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Civic Humanism

First published Tue Oct 1, 2002; substantive revision Wed Dec 19, 2007

A variant of republicanism indicating active, participatory, patriotic citizenship as well as the ethos and educational ideal that goes with it. The term was coined in the context of the embattled Weimar Republic and its genesis is deeply marked by the traditions of German historical scholarship. It was first used by the historian Hans Baron to describe an upsurge of patriotic republicanism as a response to foreign aggression and despotism, informed by the revival of classical models in Renaissance Florence. This movement is also taken as a decisive turning point away from medieval ways and towards liberating modernity.

The term civic humanism has gained wide circulation and influence since its reception into English-language historical writing. Its diffusion is closely connected with the ‘contextualist school’ in the history of ideas. Its original, historically circumscribed meaning was extended to indicate a political language or discourse extending from classical origins to epochal manifestations — ‘moments’ — in the ‘Atlantic republican tradition’. Reinterpretation of parts of the historical record of seventeenth century England and pre-revolutionary America as expressions of civic humanism provided a significant counterweight to the hitherto predominant Whig or Lockean-Liberal paradigm of constitutional development.

No longer necessarily tied to the interpretation of particular historical periods the term became part of the vocabulary of communitarianism and more generally of ideological opposition to liberalism understood as acquisitive individualism. It remained nonetheless important for the value of civic humanism as a paradigm of politics and civil society that it not be considered a mere ideological abstraction but that it be believed to have roots in the lived experience of the English-speaking polities. Beyond this relatively circumscribed usage the concept has entered the language and is used rather loosely and mostly with positive connotations to refer to public-spirited citizenship with varying degrees of exactitude.

In terms of sober historical scholarship the greatest value of the concept has been that of a heuristic device leading to important corrections of received ideas. As such it is itself now subject to serious criticism.

1. A Variant of Republicanism

Civic humanism is generally taken as an equivalent or as a particular variant of republicanism, meaning a conception of politics in which government is in principle the common business of the citizens. The "city" provides the environment — a public space — for human fulfillment. If, on the one hand, the republic is contrasted to personal or authoritarian government it also differs from the liberal model, which sees society as a collection of atomistic individuals held together by common rules designed to allow them maximum freedom to follow their particular and varied values and interests. As numerous republican theorists, notably Montesquieu, have emphasized, the republic requires widespread civic virtue, i.e.,the active participation of citizens united by a concern for the common good. The virtues of citizenship are in turn developed and enhanced by being exercised in upholding republican political and legal institutions and making them work by being involved in their operation. Republican life is then thought to be formative of the public spirit on which it rests. Republican freedom depends on constant civic activity. The polity is taken to cohere by means of the common acceptance of standards of justice that are more than procedural rules. The purpose of the commonwealth is not so much peace and ensuring the rights of individuals, as the realization of human potentiality, encouraging the flowering of all forms of creativity and inegenuity insofar as they contribute to public welfare. The republic is the necessary medium of self-realization, not merely the condition of possibility of private endeavors. Indeed, a certain amount of conflict, properly contained, adds to the liveliness and vigor of the republic. There is a link furthermore between the freedom of the citizen and the independence of the republic. Citizen armies and the right to bear arms are therefore common postulates of republican theory.

Civic humanism is linked in principle to a classical educational program that goes beyond the formative capacity of participatory citizenship itself and involves the conscious revival of ancient ideals. Republican candor, simplicity of manner, opposition to ostentation, luxury and lucre, are common, though not universal republican themes. Some theorists also dwell on the millenarian aspirations associated with republican ideals responding to the fragility of the republic and the need to provide against its corruption and decay with the passage of time.

2. A Historiographical Term

Unlike historical terms such as ‘the polis’ or ‘Christendom’ that were familiar to the contemporaries of the realities so described, ‘civic humanism’ is a historiographical term like the ‘Middle Ages’ that emerged as a heuristic category in an ex post facto reconstruction of the past.

The concept was first used to characterize a cluster of historical phenomena of Renaissance Florence. It was then extended to mark a republican tradition or political language reaching back to classical antiquity. It finally came to indicate a political ideal opposed to both classical liberal and authoritarian views of politics.

Its adoption by historians of ideas is linked with particular ways of doing history, first in the context of German historicist Geisteswissenschaften, then in connection with the methods developed by the ‘Cambridge School’, centered on the reconstruction of political discourses, exemplified by John Pocock and Quentin Skinner. It is by means of the latter reception that civic humanism entered the discussion about the intellectual origins of political currents in civil war England and pre-revolutionary America. This, in turn, occasioned the introduction of the term into the debate on the nature and quality of contemporary public life where it became closely associated with the advocacy of communitarianism.

3. The German Matrix: Geisteswissenschaft, Modernity, and Liberty

In its original German form Bürgerhumanismus first appeared in a book review by Hans Baron as early as 1925. In his subsequent work Baron used the term to describe the fusion of two distinct ideological currents of Florentine thought: apolitical ‘Petrarchan’ humanism on the one hand, and the Guelf tradition of patriotic resistance by the Florentine city-state to imperial domination on the other. The ‘rebirth’ of ancient letters and wisdom marked a revolutionary change of the European mind, but it remained limited to the contemplative pleasure and edification of quietist poets and scholars until it merged with the assertive defense of sovereign independence of the increasingly rich, powerful, and confident merchant cities of Italy. The fusion was effected, according to Baron, as a response to a crisis, as a reaction of the intellectual and political leadership of Florence to the aggressive expansionism of the despots of Milan. The resulting exaltation of liberty combined patriotic self-defense with the upholding of a republican way of life that departed from medieval ways by asserting worldly (diesseitig) values and embracing the active life in a manner evocative of the republics of antiquity. According to Baron's thesis, in the face of military danger the patterns of society, economy, and politics came to cohere in a culture, i.e. in a way of life infused by an educational ideal. The main champions of this were the great Chancellors of the Republic, Colluccio Salutati and especially Leonardo Bruni, top civil servants and public intellectuals combined, who restored the practical pertinence of classical learning in the process of establishing the terms of a new consensus.

Beyond seeking to identify the character of a particular time and place, Baron studied the political culture of Renaissance Florence as an instance of a transhistorically exemplary mode of communal existence pertinent, not least, to his own times. Florentine civic humanism represented for him, furthermore, a decisive turning point in history. For him it was an epochal event that, by looking backward to antiquity pointed forward to modernity, which he embraced wholeheartedly, without the misgivings of a Jacob Burckhardt or a Max Weber, as a liberating, civilizing, progressive process. The advent of civic humanism marked for Baron the victory of secular economic, social, and political ideals versus the asceticism, religious obscurantism, and hierarchy of the Middle Ages. Civic humanism provided the vital vehicle for the translation of the exalted ancient idea of citizenship to the modern age. The humanist defense of republican liberty against monarchical tyranny announced for him the beginnings of modern democratic thought, elevated by an educational ideal of classical inspiration, and accompanied by a renewed cultural creativity. It was thus the harbinger of the unequivocally positive trends in European civilization. The value of such achievements appeared all the more compelling since they were not theoretical postulates derived from abstract speculation but represented historically realized exempla.

Baron's reconstruction of civic humanism was not only directed against other-worldly values and notions of medieval deference, but also against different modes of construing modern autonomy. He sought in particular to revise Burckhardt's reading of Renaissance individualism as morally ambiguous, manifested not in the form of able and accomplished humanists who were present in the courts of tyrants and in the Papal administration, as much as in republican states such as Venice and Florence. Baron was no less opposed to the claims advanced by Ernst Kantorowicz and others about the modernity of the autocratic state of Frederic II, that were so difficult to square with a liberal and optimistically progressive view of history. That other reading of early modernity yielded antecedents not of enlightened ‘western-oriented’ democratic citizenship, but of ‘Nietschean’ antibourgeois individualism, in tune with antidemocratic ideological tendencies in German culture of the Weimar period, including the ‘high’ culture of the circle of Stefan George, and very much at odds with Baron's political convictions. What was at issue here, beyond the characterization of a historical period, was the definition and evaluation of modernity itself.

Baron wished to see the autonomous humanity he perceived emerging in quattrocento Florence integrated within a constitutional frame and anchored by patriotic attachment to the community. Baron's vast and only partly realized program to establish the Italian humanist tradition as a major source of modernity was deliberately juxtaposed to yet another tendency in German scholarship that sought the roots of modernity and modernization in Protestantism. Baron's emphasis on Florence was meant to counterbalance the ‘northern’ perspective of scholars such as Max Weber, Werner Sombart, and Baron's own mentor Ernst Troeltsch who, in their different ways, linked Protestantism and capitalism and saw the soul-searching subjectivity of Calvinist inspiration as a decisive moment in the genesis of modern individualism. Baron's historical project was inscribed in his advocacy of constitutional democracy on the West European and American model opposed to romantic nativist-Germanic notions for the Weimar republic. This orientation was affected for him, however, by the German intellectual tradition, for the exemplary polities were conceived not as formal frames of individual pursuits, but on the pattern of human autonomy woven into Sittlichkeit, the moral-cultural substance of German idealism. If this nexus of public solidarity be translated as civil society it should be evident why Baron's thesis should appeal to English-speaking communitarians. Yet, naturally, nuances change with every transfer.

Civic humanism is an inevitably rough and approximate rendition of Bürgerhumanismus.Bürger’, the first component of the term, connotes not only citizenship, but also a bourgeois social condition and outlook, as well as an urban context for the realization of the good life. ‘Humanismus’ in turn echoes the German reception of the heritage of classical antiquity. The ‘second’ humanism after that of the classical world itself involved the process of national renewal after the onslaught of Napoleon by means of an education that hinged on the Classics and aimed at — the equally untranslatable — ‘Bildung’ (formation and education) promoted by figures such as Wilhelm v. Humboldt. After the debacle of World War I and what was perceived as a flattening and instrumental reductionism of education in Germany, there was a nostalgic yearning for a ‘third humanism’, most eloquently articulated by Baron's near-contemporary Werner Jaeger. Though Baron did not share Jaeger's elitist outlook, they were of one mind regarding the authoritative value of the Classics.

Baron's principled opposition to German nationalism and its threat to the republican order was itself deeply affected by archetypes of the German intellectual tradition. An important and recurring theme is the awakening of patriotic citizenship, heightened by the lessons drawn from a classical education, in response to the aggression of a foreign despot. The subtitle of Baron's Crisis is telling in this regard: Civic Humanism and Republican Liberty in an Age of Classicism and Tyranny. As Riccardo Fubini has pointed out, although Baron stated that his book was inspired by the struggle of the western democracies against Hitlerian tyranny, the pattern was already set well before the coming to power of the Nazis, preformed by the inflections of German idealism. In this scheme the Visconti of Milan are implicitly a prefiguration of Bonaparte.

Baron's thesis has been criticized for neglecting political, institutional, and social history, in favor of identifying a pattern of consciousness as the decisive character of the political and historical phenomenon under study. It is true that Baron weaves together a way of life, an educational ideal, and the power of the state as an encompassing culture, that can be reconstructed as such in terms of Geistesgeschichte, the history of the spirit, by selecting from the evidence the materials needed for its purposes.

4. Reception in America: An Ideological Counterweight to Liberal Individualism

The psychological motivation for Baron's emphasis on the integration of the individual in the politically structured community may perhaps be connected to his situation as an assimilated Jew in Weimar Germany. Driven into exile when Hitler came to power he was destined to experience the challenge of integration in a new country that was not insignificantly perhaps, a republic at war with tyranny: the United States.

It was with the publication of The Crisis of the Early Renaissance in 1955 that civic humanism entered the vocabulary of English-speaking historiography. Its reception was influenced, however, by the work of another émigré, the distinguished and well-connected historian Felix Gilbert. If Baron had viewed civic humanism as an ethico-political response to events, Gilbert chose to regard it as a conceptual framework to be studied against ‘traditional political assumptions’. In this light civic humanism or ‘classical republicanism’ appeared as an ideology, not in the classical Marxist sense of an epiphenomenon of a putatively more real social reality, but as a discourse that circumscribes, if it does not determine, the field of possible meaning. According to Gilbert's perspective the language of civic humanism was not only a means of expression but also an instrument of power of the elites (such as the group that met in the Rucellai gardens in Machiavelli's Florence) who articulated it.

Gilbert departed from Baron's thesis in another significant respect: For Baron the pursuit of wealth and the entrepreneurial spirit of Renaissance merchants was an essential component of the epochal turn towards the active life and, as he writes on the first page of the Crisis, linked to the rise of a bourgeois society, Gilbert emphasized instead the opposition between acquisitiveness and patriotism, calling attention to the calls to sacrifice and self-denial in favor of the common good frequently found in republican texts.

The reconstruction of Florentine republicanism stressing the ideal of a republic of frugal, public-minded citizens in danger of being corrupted by luxury and the pursuit of private gain, a theme that could be traced back to ancient, especially Roman, authors, provided an attractive inspiration for a revisionist view of American history. Bernard Bailyn developed an image of The Ideological Origins of the American Revolution (1967), based on the classical republican rhetoric to be found in the political pamphlets and controversialist literature of the time leading up to the American founding. This recovered republicanism could counterbalance the canonical view, most clearly and forcefully expressed in Louis Hartz's Liberal Tradition in America (1955), of an American consensus of Lockean derivation, centered on the defense of property rights and animated by liberal individualism, an outlook so much taken for granted in Americans' understanding of themselves as to have become identified not as Lockeanism or liberalism but rather as "Americanism" or the "American way of life". The republican model provided an important corrective to the dominant orthodoxy and a great impetus to historical research.

This line of argument found a ready audience at a time when there was considerable discontent with American society and its institutions. The argument itself and its reception were no doubt influenced by Hannah Arendt's restatement of the Aristotelian ideal of participatory citizenship. Arendt's defense of the vita activa as a life of public engagement opposed to a life that reduces the pursuit of happiness to individual, selfish, and for the most part acquisitive private undertakings, involves more than the coming to fruition of a potentiality in principle intrinsic to man in the context of the polis that we find in Aristotle. The public engagement advocated by Arendt involves rather man's willed self-enactment in the public arena. Freedom and humanity are accomplished by action in the public eye, transcending labor to which man is compelled by necessity.

If civic humanism in the context of revisionist American history rejects the bourgeois matrix that was an essential part of Baron's thesis, it embraces his progressivism and indeed carries it to lengths he would not have envisaged. The Renaissance, and with it civic humanism, appears as a decisive turning point, asserting the positive values of modernity, in a teleological historical process of which American democracy, or its promised fulfillment, is cast as the culmination. In a process in the course of which, it is said, “humanity has fumbled through the centuries toward truth and freedom in modern science and democracy, American style” (W. McNeil, History for Citizens), Florentine republicanism prepares and prefigures the achievement of the American Revolution. At the same time a ‘republican tradition’ provides the foundation for a ‘loyal opposition’ to the American polity as it actually operates, appealing, as it were, to its better self.

5. The ‘Atlantic Republican Tradition’

In his influential book The Machiavellian Moment: Political Thought and the Atlantic Republican Tradition (1975), J.G.A. Pocock sought to trace the origins of modern republicanism in a manner that was sensitive to the authority of the ancients and their revivals. His reconstruction of ‘the Atlantic tradition’ does not depend on philological filiation, i.e. on showing that an author had read and was influenced by certain passages of an earlier author, but on identifying thematic affinities. Republicanism is “not a program, but a language”, available to be picked up, selectively and thematically at decisive ‘moments’. Pocock emphasizes both the enabling and the limiting, the evocative as much as the expressive capacity of language. “Men cannot do what they have no means of saying they have done, and what they do must be what they say and conceive that it is”. (JIH 3, 1972, 118). The eponymous moment of the book is ‘Machiavellian’ both insofar as it takes Renaissance civic humanism as an exemplary manifestation of republican and patriotic collective sentiment and insofar as it can be considered the response to a crisis amounting to what Machiavelli would call an occasione, a moment of disorder that gives scope to the formative activity of a new beginning.

This exercise requires, of course, an interpretation, already adumbrated by Baron, of Machiavelli as thoroughly republican, not primarily interested in the workings of power, but in exalting the satisfactions of active citizenship. By the same token Machiavelli's best known book, The Prince, must be treated as a momentary aberration belonging to a transitory phase. This view of a ‘defanged’ Machiavelli has found a surprisingly wide echo in popular writing. It is nonetheless possible, indeed necessary, to show that Machiavelli was consistently republican, but with a view to power and glory, and apt to justify the growing power of the modern state. Burkhardt's notion of the Renaissance “state as a work of art” correctly places Machiavellian statecraft on the side of modern artifice rather than ancient Aristotelian nature.

The problem of Florentine republicanism according to Pocock was to fit the idea of an Aristotelian polis within the framework of a Christian understanding of time. One answer to the experience of disorder was the explicitly millenarian exaltation of Savonarola. In Pocock's view, civic humanism provided a secular alternative in the form of a revived Aristotelian ‘science of virtue’ as the means of overcoming the republic's temporal finitude. Doubts have been raised both with regard to the philosophical depth of the supposed Aristotelianism of the Florentine humanists and the strength of metastatic aspirations as part of their program. With regard to the former, Quentin Skinner, the other significant English political theorist and historian to promote the recovery of civic humanism in a contextualist mode, has come to stress increasingly its Roman rather than Hellenic antecedents. This is not just a matter of identifying sources. Skinner's revised position means rather that in his view, civic humanism advocated active citizenship as a means to liberty from foreign and domestic domination, rather than as a self-fulfilling human end.

The theme of republican virtue as an aspiration to shore up the commonwealth against the ravages of time and corruption is taken up again by Pocock with regard to the English puritan revolution and its aftermath. According to him, a ‘Machiavellian’ civic humanist language, imbued with ‘classical republicanism’, was available when it became necessary to come to terms with the vacuum of legitimacy created by revolution and regicide. That language then developed into the discourse of the ‘country’ opposition to the ‘court’ party. It became the instrument of a political class resting on independent land-ownership that sought to defend itself against financial speculation and the advance of government patronage. Such patronage was also bound to determine the loyalties of a standing army. It therefore appeared necessary, in order to assure full citizenship, i.e. participation in public decisions as a matter of autonomous right, rather than as a grant or privilege conceded (hence in principle retractable) by the sovereign to a subject, that the citizens have a right to bear arms and organize militias.

This English republicanism then appears revolutionary in one obvious sense, but also profoundly conservative, defending the landed ‘parliamentary’ interest, in the name of citizen virtue, against encroachments by a central government and the nefarious influence of the ‘modernizing’ dynamics of trade and finance capitalism, reviled as corruption. Ironically, in Pocock's adaptation of Baron's thesis, applied to Anglo-Saxon materials, virtue is opposed to property, and it is the urban, bourgeois entrepreneurs and the chancery of the modernizing state, the very creators of civic humanism in Baron's mind, that are on the wrong side of the fence.

Pocock tells us that this civic humanist vocabulary, developed in England, was in turn available to the American colonists as they sought to articulate their protest and in the course of events to proclaim and justify their independence from the crown. In America furthermore, where, unlike England, a lasting republic did emerge, the language of republicanism acquired greater significance. Not all Americans were schooled in this tradition, but there was no alternative tradition in which to be schooled. In conjunction with the puritan ethos it continued to influence American life beyond independence, affecting the way Americans viewed the frontier, corruption, and the perpetuity of the republic. We find echoes of it in Jefferson's ideal of an agrarian republic and in the resistance to Hamiltonian ideas in favor of a strong central government, a central bank, and other aspects of a commercial empire, not to speak of the mistrust of standing armies and the constitutionally sanctioned right to bear arms. Pocock therefore sees republicanism affecting American attitudes and mores well beyond the framing of the constitution. Bernard Bailyn's student Gordon Wood, on the other hand is more focused on the tradition of republican thought leading up to the American Founding.Bailyn himself did not accept the term ‘civic humanism’ as adequate to the American reality, nor did he overestimate the importance of a republicanism in the American Revolution and its aftermath although still present, according to him, in the ferment of the colonial period. Wood, on the other hand,developed in The Creation of the American Republic (1969) aconceptual model that presented the Constitution as the turning away from republican ideals in a reactionary consolidation of interests under the sign of John Locke. In so doing Wood provided an ideological platform from which to criticize the American constituted order and the culture that underpins it that had the rhetorical and psychological advantage of being able to claim that it was pragmatically grounded in the lived experience of the American past, unlike alien and dogmatic Marxism.

In a later book, with a characteristically triumphalist subtitle, The Radicalism of the American Revolution, How a Revolution Transformed a Monarchical Society Into a Democratic One Unlike Any That Had Ever Existed (1992), Gordon Wood asserted that all over the ‘Atlantic world’ during the eighteenth century eageregalitarian citizens, pressing into the avant-garde of history, deliberately abolished monarchies and set up republics. Wood's postulate of a sweeping Zeitgeist apparently dismisses the developments of unquestionably Atlantic constitutional monarchies, in Scandinavia and the Netherlands for instance, not to seapk of Britain and Canada that to some observers would seem to have emerged as model democracies.

6. An Ideological Household Word

It is clear why such a synthesis would be attractive to communitarian critics of possessive individualism and liberal capitalism. At the same time civic humanism has become a kind of shorthand for a variety of phenomena, not without some confusion. The tone is sometimes critical, as when civic humanism is presented as a reductive pedagogical ideal relative to a full fledged religious education, or found wanting by lecturers at the libertarian Objectivist Center founded to propagate the ideas of Ayn Rand. But the undertone is generally positive, whether the term is used to characterize the way in which public schools in Virginia are said to be embedded in the life and values of their community, or the spirit animating ‘person centered’ community development work on the Zambezi, the alleged purpose of educating prison detainees in Illinois or the flourishing of the arts under the patronage of seventeenth century Wallachian princes. The Portuguese poet Camoes is said to have embraced an original form of civic humanism, condemning imperial expansion in his Lusiads. Civic humanism flourished in early modern German cities as well as in Italy. The Scottish Enlightenment was affected by it, and so were the aesthetics of Shaftsbury. We read of a visual aesthetics of eighteenth century civic humanism. Adam Smith himself had a dash of civic humanism. Hegel had to come to grips with it. Filipino intellectuals protesting Spanish rule in the nineteenth century developed principles of civic humanism. Henry Adams can be rescued from being considered reactionary by pointing to the struggle of liberalism and civic humanism in his breast. Rorty's pragmatism promises to pull together what modern epistemology has torn asunder, private and public, subject and object, knowledge and reality, in a reenactment of the synthesis supposedly achieved by Bruni, overcoming the alienation of obsession with a civitas dei separate from the here and now. American capitalism gets both defended and condemned in civic humanism's name. American philanthropy embodies it, as a weapon against tyranny. It is threatened by a post-ecological world and will be restored to health by neo-Marxist empowering education. The list could go on.

Such widespread and promiscuous usage shows that a notion unknown to the English language until 1955 has become something of a household word. Having emerged in the context of historical scholarship it has become part of the larger debate on the broad ideological parameters of public policy in modern societies and in the United States in particular. Conversely it is obvious that civic humanism and republicanism would be most liable to be attacked by critics from a liberal or Marxist point of view.

7. A Concept Revisited

As a matter of history it now seems clear that Baron's thesis made too much of the divide between the Renaissance and the Middle Ages, and that there was a venerable tradition of civic liberty in medieval communes. The larger question here is that of world-historical periodization, and whether we are entitled to continue to believe in the dawn of a world that will, despite temporary setbacks, eventually be bathed in the light of enlightened freedom.

It has also become evident that civic humanism owes much to the reaction of the Florentine upper classes to popular uprisings in the fourteenth century and is as much an ideology of social control as it is a language of liberation from medieval hierarchies. More generally it is clear that there was a great deal of difference between the celebratory rhetoric of humanists in the pay of the republic and the social and political realities of Renaissance Florence. This concerns not least the aggressive policy of conquest and domination pursued by Florence that was as much or more the cause of the Milanese wars as was Visconti expansionism.

In American history, despite valuable corrections to a historical outline too easily taken for granted, Locke is having an inevitable comeback as the major influence, along with the Protestant religious heritage, on the formation of American values. It is just as clear that the founders, for all their classical learning — or rather because of it — were wary of the instability and strife of ancient republics and therefore inclined to regard them as exemplary only with severe qualifications.

The polemical juxtaposition of civic humanist and liberal individualist paradigms of public consciousness has tended to accentuate differences and to reduce the rich complexity of the historical and social reality that they seek to capture to caricatures set up for the purpose of being shot down. There is furthermore a real danger that the ideological force civic humanism has acquired as a buzzword may overwhelm the historical foundations on which the concept rests. This is particularly critical for a term that draws a great deal of its strength from its claim to be rooted in lived historical antecedents.


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communitarianism | liberalism | liberty | Machiavelli, Niccolò | republicanism