Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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First published Thu Nov 28, 1996; substantive revision Mon Sep 10, 2007

As soon as one examines it, ‘liberalism’ fractures into a variety of types and competing visions. In this entry we focus on debates within the liberal tradition. We begin by (1) examining different interpretations of liberalism's core commitment — liberty. We then consider (2) the longstanding debate between the ‘old’ and the ‘new’ liberalism. In section (3) we turn to the more recent controversy about whether liberalism is a ‘comprehensive’ or a ‘political’ doctrine. We close in (4) by considering disagreements as to ‘the reach’ of liberalism — does it apply to all humankind, and must all political communities be liberal?

1. The Debate About Liberty

1.1 The Presumption in Favor of Liberty

‘By definition’, Maurice Cranston rightly points out, ‘a liberal is a man who believes in liberty’ (1967: 459). In two different ways, liberals accord liberty primacy as a political value. (i) Liberals have typically maintained that humans are naturally in ‘a State of perfect Freedom to order their Actions…as they think fit…without asking leave, or depending on the Will of any other Man’ (Locke, 1960 [1689]: 287). Mill too argued that ‘the burden of proof is supposed to be with those who are against liberty; who contend for any restriction or prohibition…. The a priori assumption is in favour of freedom…’ (1963, vol. 21: 262). Recent liberal thinkers such as as Joel Feinberg (1984: 9), Stanley Benn (1988: 87) and John Rawls (2001: 44, 112) agree. This might be called the Fundamental Liberal Principle (Gaus, 1996: 162-166): freedom is normatively basic, and so the onus of justification is on those who would limit freedom, especially through coercive means. It follows from this that political authority and law must be justified, as they limit the liberty of citizens. Consequently, a central question of liberal political theory is whether political authority can be justified, and if so, how. It is for this reason that social contract theory, as developed by Thomas Hobbes (1948 [1651]), John Locke (1960 [1689]), Jean-Jacques Rousseau (1973 [1762]) and Immanuel Kant (1965 [1797]), is usually viewed as liberal even though the actual political prescriptions of, say, Hobbes and Rousseau, have distinctly illiberal features. Insofar as they take as their starting point a state of nature in which humans are free and equal, and so argue that any limitation of this freedom and equality stands in need of justification (i.e., by the social contract), the contractual tradition expresses the Fundamental Liberal Principle.

(ii) The Fundamental Liberal Principle holds that restrictions on liberty must be justified, and because he accepts this, we can understand Hobbes as espousing a liberal political theory. But Hobbes is at best a qualified liberal, for he also argues that drastic limitations on liberty can be justified. Paradigmatic liberals such as Locke not only advocate the Fundamental Liberal Principle, but also maintain that justified limitations on liberty are fairly modest. Only a limited government can be justified; indeed, the basic task of government is to protect the equal liberty of citizens. Thus John Rawls's first principle of justice: ‘Each person is to have an equal right to the most extensive system of equal basic liberty compatible with a similar system for all’ (Rawls, 1999b: 220).

1.2 Negative Liberty

Liberals disagree, however, about the concept of liberty, and as a result the liberal ideal of protecting individual liberty can lead to very different conceptions of the task of government. As is well-known, Isaiah Berlin advocated a negative conception of liberty:

I am normally said to be free to the degree to which no man or body of men interferes with my activity. Political liberty in this sense is simply the area within which a man can act unobstructed by others. If I am prevented by others from doing what I could otherwise do, I am to that degree unfree; and if this area is contracted by other men beyond a certain minimum, I can be described as being coerced, or, it may be, enslaved. Coercion is not, however, a term that covers every form of inability. If I say that I am unable to jump more than ten feet in the air, or cannot read because I am blind…it would be eccentric to say that I am to that degree enslaved or coerced. Coercion implies the deliberate interference of other human beings within the area in which I could otherwise act. You lack political liberty or freedom only if you are prevented from attaining a goal by other human beings (Berlin, 1969: 122).

For Berlin and those who follow him, then, the heart of liberty is the absence of coercion by others; consequently, the liberal state's commitment to protecting liberty is, essentially, the job of ensuring that citizens do not coerce each other without compelling justification.

1.3 Positive Liberty

Many liberals have been attracted to more ‘positive’ conceptions of liberty. Although Rousseau (1973 [1762]) seemed to advocate a positive conception of liberty, according to which one was free when one acted according to one's true will (the general will), the positive conception was best developed by the British neo-Hegelians of the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries, such as Thomas Hill Green and Bernard Bosanquet (2001 [1923]). Green acknowledged that ‘…it must be of course admitted that every usage of the term [i.e., ‘freedom’] to express anything but a social and political relation of one man to other involves a metaphor…It always implies…some exemption from compulsion by another…’(1986 [1895]: 229). Nevertheless, Green went on to claim that a person can be unfree if he is subject to an impulse or craving that cannot be controlled. Such a person, Green argued, is ‘…in the condition of a bondsman who is carrying out the will of another, not his own’ (1986 [1895]: 228). Just as a slave is not doing what he really wants to do, one who is, say, an alcoholic, is being led by a craving to look for satisfaction where it cannot, ultimately, be found.

For Green, a person is free only if she is self-directed or autonomous. Running throughout liberal political theory is an ideal of a free person as one whose actions are in some sense her own. Such a person is not subject to compulsions, critically reflects on her ideals and so does not unreflectively follow custom, and does not ignore her long-term interests for short-term pleasures. This ideal of freedom as autonomy has its roots not only in Rousseau's and Kant's political theory, but also in John Stuart Mill's On Liberty. And today it is a dominant strain in liberalism, as witnessed by the work of S.I. Benn (1988), Gerald Dworkin (1988), and Joseph Raz (1986); see also the essays in Christman and Anderson (2005).

This Greenian, autonomy-based, conception of positive freedom is often run together with a very different notion of ‘positive’ freedom: freedom as effective power to act or to pursue one's ends. In the words of the British socialist R. H. Tawney, freedom thus understood is ‘the ability act’ (1931: 221; see also Gaus, 2000; ch. 5.) On this view of positive freedom, a person who is not prohibited from being a member of a Country Club but who is too poor to afford membership is not free to be a member: she does not have an effective power to act. Although the Greenian autonomy-based conception of positive freedom certainly had implications for the distribution of resources (education, for example, should be easily available so that all can develop their capacities), positive freedom qua effective power to act closely ties freedom to material resources. It was this conception of positive liberty that Hayek had in mind when he insisted that although ‘freedom and wealth are both good things…they still remain different’ (1960: 17-18).

1.4 Republican Liberty

An older notion of liberty that has recently undergone resurgence is the republican, or neo-Roman, conception of liberty which has it roots in the writings of Cicero and Niccolo Machiavelli (1950 [1513]). According to Philip Pettit, ‘The contrary of the liber, or free, person in Roman, republican usage was the servus, or slave, and up to at least the beginning of the last century, the dominant connotation of freedom, emphasized in the long republican tradition, was not having to live in servitude to another: not being subject to the arbitrary power of another’ (Pettit, 1996: 576). On this view, the opposite of freedom is domination. An agent is said to be unfree if she is ‘subject to the potentially capricious will or the potentially idiosyncratic judgement of another’ (Pettit, 1997: 5). The ideal liberty-protecting government, then, ensures that no agent, including itself, has arbitrary power over any citizen. The key method by which this is accomplished is through an equal disbursement of power. Each person has power that offsets the power of another to arbitrarily interfere with her activities (Pettit, 1997: 67).

The republican conception of liberty is certainly distinct from both Greenian positive and negative conceptions. Unlike Greenian positive liberty, republican liberty is not primarily concerned with rational autonomy, realizing one's true nature, or becoming one's higher self. When all dominating power has been dispersed, republican theorists are generally silent about these goals (Larmore 2001). Unlike negative liberty, republican liberty is primarily focused upon ‘defenseless susceptibility to interference, rather than actual interference’ (Pettit, 1996: 577). Thus, in contrast to the ordinary negative conception, on the republican conception the mere possibility of arbitrary interference appears to constitute a limitation of liberty. Republican liberty thus seems to involve a modal claim about the possibility of interference, and this is often cashed out in terms of complex counterfactual claims. It is not clear whether these claims can be adequately explicated (Gaus, 2003; cf. Larmore, 2004).

Some republican theorists, such as Quentin Skinner (1998: 113), Maurizio Viroli (2002: 6) and Pettit (1997: 8-11), view republicanism as an alternative to liberalism. Insofar as republican liberty is seen as a basis for criticizing market liberty and market society, this is plausible (Gaus, 2003). However, when liberalism is understood more expansively, and not so closely tied to either negative liberty or market society, republicanism becomes indistinguishable from liberalism (Larmore 2001; Dagger, 1997).

2. The Debate Between the ‘Old’ and the ‘New’

2.1 Classical Liberalism

Liberal political theory, then, fractures over the conception of liberty. But a more important division concerns the place of private property and the market order. For classical liberals — sometimes called the ‘old’ liberalism — liberty and private property are intimately related. From the eighteenth century right up to today, classical liberals have insisted that an economic system based on private property is uniquely consistent with individual liberty, allowing each to live her life —including employing her labor and her capital — as she sees fit. Indeed, classical liberals and libertarians have often asserted that in some way liberty and property are really the same thing; it has been argued, for example, that all rights, including liberty rights, are forms of property; others have maintained that property is itself a form of freedom (Gaus, 1994; Steiner, 1994). A market order based on private property is thus seen as an embodiment of freedom (Robbins, 1961: 104). Unless people are free to make contracts and to sell their labour, or unless they are free to save their incomes and then invest them as they see fit, or unless they are free to run enterprises when they have obtained the capital, they are not really free.

Classical liberals employ a second argument connecting liberty and private property. Rather than insisting that the freedom to obtain and employ private property is simply one aspect of people's liberty, this second argument insists that private property is the only effective means for the protection of liberty. Here the idea is that the dispersion of power that results from a free market economy based on private property protects the liberty of subjects against encroachments by the state. As F.A. Hayek argues, ‘There can be no freedom of press if the instruments of printing are under government control, no freedom of assembly if the needed rooms are so controlled, no freedom of movement if the means of transport are a government monopoly’ (1978: 149).

Although classical liberals agree on the fundamental importance of private property to a free society, the classical liberal tradition itself refracts into a spectrum of views, from near-anarchist to those that attribute a significant role to the state in economic and social policy (on this spectrum, see Mack and Gaus, 2004). Towards the most extreme ‘libertarian’ end of the classical liberal spectrum are views of justified states as legitimate monopolies that may with justice charge for their necessary rights-protection services: taxation is legitimate so long as it is necessary to protect liberty and property rights. As we go further ‘leftward’ we encounter classical liberal views that allow taxation for (other) public goods and social infrastructure and, moving yet further ‘left’, some classical liberal views allow for a modest social minimum.(e.g., Hayek, 1976: 87). Most nineteenth century classical liberal economists endorsed a variety of state policies, encompassing not only the criminal law and enforcement of contracts, but the licensing of professionals, health, safety and fire regulations, banking regulations, commercial infrastructure (roads, harbors and canals) and often encouraged unionization (Gaus, 1983b). Although today classical liberalism is often associated with extreme forms of libertarianism, the classical liberal tradition was centrally concerned with bettering the lot of the working class. The aim, as Bentham put it, was to make the poor richer, not the rich poorer (Bentham, 1952 [1795]: vol. 1, 226n). Consequently, classical liberals reject the redistribution of wealth as a legitimate aim of government.

2.2 The ‘New Liberalism’

What has come to be known as ‘new’, ‘revisionist’, ‘welfare state’, or perhaps best, ‘social justice’, liberalism challenges this intimate connection between personal liberty and a private property based market order (Freeden, 1978; Gaus, 1983b; Paul, Miller and Paul, 2007). Three factors help explain the rise of this revisionist theory. First, the new liberalism arose in the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries, a period in which the ability of a free market to sustain what Lord Beveridge (1944: 96) called a ‘prosperous equilibrium’ was being questioned. Believing that a private property based market tended to be unstable, or could, as Keynes argued (1973 [1936]), get stuck in an equilibrium with high unemployment, new liberals came to doubt that it was an adequate foundation for a stable, free society. Here the second factor comes into play: just as the new liberals were losing faith in the market, their faith in government as a means of supervising economic life was increasing. This was partly due to the experiences of the First World War, in which government attempts at economic planning seemed to succeed (Dewey, 1929: 551-60); more importantly, this reevaluation of the state was spurred by the democratization of western states, and the conviction that, for the first time, elected officials could truly be, in J.A. Hobson's phrase ‘representatives of the community’ (1922: 49). As D.G. Ritchie proclaimed:

be it observed that arguments used against ‘government’ action, where the government is entirely or mainly in the hands of a ruling class or caste, exercising wisely or unwisely a paternal or grandmotherly authority — such arguments lose their force just in proportion as the government becomes more and more genuinely the government of the people by the people themselves (1896: 64).

The third factor underlying the development of the new liberalism was probably the most fundamental: a growing conviction that, so far from being ‘the guardian of every other right’ (Ely, 1992: 26), property rights generated an unjust inequality of power that led to a less-than-equal liberty (typically, ‘positive liberty’) for the working class. This theme is central to what is usually called ‘liberalism’ in American politics, combining a strong endorsement of civil and personal liberties with, at best, an indifference, and often enough an antipathy, to private ownership. The seeds of this newer liberalism can be found in Mill's On Liberty. Although Mill insisted that the ‘so-called doctrine of Free Trade’ rested on ‘equally solid’ grounds as did the ‘principle of individual liberty’ (1963, vol. 18: 293), he nevertheless insisted that the justifications of personal and economic liberty were distinct. And in his Principles of Political Economy Mill consistently emphasized that it is an open question whether personal liberty can flourish without private property (1963, vol. 2; 203-210), a view that Rawls was to reassert over a century later (2001: Part IV).

2.3 Liberal Theories of Social Justice

One of the many consequences of Rawls's great work, A Theory of Justice (1999 [first published in 1971]) is that the ‘new liberalism’ has become focused on developing a theory of social justice. For over thirty-five years liberal political philosophers have analyzed, and disputed, his famous ‘difference principle’ according to which a just basic structure of society arranges social and economic inequalities such that they are to the greatest advantage of the least well off representative group (1999b: 266). For Rawls, the default is an equal distribution of (basically) income and wealth; only inequalities that best enhance the long-term prospects of the least advantaged are just. As Rawls sees it, the difference principle constitutes a public recognition of the principle of reciprocity: the basic structure is to be arranged such that no social group advances at the cost of another (2001: 122-24). Many followers of Rawls have focused less on the ideal of reciprocity than the commitment to equality (Dworkin, 2000). Indeed, what was previously called ‘welfare state’ liberalism is now often described as ‘egalitarian’ liberalism. And in one way that is especially appropriate: in his later work Rawls insists that welfare-state capitalism does not constitute a just basic structure (2001: 137-38). If some version of capitalism is to be just it must be a ‘property owning democracy’ with a wide diffusion of ownership; a market socialist regime, in Rawls's view, is more just than welfare-state capitalism (2001: 135-38). Not too surprisingly, classical liberals such as Hayek (1976) insist that the contemporary liberal fixation on ‘the mirage of social justice’ leads them to ignore the way that freedom depends on a decentralized market based on private property, the overall results of which are unpredictable. In a similar vein, Robert Nozick (1974: 160ff) famously argued that any attempt to ensure that market transactions conform to any specific pattern of holdings will involve constant interferences with individual freedom.

3. The Debate About the Comprehensiveness of Liberalism

3.1 Political Liberalism

As his work evolved, Rawls (1996: 5ff) insisted that his liberalism was not a ‘comprehensive’ doctrine, that is, one which includes an overall theory of value, an ethical theory, an epistemology, or a controversial metaphysics of the person and society. Our modern societies, characterized by a ‘reasonable pluralism’, are already filled with such doctrines. The aim of ‘political liberalism’ is not to add yet another sectarian doctrine, but to provide a political framework that is neutral between such controversial comprehensive doctrines (Larmore, 1996: 121ff). If it is to serve as the basis for public reasoning in our diverse western societies, liberalism must be restricted to a core set of political principles that are, or can be, the subject of consensus among all reasonable citizens. Rawls's notion of a purely political conception of liberalism seems more austere than the traditional liberal political theories discussed above, being largely restricted to constitutional principles upholding basic civil liberties and the democratic process.

As Gaus (2004) has argued, the distinction between ‘political’ and ‘comprehensive’ liberalism misses a great deal. Liberal theories form a broad continuum, from those that constitute full-blown philosophical systems, to those that rely on a full theory of value and the good, to those that rely on a theory of the right (but not the good), all the way to those that seek to be purely political doctrines. Nevertheless, it is important to appreciate that, though liberalism is primarily a political theory, it has been associated with broader theories of ethics, value and society. Indeed, many believe that liberalism cannot rid itself of all controversial metaphysical (Hampton, 1989) or epistemological (Raz, 1990) commitments.

3.2 Liberal Ethics

Following Wilhelm von Humboldt (1993 [1854]), in On Liberty Mill argues that one basis for endorsing freedom (Mill believes that there are many), is the goodness of developing individuality and cultivating capacities:

Individuality is the same thing with development, and…it is only the cultivation of individuality which produces, or can produce, well-developed human beings…what more can be said of any condition of human affairs, than that it brings human beings themselves nearer to the best thing they can be? or what worse can be said of any obstruction to good, than that it prevents this? (Mill, 1963, vol. 18: 267)

This is not just a theory about politics: it is a substantive, perfectionist, moral theory about the good. And, on this view, the right thing to do is to promote development or perfection, and only a regime securing extensive liberty for each person can accomplish this (Wall, 1998). This moral ideal of human perfection and development dominated liberal thinking in the latter part of the nineteenth, and for most of the twentieth, century: not only Mill, but T.H. Green, L.T. Hobhouse, Bernard Bosanquet, John Dewey and even Rawls show allegiance to variants of this perfectionist ethic and the claim that it provides a foundation for endorsing a regime of liberal rights (Gaus, 1983a). And it is fundamental to the proponents of liberal autonomy discussed above, as well as ‘liberal virtue’ theorists such as William Galston (1980). That the good life is necessarily a freely chosen one in which a person develops his unique capacities as part of a plan of life is probably the dominant liberal ethic of the past century.

The main challenge to Millian perfectionism as the distinctly liberal ethic comes from moral contractualism, which can be divided into what might very roughly be labeled ‘Kantian’ and ‘Hobbesian’ versions. According to Kantian contractualism, ‘society, being composed of a plurality of persons, each with his own aims, interests, and conceptions of the good, is best arranged when it is governed by principles that do not themselves presuppose any particular conception of the good…’(Sandel, 1982: 1). On this view, respect for the person of others demands that we refrain from imposing our view of the good life on them. Only principles that can be justified to all respect the personhood of each. We thus witness the tendency of recent liberal theory (Reiman, 1990; Scanlon, 1998) to transform the social contract from an account of the state to an overall justification of morality, or at least a social morality. Basic to such ‘Kantian contractualism’ is the idea that suitably idealized individuals are motivated not by the pursuit of gain, but by a commitment or desire to publicly justify the claims they make on others (Reiman, 1990; Scanlon, 1982). A moral code that could be the object of agreement among such individuals is thus a publicly justified morality.

In contrast, the Hobbesian version of contractualism supposes only that individuals are self-interested, and correctly perceive that each person's ability to effectively pursue her interests is enhanced by a framework of norms that structure social life and divide the fruits of social cooperation (Gauthier, 1986; Kavka, 1986). Morality, then, is common framework that advances the self-interest of each. The claim of Hobbesian contractualism to be a distinctly liberal conception of morality stems from the importance of individual freedom and property in such a common framework: only systems of norms that allow each person great freedom to pursue her interests as she sees fit could, it is argued, be the object of consensus among self-interest agents. The continuing problem for Hobbesian contractualism is the apparent rationality of free-riding: if everyone (or enough) complies with the terms of the contract, and so social order is achieved, it would seem rational to defect, and act immorally when one can gain by doing so. This is essentially the argument of Hobbes's ‘Foole’, and from Hobbes (1948 [1651]: 94ff) to Gauthier (1986: 160ff), Hobbesians publicly justify have tried to reply to it.

3.3 Liberal Theories of Value

Turning from rightness to goodness, we can identify three main candidates for a liberal theory of value. We have already encountered the first: perfectionism. Insofar as perfectionism is a theory of right action, it can be understood as an account of morality. Obviously, however, it is an account of rightness that presupposes a theory of value or the good: the ultimate human value is developed personality or an autonomous life. Competing with this objectivist theory of value are two other liberal accounts: pluralism and subjectivism.

In his famous defence of negative liberty, Berlin insisted that values or ends are plural, and no interpersonally justifiable ranking among these many ends is to be had. More than that, Berlin maintained that the pursuit of one end necessarily implies that other ends will not be achieved. In this sense ends collide or, in the more prosaic terms of economics, the pursuit of one end necessarily entails opportunity costs in relation to others which cannot be impersonally shown to be less worthy. So there is no interpersonally justifiable way to rank the ends, and there is no way to achieve them all. The upshot is that each person must devote herself to some ends at the cost of ignoring others. For the pluralist, then, autonomy, perfection or development are not necessarily ranked higher than hedonistic pleasures, environmental preservation or economic equality. All compete for our allegiance, but because they are incommensurable, no choice can be interpersonally justified as correct.

The pluralist is not a subjectivist: that values are many, competing and incommensurable does not imply that they are somehow dependent on subjective experiences. But the claim that what a person values rests on experiences that vary from person to person has long been a part of the liberal tradition. To Hobbes, what one values depends on what one desires (1948 [1651]: 48). Locke advances a ‘taste theory of value’:

The Mind has a different relish, as well as the Palate; and you will as fruitlessly endeavour to delight all Man with Riches or Glory, (which yet some Men place their Happiness in,) as you would satisfy all men's Hunger with Cheese or Lobsters; which, though very agreeable and delicious fare to some, are to others extremely nauseous and offensive: And many People would with reason preferr [sic] the griping of an hungry Belly, to those Dishes, which are a Feast to others. Hence it was, I think, that the Philosophers of old did in vain enquire, whether the Summum bonum consisted in Riches, or bodily Delights, or Virtue, or Contemplation: And they might have as reasonably disputed, whether the best Relish were to be found in Apples, Plumbs or Nuts; and have divided themselves into Sects upon it. For…pleasant Tastes depend not on the things themselves, but their agreeableness to this or that particulare Palate, wherein there is great variety…(1975 [1706]: 269).

The perfectionist, the pluralist and the subjectivist concur on the crucial point: the nature of value is such that reasonable people pursue different ways of living. To the perfectionist, this is because each person has unique capacities, the development of which confers value on her life; to the pluralist, it is because values are many and conflicting, and no one life can include them all, or make the interpersonally correct choice among them; and to the subjectivist, it is because our ideas about what is valuable stem from our desires or tastes, and these differ from one individual to another. All three views, then, defend the basic liberal idea that people rationally follow very different ways of living. But in themselves, such notions of the good do not constitute a full-fledged liberal ethic, for an additional argument is required linking liberal value with norms of equal liberty. To be sure, Berlin seems to believe this is a very quick argument: the inherent plurality of ends points to the political preeminence of liberty. Guaranteeing each a measure of negative liberty is, Berlin argues, the most humane ideal, as it recognises that ‘human goals are many’, and no one can make a choice that is right for all people (1969: 171). But the move from diversity to equal liberty and individual rights seems a complicated one; it is here that both subjectivists and pluralists often rely on versions of moral contractualism. Those who insist that liberalism is ultimately a nihilistic theory can be interpreted as arguing that this transition cannot be made successfully: liberals, on their view, are stuck with a subjectivistic or pluralistic theory of value, and no account of the right emerges from it.

3.4 The Metaphysics of Liberalism

Throughout the last century, liberalism has been beset by controversies between, on the one hand, those broadly identified as ‘individualists’ and, on the other, ‘collectivists’, ‘communitarians’ or ‘organicists’ (for skepticism about this, though, see Bird, 1999). These vague and sweeping designations have been applied to a wide array of disputes; we focus here on controversies concerning (i) the nature of society; (ii) the nature of the self.

Liberalism is, of course, usually associated with individualist analyses of society. ‘Human beings in society’, Mill claimed, ‘have no properties but those which are derived from, and which may be resolved into, the laws of the nature of individual men’ (1963, Vol. 8: 879; see also Bentham: 1970 [1823]: chap. I, sec. 4). Herbert Spencer agreed: ‘the properties of the mass are dependent upon the attributes of its component parts’ (1995 [1851]: 1). In the last years of the nineteenth century this individualist view was increasingly subject to attack, especially by those who were influenced by idealist philosophy. D. G. Ritche, criticizing Spencer's individualist liberalism, explicitly rejected the idea that society is simply a ‘heap’ of individuals, insisting that it is more akin to an organism, with a complex internal life (1896: 13). Liberals such as L. T. Hobhouse and Dewey refused to adopt radically collectivist views such as those advocated by Bernard Bosanquet (2001), but they too rejected the radical individualism of Bentham, Mill and Spencer. Throughout most of the first half of the twentieth century such ‘organic’ analyses of society held sway in liberal theory, even in economics (see A.F Mummery and J. A. Hobson, 1956: 106; J.M. Keynes, 1972: 275).

During and after the Second World War the idea that liberalism was based on inherently individualist analysis of humans-in-society arose again. Karl Popper's The Open Society and its Enemies (1945) presented a sustained critique of Hegelian and Marxist theory and its collectivist and historicist, and to Popper, inherently illiberal, understanding of society. The reemergence of economic analysis in liberal theory brought to the fore a thoroughgoing methodological individualism. Writing in the early 1960s, James Buchanan and Gordon Tullock adamantly defended the ‘individualistic postulate’ against all forms of ‘organicism’: ‘This [organicist] approach or theory of the collectivity….is essentially opposed to the Western philosophical tradition in which the human individual is the primary philosophical entity’ (1965: 11-12). Human beings, insisted Buchanan and Tullock, are the only real choosers and decision-makers, and their preferences determine both public and private actions. The renascent individualism of late-twentieth century liberalism was closely bound up with the induction of Hobbes as a member of the liberal pantheon. Hobbes's relentlessly individualistic account of society, and the manner in which his analysis of the state of nature lent itself to game-theoretical modeling, yielded a highly individualist, formal analysis of the liberal state and liberal morality.

Of course, as is widely known, the last twenty-five years have witnessed a renewed interest in collectivist analyses of liberal society —though the term ‘collectivist’ is abjured in favor of ‘communitarian’. Writing in 1985, Amy Gutmann observed that ‘we are witnessing a revival of communitarian criticisms of liberal political theory. Like the critics of the 1960s, those of the 1980s fault liberalism for being mistakenly and irreparably individualistic’ (1985: 308). Starting with Michael Sandel's (1982) famous criticism of Rawls, a number of critics charged that liberalism was necessarily premised on an abstract conception of individual selves as pure choosers, whose commitments, values and concerns are possessions of the self, but never constitute the self. Although the now famous, not to say infamous, ‘liberal-communitarian’ debate ultimately involved wide-ranging moral, political and sociological disputes about the nature of communities, and the rights and responsibilities of their members, the heart of the debate was about the nature of liberal selves. For Sandel the flaw at the heart of Rawls's liberalism was its implausibly abstract theory of the self, the pure autonomous chooser. Rawls, he charges, ultimately assumes that it makes sense to identify us with a pure capacity for choice, and that such pure choosers might reject any or all of their attachments and values and yet retain their identity.

From the mid-1980s onwards various liberals sought to show how liberalism may consistently advocate a theory of the self which finds room for cultural membership and other non-chosen attachments and commitments which at least partially constitute the self (Kymlicka, 1989). Much of liberal theory has became focused on the issue as to how we can be social creatures, members of cultures and raised in various traditions, while also being autonomous choosers who employ our liberty to construct lives of our own.

4. The Debate About The Reach of Liberalism

4.1 Is Liberalism Justified in All Political Communities?

In On Liberty Mill argued that ‘Liberty, as a principle, has no application to any state of things anterior to the time when mankind have become capable of being improved by free and equal discussion’ (1963, vol. 18: 224). Thus ‘Despotism is a legitimate form of government in dealing with barbarians, provided the end be their improvement…. ’(1963, vol. 18: 224). This passage — infused with the spirit of nineteenth century imperialism — is often ignored by defenders of Mill as an embarrassment. Nevertheless, it raises a question that still divides liberals: are liberal political principles justified for all political communities? In The Law of Peoples Rawls argues that they are not. According to Rawls there can be a ‘decent hierarchical society’ which is not based on the liberal conception of all persons as free and equal, but instead views persons as ‘responsible and cooperating members of their respective groups’ but not inherently equal (1999a: 66). Given this, the full liberal conception of justice cannot be constructed out of shared ideas of this ‘people’, though basic human rights, implicit in the very idea of a social cooperative structure, apply to all peoples. David Miller (2002) develops a different defense of this anti-universalistic position, while those such as Thomas Pogge (2002: ch. 4) and Martha Nussbaum (2002) reject Rawls's position, instead advocating versions of moral universalism: they claim that liberal moral principles apply to all states.

4.2 Is Liberalism a Cosmopolitan or a State-centered Theory?

The debate about whether liberal principles apply to all political communities should not be confused with the debate as to whether liberalism is a state-centered theory, or whether, at least ideally, it is a cosmopolitan political theory for the community of all humankind. Immanuel Kant — a moral universalist if ever there was one — argued that all states should respect the dignity of their citizens as free and equal persons, yet denied that humanity forms one political community. Thus he rejected the ideal of a universal cosmopolitan liberal political community in favor of a world of states, all with internally just constitutions, and united in a confederation to assure peace (1970 [1795]).

On a classical liberal theory, the difference between a world of liberal communities and a world liberal community is not of fundamental importance. Since the aim of government in a community is to assure the basic liberty and property rights of its citizens, borders are not of great moral significance in classical liberalism (Lomasky, 2007; but cf. Pogge, 2002: ch. 2). In contrast under the ‘new’ liberalism, which stresses redistributive programs to achieve social justice, it matters a great deal who is included within the political or moral community. If liberal principles require significant redistribution, then it is crucially important whether these principles apply only within particular communities, or whether their reach is global. Thus a fundamental debate between Rawls and many of his followers is whether the difference principle should only be applied within a liberal state such as the United States (where the least well off are the least well off Americans), or whether it should be applied globally (where the least well off are the least well off in the world) (Rawls, 1999a: 113ff; Beitz, 1973: 143ff; Pogge, 1989: Part Three).

4.3 Liberal Interaction with Non-Liberal Groups: International

Liberal political theory also fractures concerning the appropriate response to groups (cultural, religious, etc.) which endorse illiberal policies and values. These groups may deny education to some of their members, advocate female genital mutilation, restrict religious freedom, maintain an inequitable caste system, and so on. When, if ever, is it reasonable for a liberal group to interfere with the internal governance of an illiberal group?

Suppose first that the illiberal group is another political community or state. Can liberals intervene in the affairs of non-liberal states? Mill provides a complicated answer in his 1859 essay ‘A Few Words on Non-Intervention’. Reiterating his claim from On Liberty that civilized and non-civilized countries are to be treated differently, he insists that ‘barbarians have no rights as a nation, except a right to such treatment as may, at the earliest possible period, fit them for becoming one. The only moral laws for the relation between a civilized and a barbarous government, are the universal rules of morality between man and man’ (1963, vol. 21: 119). Although this strikes us today as simply a case for an objectionable paternalistic imperialism (and it certainly was such a case), Mill's argument for the conclusion is more complex, including a claim that, since international morality depends on reciprocity, ‘barbarous’ governments that cannot be counted on to engage in reciprocal behavior have no rights qua governments. In any event, when Mill turns to interventions among ‘civilized’ peoples he develops an altogether more sophisticated account as to when one state can intervene in the affairs of another to protect liberal principles. Here Mill is generally against intervention. ‘The reason is, that there can seldom be anything approaching to assurance that intervention, even if successful, would be for the good of the people themselves. The only test possessing any real value, of a people's having become fit for popular institutions, is that they, or a sufficient proportion of them to prevail in the contest, are willing to brave labour and danger for their liberation’ (1963, vol. 21: 122).

In addition to questions of efficacy, to the extent that peoples or groups have rights to collective self-determination, intervention by a liberal group to induce a non-liberal community to adopt liberal principles will be morally objectionable. As with individuals, liberals may think that peoples or groups have freedom to make mistakes in managing their collective affairs. If people's self-conceptions are based on their participation in such groups, even those whose liberties are denied may object to, and perhaps in some way harmed by, the imposition of liberal principles (Margalit and Raz, 1990; Tamir, 1993). Thus rather than proposing a doctrine of intervention many liberals propose various principles of toleration which specify to what extent liberals must tolerate non-liberal peoples and cultures. As is usual, Rawls's discussion is subtle and enlightening. In his account of the foreign affairs of liberal peoples, Rawls argues that liberal peoples must distinguish ‘decent’ non-liberal societies from ‘outlaw’ and other states; the former have a claim on liberal peoples to tolerance while the latter do not (1999a: 59-61). Decent peoples, argues Rawls, ‘simply do not tolerate’ outlaw states which ignore human rights: such states may be subject to ‘forceful sanctions and even to intervention’ (1999a: 81). In contrast, Rawls insists that ‘liberal peoples must try to encourage [non-liberal] decent peoples and not frustrate their vitality by coercively insisting that all societies be liberal’ (1999a: 62). Chandran Kukathas (2003) — whose liberalism derives from the classical tradition — is inclined to almost complete toleration of non-liberal peoples, with the proviso that there must be exit rights.

4.4 Liberal Interaction with Non-Liberal Groups: Domestic

The status of non-liberal groups within liberal societies has increasingly become a subject of debate, especially with respect to some citizens of faith. We should distinguish two questions: (i) to what extent should non-liberal cultural and religious communities be exempt from the requirements of the liberal state? and, (ii) to what extent can they be allowed to participate in decision-making in the liberal state?

Turning to (i), liberalism has a long history of seeking to accommodate religious groups that have deep objections to certain public policies, such as the Quakers, Mennonites or Sikhs. The most difficult issues in this regard arise in relation to children and education (see Galston, 2003). Because cultural and religious communities raise and educate children, they cannot be seen as purely voluntary opt-outs from the liberal state: they exercise coercive power over children, and so basic liberal principles about protecting the innocent from unjustified coercion come into play. We thus confront a deep conflict between parental authority and childern's rights. Because the groups live within the liberal state, full toleration (even with a right of exit) is usually seen as less attractive than in the international case. Still some such as Lucas Swaine (2006) have argued that liberals ought to grant a sort of quasi-sovereignty to such domestic non-liberal groups, allowing them great latitude to conduct their own affairs in their own away.

Question (ii) — the extent to which non-liberal beliefs and values may be employed in liberal political discussion— has become the subject of sustained debate in the years following Rawls's Political Liberalism. According to Rawls's liberalism — and what we might call ‘public reason liberalism’ more generally — because our societies are characterized by ‘reasonable pluralism’, coercion cannot be justified on the basis of comprehensive moral or religious systems of belief. But many friends of religion (e.g., Eberle, 2002; Perry, 1993) argue that this is objectionably ‘exclusionary’: conscientious believers are barred from voting on their deepest convictions. Again liberals diverge in their responses. Some such as Stephen Macedo take a pretty hard-nosed attitude: ‘if some people…feel “silenced” or “marginalized” by the fact that some of us believe that it is wrong to shape basic liberties on the basis of religious or metaphysical claims, I can only say “grow up!”’ (2000: 35). Rawls, in contrast, seeks to be more accommodating, allowing that arguments based on religious comprehensive doctrines may enter into liberal politics on issues of basic justice ‘provided that, in due course, we give properly public reasons to support the principles and policies that our comprehensive doctrine is said to support’ (1999a: 144). Thus Rawls allows the legitimacy of religious-based arguments against slavery and in favor of the United States civil rights movement, because ultimately such arguments were supported by public reasons. Others (e.g., Greenawalt, 1995) hold that even this is too restrictive: it is difficult for liberals to justify a moral prohibition on a religious citizen from voicing her view in liberal political debate.

5. Conclusion

Given that liberalism fractures on so many issues — the nature of liberty, the place of property and democracy in a just society, the comprehensiveness and the reach of the liberal ideal — one might wonder whether there is any point in talking of ‘liberalism’ at all. It is not, though, an unimportant or trivial thing that all these theories take liberty to be the grounding political value. Radical democrats assert the overriding value of equality, communitarians maintain that the demands of belongingness trump freedom, and conservatives complain that the liberal devotion to freedom undermines traditional values and virtues and so social order itself. Intramural disputes aside, liberals join in rejecting these conceptions of political right.


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Berlin, Isaiah | contractarianism | Hobbes, Thomas: moral and political philosophy | justice: distributive | justice: international | justification, political: public | Kant, Immanuel: social and political philosophy | libertarianism | liberty: positive and negative | Locke, John: political philosophy | property | republicanism