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Mysticism in Arabic and Islamic Philosophy

First published Sat Mar 7, 2009

Mysticism in the Islamic context has traditionally been intertwined with the notion of Ḥikmah, which is at once both wisdom and philosophy (Nasr 1996). The source of mysticism and the mystical elements in Islam are to be traced to the Qur’an and the Islamic doctrine itself. Some of the Qur’anic verses have been viewed by the mystics and philosopher-mystics of Islam as allegorical and esoteric hints for those who can see them. “God is the Outward and the Inward” (Qu’ran 57:3), “he for whom wisdom is given, he truly has received abundant good” (Qu’ran 2:269), and the famous light verses

God is the Light of the heavens and the earth, the likeness of His light is as a niche wherein is a lamp, the lamp is a glass, the glass as it were a glittering star kindled from a blessed tree, an olive that is neither of the East nor of the West, whose oil well-night would shine, even if no fire touched it; light upon lights; God guides to His light whom He will. And God strikes similitudes for man, and God has knowledge of everything. (Qu’ran 24:35)

can all be seen as containing esoteric insight. Through out the ages, these verses have inspired a number of Muslim gnostics, some of whom, such as Shihāb al-Dīn Suhrawardī (12th CE) and Mullā Ṣadrā (16th CE) have written commentaries upon them (e.g., Mullā Ṣadrā's On the Hermeneutics of the Light Verse of the Quran).

From a mystical perspective, all later developments and interactions between Islamic philosophy and other intellectual traditions should therefore be seen as rational expressions of the mystical elements within an Islamic milieu. Mystical elements exist in Islam in two different and independent ways. Practically, Sufism represents the esoteric dimension of Islam in its purest form, while theoretically salient features of Islamic mysticism were gradually incorporated into the Islamic philosophical tradition. Islamic mysticism, therefore, stands on two pillars: first practical, then philosophical. That is, esoteric wisdom can either be attained through practical wisdom, which includes inner purification and asceticism, or through a type of philosophy which includes, but is not limited to discursive reasoning.

1. Neoplatonism and Sufism

Following the early theological schools of thought in Islam, among which were the determinists (Qadarites), the eschatologists (Murj‘aites and Wa‘idites) and the faith based theologians (Ash‘arites), there came the Islamic philosophical tradition and its many different schools of thought. Even though Al-Kindī is regarded to be the first Muslim philosopher, the full impact of Hellenic thought on Islamic philosophy is best seen in the philosophical edifice of Abū Nasr Fārābī (10th CE) Al-Fārābī, who is considered to be the father of logic in the Islamic philosophical tradition, is also the first to have embraced Neoplatonism, albeit in a limited sense. It was his paradigm that paved the way for mysticism to enter Islamic philosophy.

Neoplatonism, which has remained one of the salient features of Islamic philosophy, has performed two functions: the intellectual and the practical, both of which have become an integral part of living a philosophical life. Philosophically, Neoplatonism provides answers to most major questions within the context of Islam, such as how multiplicity came from unity and how corporality emanated from an incorporeal God, as well as explaining the ascending and descending order of beings.

Mysticism in Al-Fārābī manifests itself in two ways, philosophical and practical. Philosophically, as is evident in The Letter Concerning the Intellect (Risālah fi’l-‘aql), his interpretation of the concept of the four intellects paved the road for his successor Avicenna (Ibn Sīnā) (981–1037 CE), who made full use of Neoplatonism. Al-Fārābī tries in his writings not only to reconcile the opinions of Plato and Aristotle, with Plato seen as somewhat of a mystical figure, but also, in his discussions of political philosophy, he replaced Plato's philosopher- king with an Imam whose understanding of truth is intuitive, who knows not only theoretical virtues but also the practical ones. However, even though his musical compositions are sung among some Sufi orders in Turkey and the Indo-Pakistani continent and one can see the influence of Sufism in his Bezels of Wisdom (Fuṣūṣ al-ḥikam), reports concerning him having been a practicing Sufi are quite nebulous.

The full presence of mysticism is more evident in the works of the master of the Peripatetics, Avicenna. The central thesis that underlies much of Sufi and gnostic (‘irfān) Islam is that the unity of the original abode in which man dwelled became the multiplicity of the world of existents. The salient question is, how can one return to the unity of the origin? Avicenna takes the question of how multiplicity came from unity very seriously and this question has both philosophical and mystical implications. By relying on Neoplatonic scheme of emanation, Avicenna provides Sufism with an intellectual frame work within which the question, how can the spiritual journey towards God take place, is answered. However, in the mystical domain, while Avicenna's meeting with the great Sufi master Abū Sa‘īd Abu’l-Khayr (d. 1049 CE) and the presence of an “oriental philosophy” (al-ḥikmat al-mashraqiyyah) in his writing is regarded by most contemporary scholars to be apocryphal, the presence of Sufi and mystical elements in some of his works are undeniable (Aminrazavi 2003). In the ninth chapter of his philosophical masterpiece Remarks and Treatments (al-Ishārāt wa’l-tanbihāt), in a section entitled On the Stations of Knowers (Fī maqāmāt al-‘ārifin), Aviccena offers an explanation of the Sufi doctrine and openly defends the gnostic and Sufi method of attaining truth. In some of his more allegorical writings, such as Treatise on Ascendance (Mi‘rāj nāmah), Treatise on Birds (Risālat al-ṭaīr), Salmān and Absāl, Son of the Living Awake (Ḥayy ibn Yaqẓān) and Treatise on Love (Risālah fi’l-‘ishq) not to mention his famous poem Ode of the Soul (al-Qaṣidah al-‘ayniyyah), the presence of Sufi and gnostic elements are vividly apparent.

With Avicenna, who represents the pinnacle of rationalistic philosophy in Persia, came two other intellectual trends. On the one side there was the towering figure of Abū Ḥāmid Ghazzālī, who rejected philosophy altogether and became the exponent of Sufism alone. On the other side, there arose Ismā‘īlīs philosophy, which incorporated Sufi and Hermetico-Pythagorean ideas within a philosophical context.

Ghazzālī, an orthodox jurist and a major exponent of faith based theology (Ash‘arite) having studied philosophy, thought discursive reasoning stood on a solid ground but soon turned against philosophy, offering a devastating critique of reason in his The Incoherence of Philosophers (Tahāfut al-falāsifah). Having been disillusioned with intellectual sciences, he practiced asceticism for a number of years in seclusion and finally found his answers in the Sufi tradition. The spiritual journey of Ghazzālī from an orthodox jurist to a Sufi is one of the most remarkable accounts of the transformation of a Muslim sage who turned from the outward to the inner life of Islam and found Sufism to be the only path that leads to truth. He spent the later part of his life teaching, writing and practicing Sufism.

Ghazzālī is one of the few mystics whose brand of Sufism embraces religious orthodoxy, a gnostic intellectual framework, and the more practical and ascetic dimension of the spiritual path. Contrary to the antinomian Sufis, who violated the Islamic law (Shari‘ah) and the more relaxed attitude of some of the other Sufis, Ghazzālī was an austere and ardent observer of Islamic law.

He wrote extensively on mysticism, arguing it to be the only right path to truth. A notable piece among his writings on mysticism is The Niche of Light (Mishkāt al-anwār), a significant work of an illuminationist nature and one that influenced the formation of the doctrine of illumination (ishrāq) by Suhrawardī (Aminrazavi 1996). Also, parts of his Magnum Opus, Revival of Religious Sciences (Iḥyā’ al-‘ulūm al-dīnī), such as book thirty-five of the Iḥyā’: The Book of Faith in Divine Unity and Trust in Divine Providence, are essentially devoted to an explication of the Sufi doctrine. He also has written numerous shorter commentaries on the spiritual significance of fasting, praying, invocation of divine names and attributes, and spiritual music as instruments of the catharsis of the soul.

2. The Isma‘ili Tradition

On the Ismā‘īlīs side, the use of the esoteric doctrine of Hermeticism and the Greco-Alexandrian mystical teachings were adopted by Ismā‘īlīs philosophers. Such concepts as emanation from the One, asceticism, the body as prison with the soul as its inmate, initiation into the mysteries of gnosis (ma‘rifah), levels of interpretations of spiritual hermeneutics (ta’wīl), sacred geometry with its mystical symbolism, cycles of prophecy, and the initiatic role of Shi‘ite Imams are among many of the mystical themes of Ismā‘īlī philosophical tradition. Among the most notable Ismā‘īlī figures in the 10th and 11th century CE is Jabir Ibn Ḥayyān, (c. 721–c. 815 CE) who was more of a scientist and chemist and as such offered in his The Book of Stones (Kitāb al-aḥjār) a mystical interpretation of the science of letters and the esoteric mathematical concepts that are influenced by Pythagorean geometry. It should be noted that he was a figure under whose name works by many diverse thinkers may have been collected. Abū Ya‘qub Sijistānī was also a notable figure in the movement whose mystical writings in Unveiling of the Hidden (Kashf al-maḥjūb) and The Book of Well Springs (Kitāb al-yanābi‘) provide an esoteric commentary on major philosophical and religious matters (see Nasr & Aminrazavi 1999/2001). Sijistānī, whose writings should be regarded as a spiritual commentary on the gnostic doctrine pertaining to the flight of the soul toward its paradisal state, centers around the oneness of God, the intellects both Divine and human, and different types of souls together with their relationship with the body. In the above mentioned works, Sijistānī systematically treats notions of creation, the role of prophets as spiritual guides, and the hidden symbolism of their teachings. As one goes from the outward to the inward and esoteric level of Islam, one gains the consciousness which is the key to understanding the symbolism of prophetic teachings. Among other major figures and esoteric mystical texts in this vein is Abū Ḥātim Rāzī's (811–891 CE) Science of Prophecy (A‘lām al-nubuwwah), in which he applies the concept of emanation to the cosmological notion of Be (kun) and offers a mystical commentary on how human soul is a trace of the higher soul that is perfect.

Also, one must mention Ḥamīd al-Dīn Kirmānī (d. 996–1021 CE) and his numerous writings on Sufism and gnosticism, the most notable of which is his Repose of the Intellect (Rāḥat al-‘aql). A prominent Ismā‘īlī philosopher, considered by some as the “Ismā‘īlīs’ Ibn Sīnā,” he argued that an understanding of truth is based on two precepts. First, one has to live a morally virtuous life and second, the adept must prepare himself philosophically. The chapters of Rāḥat al-‘aql are called aswar (walls) and the paragraphs, mashāri‘ (paths). The novice has to travel through fifty-six paths within seven walls in order for the soul to gain the knowledge of Reality. Reality, according to Kirmānī, is divided into four different levels: first is the world of Divine creation or the incorporeal world (‘alām al-ibdā), second, the corporeal realm (ālam al-jism), third, the domain of religion (‘alām al-dīn), and finally, the return of the world to its original unity with God (Baumstark 1932; Corbin 1961; Corbin 1964, 130–1; Hunzai 1986).

Perhaps the most important figure of the Ismā‘īlīs tradition, one who was both poet and philosopher, is Nāṣir-i Khusraw (1004–c.1072 CE). Whether in his collection of mystical and didactic poems known as Divān, or his mystically oriental works such as The Sum of the Two Wisdoms (Jāmi‘ al-ḥikmattayīn) and Knowledge and Liberation (Gushāyesh wa rahāyesh), he relentlessly offers advice on the catharsis of the soul and the pursuing of the spiritual journey. Nāṣir-i Khusraw's attempt to reconcile Sufism and reason is seen in his The Sum of the Two Wisdoms, where he argues that the “sages of real religion” (ḥukamāy-i dīn-i ḥaqq) and the philosophers are in agreement. For Nāṣir-i Khusraw, the science of the soul is the way to attain real knowledge, knowledge which transcends the difference between the perceiver and perception. In one poem he writes:

Between the knower and the known.
There lies a distinction by one who
Has awakened from sleep of heedlessness.

Nāṣir-i Khusraw offers specific instructions how a novice should follow the spiritual path, relying on specific ascetic practices. Similar to the figures of St. Augustine and St. Francis of Assisi, Nāṣir-i Khusraw pursued a hedonistic lifestyle in the early part of his life but underwent a spiritual metamorphosis and dedicated himself to the Sufi path. Echoes from both phases of his life can be seen through out his works (Hunsburger 2000).

There are also several encyclopedic works of the Ismā‘īlī tradition whose authors are unknown. Many of these deal with mystical and Sufi ideas. Among the works that have been influential in the spread of gnostic ideas are treatises like Brethren of Purity (Ikhwān al-ṣafā) and The Mother of Books (Umm al-kitāb) (Daftary 1990; Nasr & Aminrazavi 1999/2001).

3. The “Period of Cessation” and the School of Shiraz

Traditionally, historians of philosophy have argued that after Ghazzālī in the 11th century CE, philosophical activity in the Persian and Eastern part of the Islamic world was eclipsed and shifted to Islamic Spain. There are those who attribute this to Ghazzālī's scathing attack on the philosophers, but this is mostly a myth. The Islamic world at the time was so large, and the intellectual milieu so rich and diverse, that no single book could put an end to its philosophy and discursive reasoning. While it is true that Peripatetic philosophy suffered a temporary eclipse in Persia, the reason lies in the socio-political realities of the Saljūq dynasty and the Islamic world's struggle with external forces like the Crusades. Recent scholarship has revealed that the so called period of cessation was actually a thriving era of intellectual activity in the Southern part of Persia where the so called the “School of Shiraz” emerged. This School whose salient feature was to synthesis rationalism, mysticism, intellectual intuition and even popular Sufism was undoubtedly the precursor to the School of Isfahan.

Among the great masters of philosophical mysticism hailing from Spain, Ibn Masarrah (883–931 CE) stands out. He was an ascetic whose views on the mystic quest for unity of the soul with God comprised a major theme in his philosophical mysticism. Others include Ibn Ḥazm (994–1064), who emphasized mystical love, Ibn-Bājjah (1095–1138 CE) who treated the concept of intellectual and mystical intuition as the faculty that experiences Divine realities, Ibn Al-Sid of Badajoz (1052–1127 CE) who developed what some have called mathematical mysticism, and Ibn-Ṭufayl (c. 1105–1185 CE), whose mystical allegory Son of the Living Awake (Ḥayy ibn Yaqẓān) and his concept of Active Intellect, made him a major exponent of mysticism in the Islamic philosophical tradition. Finally there is the Sufi philosopher, Ibn Sab‘īn (1217–1268 CE) who made an effort to bring about a rapprochement between philosophy and Sufism in a systematic treatment of mystical themes.

Despite the significance of the above figures, none of them reached the eminence of the greatest master of gnostic and philosophical Sufism, Shaykh Muḥyī al-Dīn Ibn ‘Arabī (1165–1240 CE) often referred to Shaykh al-Akbar (The Great Master). Ibn ‘Arabī, whose encyclopedic works, The Bezels of Wisdom (Fuṣūṣ al-ḥakam) and Meccean Victories (Futuḥāt al-Makkiyah), provide us with one of the most complex mystical paradigms in the Islamic mystical genre. Often referred to as the “Doctrine of the Unity of Being” (wahdat al-wūjūd), Ibn ‘Arabī's philosophical mysticism offers a vast synthesis of gnostic and Sufi ideas as well as a type of philosophical discourse which, for the first time, formulates the Sufi doctrine. With Ibn ‘Arabī, we see a monumental effort to comment on a full array of metaphysical, cosmological, and psychological aspects of Gnosticism, thereby providing a vision of reality whose attainment requires the practice of the Sufi path. Ibn ‘Arabī's philosophico-mystical edifice is a process of spiritual hermeneutics (ta’wīl) which relies on the language of symbolism to guide a novice from the exterior (ẓāhir) to the interior (bāṭin). For Ibn ‘Arabī, the entire cosmos represents signs (ayāt) which lend themselves to symbolic exegesis, a process whose pinnacle is the Universal Man (al-insān al-kāmil). Ibn ‘Arabī, whose doctrine of the Unity of Being (waḥdat al-wūjūd) has been interpreted by many to be pantheism, was nevertheless careful to argue that even though God dwells in things, but the world “is not” in God. For Ibn ‘Arabī, humans are microcosms and the universe is the macrocosm; the Universal Man is the one who realizes all of his inherent potentialities, including the Divine breath which was blown into man by God in the beginning of creation as the Qur’an says. For Ibn ‘Arabī, it is the spiritual realization of God within the soul that leads to union with God (see Nasr 1964; Chittick 1989 and 2007).

In the 12th century CE, during the so called “period of cessation” of philosophical activities, the most notable figure was the philosopher-mystic, Shaykh Shihāb al-Dīn Suhrawardī, the founder of the School of Illumination (Ishrāq). Suhrawardī, who was a Peripatetic, wrote four major works, primarily in the Aristotelian tradition. He also wrote a number of works in a peculiar esoteric tradition, using what he called “the language of illumination” (lisān al-ishrāq). In his illuminationist writings, Suhrawardī relies on Neoplatonism but replaces such concepts as being and existence with light and illumination, thus offering what can be called a gnostic-illuminationist version of Avicennian philosophy (Aminrazavi 2003). He offers his doctrine of illumination in his major work, The Philosophy of Illumination (Ḥikmat al-ishrāq).

In his Sufi writings, Suhrawardī employs both allegory and didactic language to advise the novice how to follow the Sufi path, often with specific instructions regarding ascetic practices. Practical wisdom constitutes an inseparable component of the ishrāqī doctrine, so much so that in the introduction to his magnum opus, The Philosophy of Illumination, Suhrawardī warns the reader that the secrets of the book will remain hidden to the reader unless he fasts for forty days and avoids consuming meat. Suhrawardī, similar to Ibn ‘Arabī, uses symbolism from nature and animals to offer a spiritual hermeneutic (ta’wīl) which begins with discursive philosophy but ends in gnosis and the spiritual return of man to his original abode.

Suhrawardī is also credited with having advocated an epistemological theory known as “knowledge by presence” (‘ilm al-ḥuḍurī), in which knowledge is attained directly and experientially when the knower, known, and the epistemic relation become one and the same (Yazdi 1992). Suhrawardī's works on Sufism, most of which are written in Persian, include The Red Intellect (‘Aql-i surkh), The Chant of Gabriel's Wing (Āwaz-i par-i Jibrā’īl), Story of the Occidental Exile (Qiṣṣat al-ghurbat al-gharbiyyah), Language of the Termites (Lughat-i murān), Treatise on the State of Childhood (Risālah fi ḥālat al-ṭufuliyyah), A Day Among the Sufis (Ruzī bā jamā‘at-i ṣufiyān), The Sound of the Griffin (Safir-i simurg), Treatise of the Nocturnal Ascent (Risālah fi’l-mi‘rāj), and Treatise of Illumination (Partaw-nāmah) (Aminrazavi 1994).

Suhrawardī's illuminationist philosophy has influenced many philosophers who wrote major commentaries on gnostic and Sufi texts, among whom are Qutb al-Dīn Shirāzī (1236–1311 CE), Muḥammad Shahrazurī (d. 1153 CE), and Ibn Turkah Iṣfahānī (c. 1362–1433 CE) Following Suhrawardī there is an even closer nexus between philosophy and mysticism. A number of rationalistic philosophers who adhered to Sufi ideas and often practiced Sufism, became exponents of philosophical mysticism. The post Suhrawardīan philosopher-mystics, who continued to refine the rapprochement between philosophy and mysticism, have come to be known as the “School of Shirāz.”

Recent scholarship has revealed that what has traditionally been regarded as the period of cessation of philosophical activities in Persia was, after all, a very thriving period in philosophical activities in the Southern part of Persia. Between 11th–16th century, Shiraz became the center of Sufi and gnostic thought in Persia. Beginning with Quṭb al-Dīn Shirāzī, who wrote a major commentary on Suhrawardī's Philosophy of Illumnination in attempt to clarify Suhrawardī's illuminative thought, the School of Shiraz produced a number of philosopher-Sufis. Quṭb al-Din Shirāzī's successor, Mīr Ṣadr al-Dīn Dashtakī (1424 CE) dealt with the problem of existence and the question of its principality. Jalāl al-Dīn Dawānī (1427 CE), another philosopher of this tradition, wrote on the exoteric subjects like law as well as esoteric matters. His work on the relationship between Sufism, ethics, and illuminationist thought entitled Sparks of Illumination in the Virtues of Ethics (Lawāmi‘ al-ishrāq fī makārim al-akhlāq), also knows as Jalalian Ethics (Akhlāq-ī Jalālī ) is of particular importance. This work is still used today by Sufi masters as a practical guide on how spiritual ethics can cleanse the soul. Dawānī also wrote a number of commentaries on Suhrawardī's philosophy of illumination, such as Forms of Brightness Concerning the Temples of Light (Shawākil al-ḥur fī sharḥ hayākil al-nūr). The next philosopher-mystic belonging to the School of Shirāz is Ghiyāth al-Dīn Manṣur Dashtakī (b.1461), the oldest son of Ṣadr al-Dīn Dashtakī and the greatest gnostic philosopher of this period. Called a “one man university,” he was well versed in law and jurisprudence as well as theoretical Sufism. Notable among his many works is his Stations of Wisdom (Maqāmāt al-‘ārifīn), a profoundly gnostic work which came to symbolize the spirit of the School of Shirāz. Dashtakī here presents a rich esoteric commentary on the verses of the Qur’an, the ḥadith and the sayings of such Sufi masters as Ḥallāj (858–922 CE), Rūmī (1207–1273 CE), and Ḥāfiz (1320–1388 CE) among others, providing the reader with an understanding of how the love of God can lead to the transcendental unity of being. The influence of Ibn ‘Arabī is quite evident in this piece. Once again rapprochement between peripatetic philosophy, ishrāqī doctrine, theology, and gnosticism (‘irfān) is made in order to help the seeker of truth find his path through the maze of spiritual pitfalls.

Among other philosophers of this period not necessarily affiliated with the School of Shirāz, but interested in Sufism, are Naṣīr al-Dīn Ṭūsī (1201-1274) who wrote a work on Sufi ethics entitled Description of Nobles (Awṣāf al-ashrāf), as well as Afd'al al-Dīn Kāshānī (d. 1213), a Sufi poet and philosopher. The latter was a strict Aristotelian who wrote extensive commentary on logic and other aspects of Aristotelian thought. While the majority of his fifty-two works are philosophical in nature, Kāshānī sees the task of philosophy to be the facilitation of “following the path of God,” as the title of one of his works suggests. His commentary on Ibn ‘Arabī, his references to other gnostics and Sufis, and his mystical poetry, have identified him more as a Sufi than a rationalistic philosopher. Writing quatrains in the style of Omar Khayyam (1048–1131), it is in his poetry that Sufism is most apparent. In a quatrain he says,

O pure Sufi seeking God,
He has no place, from where do you seek him
If you do know Him, why do you seek Him?
If you don’t know Him, whom are you seeking? (Chittick 2001)

Moving from Persia to India, in the 11th century CE., when the Persian dynasty of Ghaznavids began to rule in India, philosophical mysticism and the practice of Sufism became popular among the Indian Muslim philosophers. Among the central figures of this movement are Shaykh Yousef Gardiī Multānī, Shaykh Ismā‘īl Lahorī, Imām Ḥasan San‘ānī, and Shaykh Abu’l-Ḥasan ‘Alī Hujwaīrī, the philosopher-Sufi and the author of Unveiling of the Veiled (Kashf al-maḥjūb). At that time, the Ismā‘īlī missionaries, who had spread the gnostic interpretation of Islam in India had already created a receptive intellectual milieu for the Sufi and gnostic ideas. By the 14th century CE., due to the migration of Persian philosophers and their students to northern India, the more mystically oriented philosophy of the above figures gained popularity in India as well.

Within the next two centuries, despite the rise and fall of several dynasties, the patronage of philosophers in India in general did not change. Sufi patronage reached a new high during the Mongol period, whose rulers were particularly keen in the Sufi tradition in all its manifestations; especially philosophy, poetry and the visual arts. Such notable Persian philosophers as Taftazānī (c. 1322–1390 CE) and Jurjānī (1097–1127 CE) went to India at this time. They were followed by such figures as Mīr Fatḥ Allāh Shirāzī, who reformed the educational curriculums to emphasize the teachings of the mystical philosophies of his Persian teachers.

Philosophical mysticism continued in the Islamic philosophical tradition of northern India in figures such as Khāwjah Muḥammad Baqī bi’llāh (b.1563), a celebrated mystic and the founder of Naqshbandī Sufi order, as well as in his student Shaykh Aḥmad Sirhindī (1564–1624), the proponent of the doctrine of “The Unity of Consciousness” (waḥdat al-shuhūd) and the author of Epistoles (Maktubāt). Other Muslim philosophers from the Indo-Pakistani continent who incorporated mysticism were Mullā ‘Abd al-Ḥakīm Siyalkotī, Mullā Maḥmūd Junpurī Faruqī, and Mīrzā Muḥammad Zāhid Harawī (1603–1652), who became the proponent of Suhrawardī's illuminationist philosophy; and, perhaps the most well known philosopher-mystic, Shāh Waliullāh, who lived in the 18th century CE. Waliullāh made an attempt to reconcile Ibn-‘Arabī's doctrine of “The Unity of Being” (waḥdat al-wūjūd) and Sirhindī's doctrine of “The Unity of Consciousness” (waḥdat al-shuhūd). In addition to his numerous writings on the foundation of Sufi metaphysics, Shāh Waliullāh should be given credit for bringing legitimacy to mystical doctrine despite the attacks of orthodox jurists who saw Sufism as heretical.

4. The School of Isfahan and Mulla Sadra

Back in Persia, came the advent of the Safavid dynasty in the 16th century CE, the founders of which were practicing Sufis affiliated with the grand Sufi master, Ṣafī al-Dīn Ardabīlī (1252–1334 CE). There the use of Sufi doctrine, philosophy, and asceticism within a single philosophical paradigm reached its pinnacle. The most important issue of what came to be called the “School of Isfahan” was the “reality of being” (ḥaqiqat al-wūjūd ) as opposed to the “concept of being” (mafhūm al-wūjūd).

The founder of the School of Isfahan, Mīr Dāmād (d. 1631 or 1632 CE), was a follower of Suhrawardī's philosophy of illumination, even choosing the pen name ishrāq (illumination). He not only wrote extensively on the metaphysical foundation of mysticism in his major work Sparks of Fire (al-Qabasāt), and in his Ecstasies (Al-Jadhawāt), Heavenly Mystical States (Khalsat al-malakūt), and his Disassociations (al-Khl‘iyyāt), he also wrote mystical poetry. Even though Mīr Dāmād wrote extensively on peripatetic philosophy, and especially the concept of time, he is to be credited with a gnostic interpretation of Avicennan philosophy. His philosophico-mystical structure, based on the principality of essence, provides the intellectual frame work for the ascendance of the soul and its eventual unity with its source.

It was however, his student Ṣadr al-Dīn Shirāzī, known as Mullā Ṣadrā, who is perhaps the greatest metaphysician of the Islamic philosophical tradition. His grand synthesis of discursive philosophy, intellectual intuition, and asceticism came to be known as the “Transcendental Theo-Sophy” (al-ḥikmat al-muta‘āliyah). This philosophical perspective, according to Mullā Ṣadrā, was unveiled to him by God after many years of inner purification. With Mullā Ṣadrā, an attempt to offer a spiritual commentary (ta’wīl) from a Shi‘ite gnostic perspective on the Qur’an and the concept of “spiritual guardianship” (wilāyah) reaches its pinnacle.

His magnum opus, The Four Journeys of the Intellect (al-Asfār al-arba‘āt al-‘aqliyyah) is a philosophical and gnostic exposition of the highest caliber, in which the descending and ascending journey of the soul from and to God is treated in detail. This work, which is an encyclopedia of gnosis, philosophy, and mysticism, incorporates much of what Ibn ‘Arabī and other philosopher-mystics had brought forth to date. For Mullā Ṣadrā, creation represents four journeys: the Fall, in which unity becomes multiplicity is the first, followed by one's earthly journey wherein the pain of separation causes an existential yearning towards one's original abode. According to Mullā Ṣadrā, man's spiritual ascendance through the path of Sufism and gnosticism constitutes the third part of this journey until unity once again is accomplished. Finally there is the sojourn in the Divine realm, from Truth (ḥaqq) to Truth, a station only few of the spiritual elites may ever experience.

Mullā Ṣadrā can be regarded as the reviver of the authentic mystical wisdom to be attained through mysticism and the intellectual intuition not divorced from rationality. Mullā Ṣadrā makes extensive use of logical analyses and demonstrative proofs, which rest on what he calls “illuminative principle” (qā‘idah ishraqiyyah); that is, what has entered the heart (al-varidāt al-qalbiyyah), or “Divinely realized knowledge” (taḥqīq ‘arshī).

Some works that are indicative of his commitment to philosophical mysticism are, Metaphysical Penetrations (al-Mashāri‘), Wisdom of the Throne (Ḥikmat al-‘arshiyah), The Unity of the Knower and the Known (Ittiḥād al-‘āqil wa’l-ma‘qūl), and Secrets of the Qur’anic Verses (Asrār al-āyāt), a gnostic commentary on the famous light verses.

Mullā Ṣadrā left an indelible mark upon Islamic philosophy, and especially on the nexus between philosophy and mysticism, making the integration of mysticism an assumed part of philosophizing. His students carried out his philosophical legacy well into the modern era. ‘Abd al-Razzāq Lāhijī (d. 1661–1662 CE) wrote a commentary upon The Secrets of the Garden (Sharḥ-i gulshan-i rāz), which is a detailed exposition of the spiritual path and one's journey through the maze of the states and stations of the Sufi path, Mīr Findiriskī (d. 1640–41 CE) wrote a mystical commentary upon Yoga Vaishishe, and Mullā Muḥsin Fayḍ Kāshānī (d. 1680 CE) wrote a mystical treatise entitled The Hidden Words (Kalimāt-i maknunah) as well as Divine Gnosis (al-Ma‘ārif al-ilāhiyyah). Qāḍī Sa‘id Qummī (d. 1696 CE), another student of Mullā Ṣadrā and a stanch Neoplatonist authored a number of mystical treatises such as the Secrets of Worships (Asrār al-‘ibādāt) as well as a major gnostic work titled Commentary Upon The Enneads (Ta‘liqāt bar Uthūlūjiyā), scil. The pseudo-Aristotelian Theology of Aristotle, derived from the Enneads of Plotinus. (See infra The Theology of Aristotle by Peter Adamson.)

The above works, all of which are continuations of Ṣadrian philosophy, further elaborate the fine points of transcendentalist theo-sophy, which was firmly based on the principality of existence over essence, gradation, and the oneness that appears as multiplicity. The question is how to transcend the world of objects which appears as many, to see the Oneness which lies at the heart of multiplicity. The post Suhrawardīan and Sadrian answer is that a combination of practical wisdom and intellectual intuition which transcends discursive reasoning, provides one with the vision to see the Oneness lying at the heart of multiplicity.

5. Conclusion

Even though post Sadrian philosophy in the Islamic tradition never reached the level of accomplishment of the great masters of the Safavid period, Sadra's school of metaphysics found followers in the periods that were to follow, both in and outside of Persia. While Mullā Ṣadrā's influence was marginal in the Arab world, which has generally seemed to distance itself from traditional metaphysical issues, in India, Ṣadrian philosophy was well received and it is taught in traditional schools today.

With the advent of the Qājār dynasty in Iran in the early 18th century CE., Ṣadrian philosophy once again became the focal point of philosophical activity. The greatest proponents of gnosis and philosophical mysticism in this period came to be known as the “School of Tehran.” This school included Mullā ‘Alī Nurī (d. 1830–1 CE) whose Glosses upon the Secrets of Verses is an esoteric commentary on certain verses of the Qur’an, Mullā Ismā‘īl Khāju‘ī (d. 1759 CE), who wrote on the concept of time within a gnostic context, and the most celebrated figure in this period, Ḥājj Mullā Hādī Sabziwārī (1797–1873 CE) whose Commentary on Treatises (Sharḥ-i manẓumah) is a compendium of philosophical gnosticism. Sabziwārī, who also wrote mystical poetry under the pen-name Asrār (Secrets), brought about a rapprochement among many different strands of mystical philosophy and considered asceticism to be a central part of living a philosophical life. With Sabziwārī's death in 1797 CE., Tehran became the center of philosophical activity, much of which centered around the philosophy of Mullā Ṣadrā and Sabziwārī. The salient features of the School of Tehran were that knowledge is hierarchical in essence and that discursive philosophy, while useful, is ultimately limited. In this tradition, it is through intellectual intuition, illumination, and inner purification that the reality of existence can be experienced (Sabzavārī 1969; Ashtiyānī 1973) . Among other masters of this period are Mullā ‘Abdallāh Zunuzī (d. 1841–42 CE), the author of Divine Flashes of Light (al-Lama‘āt al-ilāhiyyah), and his son, Mullā ‘Alī Zunuzī (d. 1889–1900 CE), who authored Marvels of Wisdom (Badāyi‘ al-ḥikam). Both of their works are gnostic and mystical commentaries upon a wide range of philosophical problems. Because the School of Tehran was dominated by grand scholars who were also jurists, it continued in the Ṣadrian and Sabziwārian tradition, but distanced itself from popular Sufism, with whom they identified relaxed attitude and even antinomian tendencies towards Islamic law (Shari‘ah). Emphasis on piety, asceticism, and cleansing of the soul within the prescribed limits of the Shari‘ah, perhaps partially a reaction to modernity, is the salient feature of the School of Tehran.

The number of Muslim philosophers who became proponents of mystical philosophy in the Islamic world are too numerous to mention here, but clearly mysticism is a living tradition that continues to occupy center stage in the philosophy in the Muslim world. It is virtually impossible to fully account for all the traditions of mysticism in the Islamic philosophical tradition, however such traditions do exist in almost every Muslim country today (see Kiliç 1996).

The impact of mysticism on Islamic philosophy has been so profound that it has changed the very essence and definition of philosophizing. The enterprise of philosophizing in the Islamic tradition is seen by most not merely as an intellectual exercise but as the intellectual dimension of the soul's spiritual journey towards the unveiling of truth. Authentic philosophy, according to Muslim philosopher-mystics is therefore committed to providing a rationalistic commentary upon those issues which traditionally belonged to the mystical domain only.


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Al-Farabi | Al-Ghazali | Arabic and Islamic Philosophy, special topics in: Ikhwan al-Safa | Avicenna [Ibn Sina] | Ibn Arabi | Mulla Sadra | mysticism | Suhrawardi