In Quodlibet XIV, q. 5 Godfrey contrasts mental being with extramental being and then divides the latter into being per se and being per accidens. Being per se is divided into substance and the nine genera of accidents. The latter may be regarded as real modes of substance or of being in the unqualified sense (ens simpliciter). As Godfrey indicates elsewhere, a substance enjoys a separate being or exists in itself, while it is of the nature of an accident to be ordered to and to exist in something else. An accident is not so much a being as "of a being" (PB 5.427) For practical purposes Godfrey accepts the number of predicaments as ten, but indicates that determination of their precise number is a matter of probability rather than certainty (Wippel, 1981, 174-75). For Godfrey substance and accident are related as potency and act since substance serves as a subject for its accidents. Because of this he denies that any substance can be the efficient cause of the accidents that inhere in it, for it would then be in act with respect to them (as their efficient cause) and in potency (as receiving them) at one and the same time. He would always insist that nothing can be in act and in potency at one and the same time with respect to the same thing for this would be to assign being and nonbeing to it simultaneously. He also holds against many of his contemporaries that the powers of the soul are really distinct from the essence of the soul and from one another (Wippel, 1981, 176-84, 202-7).

If the soul's immanent operations such as thinking or willing inhere in their respective powers, the intellect and the will, those powers themselves cannot be the efficient causes of such acts. Against Henry of Ghent and later in Quodlibet XV against the Franciscan Gonsalvus of Spain, Godfrey denies that any exception can be made to the act-potency axiom. The will cannot reduce itself from potency to act or immediately efficiently cause its acts of volition. The efficient cause of volition can only be the object presented to the will by the intellect. Against the charge of intellectual determinism sometimes attributed to this position by its critics, Godfrey grounds human freedom in the radical indeterminacy, he even speaks of the freedom, of the intellect itself. And in his final Quodlibet XV, q. 4, he argues that if, per impossibile, the will could move itself directly without being moved by its object, freedom would be less well preserved than if one maintains with him that the will is moved by its object and then moves the apprehensive powers to their respective acts and, by means of such motions, indirectly moves itself with respect to secondary objects of volition (PB 14.20-23; Putallaz, 1995, 184-87, 198-208, 233-47; Kent ,1995, 108-9,141-42). In Quodlibet VII,q.5 Godfrey was asked whether a supposit (a concrete existing subject) adds any reality (res) to essence or nature. He maintains that in terms of their primary meaning or denotation supposit and nature are really one and the same, but in terms of its connotation, the term supposit signifies something more than does the term nature, that is, those accidents without which a supposit would not exist in the concrete order, and the exclusion of dependence upon another subject or center of existence. This has important implications for his theological discussion of the union of human nature and a divine person in Christ according to Christian faith (Wippel, 1981, 227-46; Cross, 2002, 69-70, 114-19, 290-95)

11. Theory of Abstraction

According to Godfrey the agent intellect and the possible intellects are distinct powers of the individual human soul. His theory of intellectual knowledge is based on the agent intellect's ability to abstract potentially intelligible content from phantasms (images) produced by the imagination, an internal sense. The imagination depends upon the external senses for the data preserved in the phantasms. In Quodlibet V, q. 10 he makes a studied effort to explain in what the process of abstraction from phantasms consists as he responds to the question whether the agent intellect produces any positive disposition in the phantasm. One of the functions of the agent intellect is to illuminate phantasms so that they can move the possible intellect to understand. Because the possible intellect is at times only in potency with respect to an intelligible object, and because nothing can reduce itself from potency to act, it must be reduced to the act of understanding by something else. Hence the agent intellect must in some way enable phantasms to move or to actualize the possible intellect.

But, argues Godfrey, because phantasms exist in the imagination and are organic and individuated and therefore incapable of moving a purely spiritual power which knows in universal fashion, the agent intellect does not introduce any positive disposition into the phantasms. Such a disposition would itself be individuated and organic and incapable of moving the possible intellect. He concludes, therefore, that the agent intellect operates on the phantasm simply by removing or separating or isolating one factor present therein—the quiddity of the thing, from another—its individuating characteristics. What has been so removed or separated or abstracted is thereby rendered universal and capable of moving the possible intellect. In what would become a frequently cited illustration, he draws an analogy with milk which possesses both color (white) and taste (sweet). Without the influence of light, however, it could not manifest itself or be perceived under the species of color (as white) without also manifesting itself under the species of taste (as sweet). Because of the influence of light one can speak of a kind of "abstraction" of the white from the sweet, although not in the sense that one would then exist apart from the other.

So, too, in the order of consideration although not in the order of reality, the agent intellect separates or frees the quiddity presented in a phantasm from its individuating conditions and thereby reduces it from being potentially intelligible to being actually intelligible and capable of moving the possible intellect to understand. This freeing or abstracting process takes place because of a kind of spiritual contact with the light of the agent intellect (Wippel, 1986).

12. Prime Matter

Godfrey defends the matter-form composition of corporeal beings but rejects any kind of spiritual matter and therefore any matter-form composition of spiritual entities. He also opposes the strong tendency within the Franciscan tradition, also promoted by Henry of Ghent, that would assign some minimum degree of actuality to prime matter. According to Godfrey prime matter is pure potentiality and can never be kept in existence without some substantial form, not even by God. Prime matter and substantial form are directly related to one another as potency principle and act principle. Neither is a being in its own right, but both are principles of one and the same composite entity (Quodlibet XIV, q. 5, PB 5.404-05).

13. Unicity vs. Plurality of Substantial Form

Heatedly debated in the 1270s and 1280s both at Paris and Oxford was the question concerning whether there is one or more than one substantial form in one substance, and especially in a human being. Godfrey devotes considerable attention to this, especially in Quodlibet II of Easter, 1286 and then again in Quodlibet III of Christmas, 1286. These dates are significant because alleged theological difficulties with the theory of unicity of substantial form as advanced by Aquinas and others had led to prohibitions and condemnations of this by the Archbishop of Canterbury, Robert Kilwardby, O.P on March 18, 1277, a reissuing of this by his successor in that see, John Pecham, O.F.M. in 1284, and finally a new and resounding condemnation by Pecham on April 30, 1286.

In Quodlibet II, q. 7 Godfrey considers three theories that defend plurality of forms in all material substances, or at least of duality of substantial forms in human beings (Henry of Ghent). Godfrey severely criticizes all three theories. Most fundamental among his many arguments against them is his conviction that a substantial form confers substantial being upon a composite substance. Therefore, the presence of more than one substantial form in such a being would undermine its substantial unity. Already in this discussion Godfrey addresses alleged theological issues raised against unicity of substantial form, especially one concerning the continuing numerical identity of Christ's body during the period between his death on Good Friday and his resurrection on Easter Sunday. At this point Godfrey's philosophical preference is for unicity of form in all material entities, including humans. He regards theories that defend plurality of forms in all material substances as more improbable, and Henry's theory of duality of forms in human beings as less improbable. He maintains that the theological question remains open to a defense either of unicity or of plurality of substantial forms.

In Quodlibet III, q. 5, after Pecham's condemnation of April, 1286, Godfrey examines the theological aspects of this issue in detail. Again he insists on one's freedom, theologically speaking, to defend either unicity or plurality of forms in human beings, especially at Paris, but does not commit himself definitively to either side (PB 2.197-211). In sum, when he is primarily concerned with the philosophical issues involved, he favors unicity of substantial form in all material substances. When discussing the theological issues, he is more hesitant and, without embracing either side in any definitive way, continues to argue for one's freedom to defend either side pending some future decision by the Church (Wippel, 1981, pp, 321-47).

14. The Principle of Individuation

Together with many of his contemporaries, Godfrey attempts to identify the principle within material entities that accounts for their being multiplied numerically within species. In discussing this he returns to the distinction he had drawn in Quodlibet VI, q. 16 between the kind of unity which serves as a principle of number and which is based on discrete quantity, and the kind that is convertible with being, transcendental unity. Because the substantial form is the determining principle within a corporeal entity and makes its essence capable of being defined, Godfrey holds that it is by reason of its form that such a substance enjoys transcendental unity.

Nonetheless, in Quodlibet VII, q. 5 he comments that if different individuals within the same species share in the same specific nature, that nature cannot itself serve as the principle that renders them numerically distinct from one another. Something else seems to be needed, perhaps quantity. But to make quantity the principle of individuation will not resolve the problem, for this would be to reduce the principle that distinguishes one substance from others within the same species to the level of an accident. Godfrey notes that in the case of created immaterial beings (angels), their substantial form is also that by which they are individuals. He proposes, therefore, that in corporeal substances it is also the substantial form that serves as their principle of individuation. Nonetheless, quantity has its role to play as well since it is required in order to divide matter into distinct parts and thereby enable it to receive and individuate substantial forms of the same kind. In other words, quantity disposes matter so as to enable it to function as the material principle of individuation. The formal cause or principle of a thing's individuation is its substantial form. Quantity is not the formal principle of individuation, but by disposing matter so that it can receive different substantial forms, it may be described as a quasi-material disposing cause of individuation (Wippel, 1981, 349-64).


As some of the more recent entries in this bibliography suggest by their titles, there has been a renewed interest on the part of scholars in certain aspects of Godfrey's moral and political philosophy, although a complete presentation of his moral philosophy still remains to be written. While de Lagarde's early long article on his political and social philosophy is dated, it is still useful. Helpful on his views on the relationship between the individual good and the common good (and many related topics) are chapters 8 and 9 in Kempshall, 1999. This should now be supplemented by Osborne, 2005, 139-50. Both studies offer important comparisons of Godfrey with other leading figures of his time. Marmursztejn (2006) offers many particular instances of Godfrey's thinking about various practical matters while developing her theme of different quodlibetal Masters' understanding of their role and their authority in determining disputed issues. Lambertini (2006) does much the same with respect to Godfrey's positions and those of several other Masters concerning a number of political issues in their respective Quodlibetal disputations.

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Related Entries

Aquinas, Saint Thomas | Giles of Rome | Henry of Ghent