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Ibn Kammuna

First published Tue Dec 18, 2007

The centuries following the remarkable achievement of Ibn Sina (Avicenna; d. 1037) were a remarkably creative period in the sciences and philosophy. Sa'd ibn Mansur Ibn Kammuna, a Jew from Baghdad, actively participated in the lively discourse of his day. In his copious writings he takes up the entire gamut of philosophical issues discussed by his contemporaries. Editions, translations and studies of works by Ibn Kammuna and other thinkers of the time have appeared in recent years. However, the great bulk of writings produced in this period remains unstudied in manuscript. Consequently, it is very difficult at this stage to contextualize Ibn Kammuna's work, or to decide wherein lies his most noteworthy contribution.

Given this situation, we shall, after surveying Ibn Kammuna's biography, writings, and image, follow the thread of one concept whose significance for the thought of the age has been firmly established, namely, hads [properly transcribed with a dot under the “h”, and most usually translated as “intuition”], through his major writings. At the very least, this shall afford us a glimpse at the way Ibn Kammuna handles a key notion of psychology, epistemology, and the theory of prophecy, in various literary formats. Following that, we will present the first-ever survey of his religious ethics; the key texts have only recently been published. Finally, we will have a look at some of the sophistries and paradoxes that are attributed to him.

1. Life

Few facts of Ibn Kammuna's biography are secure (Pourjavady & Schmidtke, 8-22, for most biographical details and bibliography). He is presumed to have been born in Baghdad and to have spent most of his life there. However, there is good evidence that he spent some time in Aleppo; his presence in that important intellectual center explains certain facets of his activity that are otherwise difficult to account for (Langermann, 2007). He may have been descended from a family of courtiers; he certainly had connections to some high officials, some of whom were his patrons. Ibn Kammuna also corresponded with some leading intellectuals, notably Nasir al-Din al-Tusi. Shortly before his death in 1284, Ibn Kammuna fled Baghdad for the nearby town of Hilla. This move has long been thought to have been forced upon Ibn Kammuna by hostile reaction to one of his books. However, it has recently been suggested that it is more likely to be connected to the execution of one of his patrons.

Ibn Kammuna was certainly born into a Jewish family. Though his writings as a rule do not betray his Judaism—if anything, they read like the work of a devout, if philosophically inclined, Muslim—his two forays into comparative religion (see next section) exhibit a clear bias in favor of rabbinic Judaism. But did he remain Jewish until his death? The evidence from citations in later writers, who generally refer to him as a Jew, would indicate so. However, there are counter-indications; one may also take note of numerous pious references to the Prophet in Ibn Kammuna's writings, not all of which can easily be ascribed to later scribes. The great bibliographer Moritz Steinschneider opined that Ibn Kammuna in fact converted; his arguments were countered by some of the great pioneers of Judaeo-Arabic studies, notably D.H. Baneth. Pourjavady & Schmidtke, in their very recent book-length study, doubt the story of Ibn Kammuna's conversion.

2. Writings

Judging in terms of its impact on modern scholarship, even beyond the rather narrow confines of specialists in late medieval Jewish and Islamic philosophy, as well its impact upon his own personal life, Ibn Kammuna's Tanqih (Examination of the Three Faiths, English translation by Perlmann) is his most important work. The fundamental premise of the treatise, and one that informs other of his writings as well, is that there is a single theory of prophecy that is accepted by Jews, Christians, and Muslims alike, and which, moreover, meets the truth standards of philosophy. What remains, then, is to compare the claims that are particular to each of the three faiths. Though the Examination is certainly not a polemical work, its pro-Jewish bias is quite evident. Ibn Kammuna constructed the Jewish view he presents by means of a seemingly original combination of ideas drawn from Maimonides and Judah Hallevi. Christians and Muslims rejected the way their tenets were presented, and representatives of both penned rebuttals (Pourjavady & Schmidtke, 106-113). On the other hand, no Jewish reaction of any sort to the Examination has reached us. It should be added that neither in the Examination, nor in any other work, does Ibn Kammuna evince any interest in or knowledge of Buddhism; given the political realities of Mongol rule (the Mongols had not yet converted to Islam) as well as Ibn Kammuna's broad interests, one might have expected him to exhibit some curiosity.

Ibn Kammuna wrote a much shorter treatise on the differences between the two main Jewish groupings, Rabbinites and Karaites (English translation by Nemoy). Here again, despite the absence of any open polemics, it is clear that Ibn Kammuna's sympathies lie with the Rabbinic majority.

Ibn Kammuna's most significant contribution to the history of philosophy is his detailed commentary to Suhrawardi's al-Talwihat (partial edition by Ziai & Alwisha; bibliography in Pourjavady & Schmidtke, 63-76). This is the first known commentary to that work, which, though more Aristotelian than other writings of Suhrawardi, still conveys essential points of the Ishraqi philosophy. Directly through his commentary, and indirectly by means of his influence upon Qutb al-Din al-Shirazi (1236-1311), Ibn Kammuna was very instrumental in the initial phases of the exposition and diffusion of Suhrawardi's thought.

Al-Jadid fi ‘l-hikma (The New Wisdom; preliminary study by Langemann, 2005) is a comprehensive exposition of thirteenth century science and philosophy. Numerous manuscript copies exist (Pourjavady & Schmidtke, 87-92). Ibn Kammuna experimented with different formats and especially different lengths in his philosophical writing. He adhered to the traditional tri-partite classification of logic, physics, and metaphysics, in a lengthy format (al-Jadid), a highly condensed version (Talkhis; Pourjavady & Schmidtke 94, for bibliography, and edition of Arabic text, 196-206), and quite likely a middle length version (Risala fi ‘l-hikma), whose authenticity is still unresolved (Langermann 2005, 279-286).

Similarly, he has left us a medium length pietistic work (Kalimat wajiza) and a much shorter version of the same treatise (Ithbat al-mabda); but he also confides that he may expand upon the Kalimat wajiza (Pourjavady & Schmidtke, 140). Even if that plan never came to fruition (no evidence of this longer version has as yet turned up), it indicates his conviction that important topics ought to be discussed in all three formats, which presumably take into consideration the varying abilities of people to devote time to study. The two extant pietistic texts are published (with no discussion of the contents) by Pourjavady & Schmidtke, 139-195; some preliminary observations are offered below, in the section before the last.

Ibn Kammuna wrote several monographs on the science of the soul (Pourjavady & Schmidtke, 100-106). His special interest in studying the soul (nafs) calls for explanation. Like so many other features of his work, it can be understood only in the context of the Avicennan legacy. Avicenna took his perception of his own self to be the most certain piece of his knowledge that he possessed. (It may be noted in passing that in Arabic, nafs means both “soul” and “self”; though Avicenna took care to be as precise as possible in his terminology, this double-entendre has an inevitable presence in Arabic psychological literature, especially in the wake of Avicenna). This approach is totally at odds with the Aristotelianism that, in all of its flavors, was the foundation of Islamic philosophies. Throughout his life Avicenna struggled with the complex of problems ensuing from his insight, especially in the realms of psychology and epistemology, without ever arriving at a satisfactory solution. The conundrum reverberated in the work of the following generations.[1]

Ibn Kammuna took the Avicennan reformulation as his basic conception of the soul. In lengthier writings he would of course review the faculties, properties, and so forth associated with the soul; but the fundamental notion was that of the individual's self-awareness. For example, in the introduction to his essay On the Immortality of the Soul, he writes “The (word) soul is a designation of the essence of the individual, to which one refers when one employs the pronoun ‘I’ in saying ‘I have done thus and so’, ‘I have reached such and such’” [trans. Nemoy, p. 86]. In his pietistic Brief words (Kalima wajiza, to be discussed at length later on in this essay), Ibn Kammuna complains that a full discussion of the soul's properties, mode of binding to the body, and so forth, would be “lengthy”; he is content to refers the reader “to books by those who have preceded [us]”. For his purposes, “the most important [point] that has been made, and the closest to comprehension…is that the soul is that to which each one refers when saying ‘I’, as in ‘I perceived’, ‘I did this'”…) (Schmidtke and Pourjavady, p. 151). Ibn Kammuna immersed himself in the entire complex of issues connected with the soul. The most urgent issue for him was without doubt immortality: something, some part or aspect of the self/soul, must be shown to endure beyond the death of the body.

Several paradoxes are associated with Ibn Kammuna, and these continue to exercise Iranian thinkers down to the present; see the final section of this entry. He has also left us some minor writings, correspondence; some pieces of a medical writings have also been recovered (Pourjavady & Schmidtke for bibliography; medical fragments published, translated, and analyzed in Langermann 2007, 14-19).

3. Evaluation and Image in Modern Scholarship

Ibn Kammuna's work in psychology attracted the interest of the great pioneer in Islamic studies, Ignace Goldziher (1896), who devoted a short study to Ibn Kammuna's arguments for soul's immortality. However, Ibn Kammuna's main claim to fame in the twentieth century was certainly his Examination, which was widely hailed as the first dispassionate, scientific, non-polemical comparative study of its sort. Henri Corbin, who opened up the world of Suhrawardi and the Ishraqi philosophers for western scholarship, signaled Ibn Kammuna's key role in the diffusion of Suhrawardi's thought. Nonetheless, we still have no clear picture of a distinctive Ibn Kammunian interpretation of Suhrawardi, if such a thing exists. In recent years, aspects of his more Avicennian-Aristotelian philosophy have received attention, though, as noted in the preface to this article, it is still far too early to properly evaluate his particular contributions. Finally, the present article hopes to add to his intellectual portrait the deep piety evident in his ethical treatises, which draw upon Jewish, Islamic, and non-denominational philosophic sources.

4. Philosophy: Following the Thread of Intuition

4.1 Introduction

Ibn Kammuna was primarily an interpreter of earlier thinkers. In his commentaries that was all that he set out to do. In his original works, he as a rule conveyed the achievements of others in various forms and formats. His originality found expression in the selection of materials and the format of their presentation, as well as in a series of remarks that were offered in the course of these projects. Ibn Kammuna looms as a philosophical writer, a learned and keen student, who bequeathed to posterity not a “philosophy” but rather a rich assortment of philosophical studies. Scholarship on his output has focused by and large upon the identification of his “sources”, even at the level of sentence by sentence, or phrase by phrase, analysis. This approach has reaped some important insights, for example, the combination of Avicennan and Suhrawardian statements in connection with the notion of existence.

One drawback of this approach is the patchwork image it impresses upon the modern student, as if Ibn Kammuna prepared a quiltwork of philosophical sources rather than taking a stand on the issues. But is this way his writings present themselves to the reader who is innocent of academic scholarship? I think not; Ibn Kammuna is aware of the questions that are under debate, and as a rule he formulates a clear point of view. Nonetheless, his views may well have changed over the years—not at all surprising, if, as some think, he made the more traumatic act of switching religious affiliation. It is in any event clear enough that his expressions, emphases, agreements and disagreements, inclusions and exclusions, were in part functions of the literary genre which he chose for any given work. He could be critical in his commentaries, insofar as he would look closely at the text he was explicating and cite alternative views, but he would not reject outright the views of the author whose work he was commenting upon. In his original writings he was freer to take a personal stand.

With this in mind, and keeping in view, as always, the preliminary state of scholarship on the man and even more so, on the period in which he flourished, the best course of action for the present essay seems to be this. We shall take one very central concept, hads, most often translated “intuition”, and follow it through Ibn Kammuna's major works. This will allow us to get a handle on a key feature of his philosophical thinking, as well as to observe the different ways the same concept is treated within the different projects that Ibn Kammuna undertook. Note that we shall be alert to the utilization of the concept, even if the term hads does not appear in the text under scrutiny.

Strictly speaking, hads is the revelation—some would add instantaneously—of the middle term of the syllogism, leading to an infallible conclusion. In practice, though, it had much wider application and less precise definition. Rare indeed is the case, when hads is cited as the source of knowledge, that the writer will display the full syllogism and specify the middle term (fuller discussion in Langermann 2005, 286-302; see also Gutas 2001). In effect, it is of the same species as the “revelations” by which Avicenna learned of his own existence (and indeed the great bulk of his education) and, like that Avicennan moment, it shifted epistemology in the direction of a reliance upon a person's sense of security in his personal illuminations . In the work of later thinkers, including Ibn Kammuna, the envaluation of hads served to legitimize alchemy and astrology and, more generally, to blur the distinction between demonstrative knowledge and revelation.

Hads was not just one more function to be added to the basket of terminologies used to explain psychological processes. Two applications in particular must be singled out. First of all, hads offered an analogy to prophecy; no other phenomenon from the world of humans, extraordinary as it may be, seemed as close to prophetic revelation. Second, it offered a way to account for great scientific acumen. Prophecy, scientific discovery, and intuition in general all lead those who experience them to true and new knowledge (hads was thought to be infallible) in a moment of revelation.

4.2 Examination

Earlier scientific analyses of prophecy, for example, that of Maimonides, found analogous or proto-prophetic symptoms in two types of human inspiration. The first of these includes veridical dreams, divination, and other cases in which the unknown is revealed. The second comprises instances where people spontaneously perform acts of bravery, leadership, or literary creativity, and thus act in a manner that appears to be above the ordinary. These ideas were helpful in developing a political theory of prophecy; the prophet, like the philosopher-king, is a visionary, gifted with bold leadership as well as the ability to impose a code of behavior upon his people. The main difference is that the code of the prophet is expressly not of his own devise, but rather revealed by some supernal source. On the whole, Ibn Kammuna downplays this particular conception of prophecy. The prophet does have an important role to play in organizing and ordering society. However, the thrust of Ibn Kammuna's analysis emphasizes the epistemological advantages of the prophet rather than his political skill. Moreover, as political leader, he is charged with inculcating correct religious belief; Ibn Kammuna sharply distinguishes between the prophet on the one hand, and rulers of jahiliyya (uncultured, lacking a proper revealed code) cities on the other.

The prophet's distinction from others is to be explained in psychological terms by the perfection of his hads. In developing this theme, Ibn Kammuna makes the bold claim that hads is the ultimate basis of all human knowledge. All knowledge that is acquired is either a direct intuition, acquired by someone suitably equipped, or instruction in items of knowledge that has been acquired by intuition:

As for their [prophets'] perfection, it is due to the perfection of their speculative intellect, and for this reason. The middle term, by means of which one succeeds in acquiring intelligibles that were [hitherto] unknown, is at times obtained by means of hads, at others by means of instruction. However, hads is the basis of instruction. Things thus trace back without a doubt to intuitions which the masters [of intuition] arrived at. They then conveyed them to students. However, it is possible for someone to have an intuition on his own; the reasoning gels in his mind without a teacher. [Examination, ed. M. Perlmann, Berkeley-Los Angeles, 1967, p. 12; my own translation]

Humans exhibit the full range of endowments, from the dull witted who never intuit, to those who are able to satisfy all or nearly all of their quests by means of intuition. The variation is seen both in the quantity of percepts that are obtained intuitively as well as in the speed of intuitive act. (Nonetheless, it should be added that Ibn Kammuna places the limit at “the quickest and shortest instant”; unlike Ibn Sina, for example, he does not claim here that intuition takes no time at all.) It is certainly possible that, at the upper bounds of human capacity, one may find an individual blessed with “an intense purity and an intense connection to the supernal sources” such that he can intuit all or most of what humans are capable of knowing, “not by means of an uncertain tradition, but by means of middle terms and demonstrative proofs.” Hads accounts not only for the quickness and independence of the prophet's knowledge, but for its certainty as well. It meets the requirements of formal logic, since it supplies the middle term of the syllogism, and hence is demonstrative.

4.3 The New Wisdom

Let us begin with the theoretical discussions (The following is based upon Langermann 2005, 286-302). In the chapter dealing with demonstration (burhan) Ibn Kammuna lists the seven types of judgment (hukm) by means of which one asserts or verifies (tasdiq) premises that are to be employed in a syllogism. Hadsiyyāt, intuitive judgments, are the last on the list, and Ibn Kammuna defines them simply as “what the soul judges to be certain on the basis of evidence (qara’in) other than that found in the [six] sources (mabadi’) that have been mentioned above” [ed. H.A. al-Kabisi, Baghdad 1982, 196; my translation]. Ibn Sina does not include hadsiyyāt in his classification of premises; Suhrawardī does include hadsiyyāt in two of his lists, but neither is identical to the one found in al-Jadīd. Despite all of these developments, however, Ibn Kammuna supplies here exactly the same time-worn example used by Ibn Sina (and before him by Aristotle), i.e., the fact that the moon's light derives from the sun.

In a later section of The New Wisdom Ibn Kammuna reproduces almost word-for-word the final definition of hads given by Ibn Sina in his Pointers (al-Isharat), one of his later writings. He begins by noting that progress from first intelligibles to secondary ones can be either by means of fikr (cogitation or reflection) or by hads, “in that the middle term presents itself to the mind all at once, either as the result of a search and desire [shawq] for it, without any [corresponding] motion [of the soul], or without any impulse [ishtiyaq] or motion.” Ibn Kammuna continues, “Along with it, the object of the search [i.e. the conclusion of the syllogism] and that which it entails present themselves. There is no difference between reflection and intuition, other than the presence of motion in reflection and its absence in intuition” [ed. 441].

It is not difficult to find numerous examples of the application of hads in The New Wisdom; it has much harder to see how hads is to be integrated consistently into a comprehensive scientific program. Here follow some items of knowledge that are said to derive from hads. Hads indicates to astronomers, even where logical necessity does not, that the planets require more than one orb in order to complete their motions [ed. 402]. In the life sciences, we know by means of hads that irrational animals carry out their biological functions unconsciously [ed. 424]. As for metaphysics and psychology, we conclude by means of hads that intellect is more perfect than soul [ed. 517], and that bodies (or their species) are but shadows of spiritual entities [ed. 522]. Hads and repeated experience (tajriba) together indicate that the body is the only impediment to the soul's conjunction with the pure forms [ed. 492].

The last example is particularly important because it illustrates the intimate connection between hads and tajriba, a connection maintained by Ibn Kammuna (and others) throughout. Tajriba is the most usual justification for the knowledge claimed by astrologers and alchemists. Hence both hads and tajriba aim to function as sources for hidden knowledge within scientific systems that are based upon (ultimately) Aristotelian logic. Although it is repeatedly invoked as the source for scientific knowledge, hads is not a tool of scientific inquiry, but rather a way of explaining, post facto, how a thinker hit upon the solution to a difficult problem. As such its function in science is very much the same as its function in explaining religious inspiration and prophecy.

4.4 Commentary to Suhrawardi, al-Talwihat

The Ishraqi philosophy of which Shihab al-Din al-Suhrawardi (d. 1191) is considered the founder, has intuition as the basis of its epistemology, at least in theory.[2] Illumination (ishraq in Arabic), in a word, describes the event, which many speakers of English would also call intuition, which yields knowledge swiftly and certainly. Intuition plays a major role in al-Talwihat, which is considered to be one of Suhrawardi's more peripatetic writings. It is not surprising, then, that Ibn Kammuna frequently mentions intuition in his commentary to al-Talwihat. It should be borne in mind, though, that true to his role as commentator, Ibn Kammuna will as a rule try to flesh out and expand upon Suhrawardi's intentions, rather than expressly developing his own ideas.

We shall limit ourselves here to a few examples drawn from the only published edition of this commentary (Ziai & Alwishah), which covers part two of al-Talwihat and whose subject is natural science or physics. Ibn Kammuna describes in one place how greatly people differ in this respect: “People differ with regard to hads. There are the doltish, who have never had any success in thinking; and there are those with powerful hads. Many of the latter exceed others in quantity and quality; but there is no limit, at which one must perforce stop. It is possible for there to be someone who perceives by means of hads most of the intelligibles in a short time and without a teacher; and there is a [type of] soul called ‘holy’ whose capacity is as powerful as that of the prophets” (Ziai & Alwishah, 456).

Other passages afford us an opportunity to sample how hads is employed in various scientific, or, as we would judge today, occult contexts. In laying forth an account of some twelve phenomena, including various optical effects in the atmosphere, thunder, lightning, and comets, all of which are produced by “vapors” originating in the earth (much as Aristotle had argued in his Meteorology), Ibn Kammuna adds that, conjoined to those causes, hads judges that there must be “spiritual forces” that are due to celestial configurations (Ziai & Alwishah, 254). Animals other than man have a rational soul; this ties in to the question of metemsomatosis. The reasoning will be evident to someone who employs hads, but not to someone who either willfully shuts off hads, or was simply not born with that gift (pp. 346-7).

4.5 Key Issues in the Science of Wisdom (al-Matalib al-Muhimma fi ‘ilm al-hikma)[3]

This treatise is concise in length but encyclopedic in character. It is divided into seven sections. Here as always logic is the first topic to be discussed, but hads is not mentioned at all in the section on logic. It does however figure in the seventh and final section, which deals with psychology. In line with some trends of the time, Ibn Kammuna here ranks “the science of the soul” as the most sublime of the sciences, because the human soul is analogous to the deity.

The fifth “query” of the final section focuses upon the cognitive capacities of the human soul. These vary from person to person, just as bodily endowments vary. However, at the high end of the spectrum, there exists a human soul whose cognitive ability is for all practical purposes unlimited. At this level, human cognition is a “taste” of the divine. Ibn Kammuna explains:

Only someone who has experienced (literally “tasted”) the true reality of the divine fragrances can represent these things to himself. But from among the souls that do not attain this by means of their innate disposition, some do [manage to] acquire it, whereas others are not able to acquire anything at all. Whosoever abandons bodily excesses, makes the best of necessities, and keeps away from people [by living] in mountaintops and empty spaces, thinking about the fine points of divine wisdom, intensely and purely devoted to Him, and at times singing about this in well-known harmonious melodies, with poetic speech, about the greatness of God Most High—he will receive some of the divine pleasures, such that are impossible to describe, and speech is too restricted to express; that is, if he is endowed to accept this path. All of this is known through experience to the person who finds it within himself, and by recurrence along with intuition to the one who is endowed (Key Issues, p. 85).

Here as elsewhere, hads is paired to tajriba (“experience”) and is described as an innate gift. Here, however, Ibn Kammuna adds adds an important point: hads can be cultivated. He recommends Sufi methods of isolation, mediation, music and prayer.

4.6 Pietistic writings (Kalimat wajiza, Ithbat al-mabda’)

In these two intimately related treatises, published from the first time by Pourjavady & Schmidtke and to be discussed further in the next section, Ibn Kammuna pays far less attention to questions of cognition than he does in his other writings. However, here as elsewhere, he takes note of the abilities of gifted people to grasp issues that remain recalcitrant to others who are not so endowed. Here again Ibn Kammuna connects this special mode of cognition with tajriba, repeated experience. In addition, he emphasizes here that the fruits of this special type of knowledge can be fully appreciated only by someone who has experienced them. It is thus striking that he does not employ the technical term hads in the course of his exposition, or, indeed, anywhere at all in these two writings.

Consider this passage from Kalimat wajiza mushtamila ‘ala nukat latifa fi al-'ilm wa-l-'amal (Brief words encompassing some fine points of knowledge and praxis; Pourjavady & Schmidtke, 158, my translation): “If, however, a weakening of the bodily impediments were to be joined to the strength of the soul, whether this [strength] be original [asli, here meaning ‘inborn’] or acquired, the way the soul is strengthened by practice or the training that is associated with ‘those who know’ [i.e., the Sufis], then the bond is made firm in such a way that the soul will attain many hidden things, copious items of knowledge, and illuminative pleasures, whose true nature can be apprehended only by someone who has found them himself.” A few lines down tajriba is mentioned: “Many wonderful things of the souls are known by means of repeated experiences (tajarib), repetition, and some form of reasoning (qiyas).”

Tajriba does appear in the passage just cited, but it is not mentioned at all in the shorter pietistic treatise, Ithbat al-mabda (Establishing the First Principle). On the other hand, Ibn Kammuna does employ in the shorter work several cognate terms to describe the person who can grasp a certain fact immediately and without the need for lengthy demonstration: dhihn salim (“healthy mind,” Pourjavady & Schmidtke, 188), dhu fitana (“clever,” Pourjavady & Schmidtke, 189), dhu lubb (“understanding,” Pourjavady & Schmidtke, 189).

The terminological conundrum intensifies when we bring into the discussion another term, dhawq, literally “taste”. Dhawq is a Sufi term and refers to a usually fleeting, intense religious experience, which leaves the adept knowing something more than he knew beforehand. Viewed as a phenomenon of the human mind, it is essentially the same thing as intuition. It is used in exactly this sense by Ibn Sīnā—significantly, in the monograph on the rational soul considered to be his very last work.[4] Suhrawardī adopted the term for his version of knowledge based upon intuition, hikma dhawqiyya; in Ibn Kammuna's New Wisdom, hads and dhawq are synonymous(Langermann 2005, 300). Yet in the pietistic writings, where one would expect to find the usual Sufi term, dhawq is not employed.

There is little difference between the ideas expressed in these two treatises and those in the other writings. In all cases the basic thought is that some people are born with an innate ability to swiftly arrive at certain conclusions. There remains the technical distinction, in that hads, and hads specifically, is said to disclose the middle term of the syllogism. However, one should not make too much of this. For one matter, even in cases where hads is invoked, we rarely if ever can determine just what the syllogism is for which hads has revealed the middle term. Moreover, whether or not hads is specifically mentioned, intuition or spontaneous comprehension is paired to tajriba.

The chronology of Ibn Kammuna's writings will not solve the problem either. Brief Words seems to have been written well after Ibn Kammuna had already been exposed to the writings of Ibn Sina and Suhrawardi, both of whom make much of hads, as we have seen (Pourjavady & Schmidtke, 8-12). We are thus confronted here with the historiographical and methodological question of the weight to be given to technical terms as opposed to ideas, a question that the present writer opts to leave open.

5. Piety and Ethics

Ibn Kammuna's writings as a rule deal exclusively with speculative matters. Two recently published treatises, however, give equal weight to praxis, in line with the pairing of 'ilm and 'amal (knowledge and practice) that appears in the title of the longer work; this pairing was widespread among Sufis but by no means limited to them alone. Ibn Kammuna usually identifies the reader of these tracts as an 'aqil, literally someone who employs his intellect; this too is quite common. Other expressions he uses to describe his audience are “seeker of perfection” and “seeker of salvation (najat) and perfection.”

The speculative philosophy expressed in these writings is in keeping with the views that Ibn Kammuna expresses elsewhere. However, he has in mind here a very particular type of 'ilm; “true” 'ilm is not, as he tells us, what people generally think. Rather, it is self-knowledge: knowledge of one's own shortcomings, and of one's obligations to worship God. Knowledge of this sort is goal directed; it results in the weakening of one's connections or involvement in this world, and a concomitant intensification of one's bending towards the next world. The sections on 'amal, which urge an ethical program steeped in piety, reveal a side to Ibn Kammuna that has not been mentioned, let alone adequately explored, in the scholarly literature to date. The following paragraphs are an attempt to bring to the fore some salient points. We shall offer some suggestions towards contextualization, which are necessarily tentative and preliminary.

The tension-free concord between reasoned, independently verifiable knowledge and knowledge based on revelation and tradition (science and faith, to put it more simply) manifest in these writings is noteworthy. Ibn Kammuna raises none of the ostensible contradictions that so troubled Ibn Sina, al-Ghazali, and Maimonides. A series of generally facile arguments are given for the existence of God and his attributes. In general, the conception of the deity is informed more by His goodness and bounty than it is by His power and judgment.

Consistent with the concerns so prominent in his other writings, Ibn Kammuna devotes a great deal of space (half of part one of Brief Words, which deals with 'ilm, whose meaning in this text has been described two paragraphs above) to the human soul (nafs; the meaning of this term in this text has been given above, section II), its quasi-divine nature, and its survival after death. His discourse on these issues is philosophical. In the second part of this treatise, however, Ibn Kammuna shifts to a Sufi mode of exposition. In keeping with Sufi notions, he emphasizes the key, critical role of the qalb, literally “heart”, as the epicenter of human goodness. However, he does not adopt the very common Sufi opposition of nafs, “soul”, to qalb, where the former stands for passions and bad moral traits. Instead, he defines qalb as “the eye of nafs.”

Both treatises display a thorough integration of religious and philosophical ideas and ideals. As Ibn Kammuna writes at the beginning of Brief Words: “The masters of traditional religions and of intellectual tenets agree that salvation and eternal felicity depend upon belief in God, the end of days, and doing good works.” (Pourjavady & Schmidtke, 142) Elsewhere Ibn Kammuna speaks of “the people of wisdom and revelation.” The values and ideas expounded in these two works look to represent a consensus that has been reached by these two groups, who, in different circumstances, were thought to be very much at odds with one another. We cannot say as yet how widespread this concordance was as a social phenomenon. In any event, it was shattered a century later by Ibn Taymiyya and his followers, who assaulted the “foreign” sciences from different angles.

'Amal is definitely subordinate to 'ilm; in this sense, the pietistic treatises continue the strong scientific orientation evident in all of Ibn Kammuna's writings. However, praxis is by no means a concession to the low intellectual level of the masses, as it is often thought to be in “political” conceptions of religion; nor is it merely a device to restrain bodily drives. Praxis and science reinforce each other in a specific way: “From the states of the limbs, lights ascend forth to the qalb, just as from the gnoses (ma'arif) of the qalb, lights descend to the limbs. This is the secret of the elevation of souls by means of bodily devotions (Pourjavady & Schmidtke, 161).” There is thus a distinct and immediate spiritual reward for praxis, even for—perhaps especially for—the enlightened.

Brief Words is dedicated to a Muslim patron, and it easily and naturally reads as a work of Muslim piety. However, on close inspection, there is nothing distinctly Muslim about it. Ibn Kammuna is driven by the same idea of spirituality and religiosity common to Muslims, Jews, Christians, or non-denominational philosophic theists of the type described by Judah Hallevi in his Kuzari, a book that Ibn Kammuna studied closely. It is striking that the only Qur'anic verse cited, from the fifty-seventh sura (“Iron”, verse 3) has, at least for its first part (“He is the first and the last…”), an exact parallel in both the Hebrew and Christian bibles.

Just how much Jewish ethics, biblical, rabbinic, and medieval, Ibn Kammuna has included is difficult to determine. Jewish and Islamic ethics have been intertwined all along; by the thirteenth century, some rabbinic ideas had become thoroughly islamicized on the one hand, and, on the other, Jewish versions of Sufism were well-established. Jews cited snippets of the Qur'an as apothegms of universal wisdom, rather than as the scripture of a particular faith community.[5] So when Ibn Kammuna says that “The beginning (ra's, cf. Hebrew reishit) of wisdom is fear of God,” is he consciously importing the verse from Psalms 111:10? Only an exhaustive survey of possible sources together with a close examination of the context of each of Ibn Kammuna's pronouncements can enable us to conclude whether indeed Ibn Kammuna (as I suspect) was deliberately inserting elements from his Jewish heritage into a writing targeted to a Muslim audience.

6. Shubahat: Paradoxes, Problems, and Sophistries

A number of “problems” (shubuhat; the Arabic refers to all forms of obscurities, including what we call paradoxes and sophistries) are attributed to Ibn Kammuna. These have challenged Iranian philosophers in particular from the sixteenth century onwards (Pourjavady & Schmidtke, 37-51). Some but not all can be traced to known writings of Ibn Kammuna. One of these is the famous liar paradox, which Ibn Kammuna discusses in The New Wisdom; some later figures mistakenly thought that Ibn Kammuna had invented it. Another, much discussed item is “the problem of unity” (shubhat al-tawhid). Especially since Ibn Sina, the deity was widely identified with wajib al-wujud, “that whose existence is necessary”; but, as a philosophical category, is “necessary existence” necessarily unique? Muslim and Jewish thinkers would certainly want it to be so, but proving this point was no simple matter. At one place Ibn Kammuna argues from the interconnectedness of all reality, which implies that a single “necessary existence” must stand at the top of the causal chain. He may have picked this up from Maimonides who noted in his Guide of the Perplexed (part one, chapter 72) that the unity of reality is an important indication for the unity of God. Elsewhere, however, he chose a more torturous route. Were there more than one “necessary existence”, then, rather than being a unique essential characteristic, “necessary existence” would perforce be demoted to the rank of an accident shared by two or more beings. It was this proposal that was debated and criticized by later thinkers.

Another “problem” is a sophistry that ties in with some recondite issues in logic that exercised Ibn Kammuna and his contemporaries, especially conversion by contraposition (Langermann, “Ibn Kammuna at Aleppo”, 11-13). It appears that Ibn Kammuna tried to manipulate the simple observation that creation (huduth al-'alam) is not counterfactual, that is to say, it does not require one to deny immediate reality (al-waqi’, reality or actuality as it presents itself here and now), into a formal proof: creation does not necessitate the denial of immediate reality; whatever does not necessitate the denial of immediate reality is immediately real; ergo, the creation of the world is immediately real.

Ibn Kammuna communicated this “proof” to Nasir al-Din al-Tusi, who proceeded to uncover its fallacies.[6] For example, the contraposed major premise, “whatever does not necessitate the denial of immediate reality is immediately real,” when written in its positive formulation, requires a rider: “Whatever is absent from immediate reality (ghayr waqi’, grammatically a positive sentence in Arabic) necessitates the negation of immediate reality, as long as it remains absent from immediate reality.” The rider, however, makes the premise hypothetical, and that, in turn, changes the rules as far as conversion is concerned, and does not allow the conclusion Ibn Kammuna wishes to draw.


Note: We cite here mainly English translations of works by Ibn Kammuna; publication details concerning Arabic texts, if they have been used, are usually cited in the body of the entry. Pourjavady &Schmidtke has a very extensive bibliography.

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Related Entries

Arabic and Islamic Philosophy, special topics in: mysticism | Aristotle | Avicenna [Ibn Sina] | Halevi, Judah | Ibn Taymiyya | intuition | Maimonides | prophecy | religion: and morality | Suhrawardi


Much of the research for this entry was carried out during tenure of a grant from the German Israel Foundation for Scientific Development.