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The Incommensurability of Scientific Theories

First published Wed Feb 25, 2009

The term ‘incommensurable’ means ‘no common measure’, having its origins in Ancient Greek mathematics, where it meant no common measure between magnitudes. For example, there is no common measure between the length of the leg and the length of the hypotenuse of an isosceles, right triangle. Such incommensurable relations are represented by irrational numbers. The metaphorical application of this mathematical notion specifically to the relation between successive scientific theories became controversial in 1962 after it was popularised by two influential philosophers of science: Thomas Kuhn and Paul Feyerabend. They appeared to be challenging the rationality of natural science and were called in Nature, “the worst enemies of science” (Theocharis and Psimopoulos 1987, 596; cf. Preston et al. 2000). Since 1962, the incommensurability of scientific theories has been a widely discussed, controversial idea that was instrumental in the historical turn in the philosophy of science and the establishment of the sociology of science as a professional discipline.

1. Introduction

In the influential The Structure of Scientific Revolutions (1962), Kuhn made the dramatic claim that history of science reveals proponents of competing paradigms failing to make complete contact with each other's views, so that they are always talking at least slightly at cross-purposes. Kuhn characterized the collective reasons for these limits to communication as the incommensurability of pre- and post-revolutionary scientific traditions, claiming that the Newtonian paradigm is incommensurable with its Cartesian and Aristotelian predecessors in the history of physics, just as Lavoisier's paradigm is incommensurable with that of Priestley's in chemistry (Kuhn 1970 [1962], 147–150; Hoyningen-Huene 2008). These competing paradigms lack a common measure because they use different concepts and methods to address different problems, limiting communication across the revolutionary divide. Kuhn initially used incommensurability predominately to challenge cumulative characterizations of scientific advance, according to which scientific progress is an improving approximation to the truth, and to challenge the idea that there are unchanging, neutral methodological standards for comparing theories throughout the development of the natural sciences. Like in evolution, the process does not change toward some fixed goal according to some fixed rules, methods or standards, but rather it changes away from the pressures exerted by anomalies on the reigning theory (Kuhn 1970 [1962], 170–173). The process of scientific change is eliminative and permissive rather than instructive. In the process of confronting anomalies, certain alternatives are excluded, but nature does not guide us to some uniquely correct theory.

Kuhn developed and refined his initial idea over the following decades, repeatedly emphasizing that incommensurability neither means nor implies incomparability; nor does it make science irrational (e.g. Kuhn 2000 [1976], 197). He focused increasingly on conceptual incompatibility as manifest in the structural differences used to classify the kinds whose relations are stated in laws and theories, such as chemical elements and biological species (Kuhn 2005). He used incommensurability to attack the idea, prominent among logical positivists and logical empiricists, that comparing theories requires translating their consequences into a neutral observation language (cf. Hoyningen-Huene 1993, 213-214). In the late 1990s, he explicated incommensurability in terms of ineffability, emphasizing that it became possible for scientists to make and understand certain new statements only after a particular theory had been introduced (in the older vocabulary the new sentences are nonsensical), just as it only becomes possible for historians to understand certain older statements by setting aside current conceptions that otherwise cause distortions (Kuhn 2005 [1989], 58–59; 2005 [1993], 244). Such ‘taxonomic incommensurability’ results in translation failure between local subsets of inter-defined terms due to the cross-classification of objects into mutually exclusive taxonomies. This can be distinguished from ‘methodological incommensurability’, according to which there is no common measure between successive scientific theories, in the sense that theory comparison is sometimes a matter of weighing historically developing values, not following fixed, definitive rules (Sankey and Hoyningen-Huene 2001, vii-xv). This makes room for rational disagreement in theory comparison, as scientists may apply different values (such as scope, simplicity, fruitfulness, accuracy) in evaluating and comparing particular theories, so that theory choice is not unequivocally determined throughout the scientific community.

Paul Feyerabend first used the term incommensurable in 1962 in “Explanation, Reduction and Empiricism” to describe the lack of logical relations between the concepts of fundamental theories in his critique of logical empiricists models of explanation and reduction. He argued that in the course of scientific advance, when fundamental theories change, meanings change, which can result in a new conception of the nature of reality. By calling two fundamental theories incommensurable, Feyerabend meant that they were conceptually incompatible: The main concepts of one could neither be defined on the basis of the primitive descriptive terms of the other, nor related to them via a correct empirical statement (Feyerabend 1962, 74, 90). For example, Feyerabend claimed that the concepts of temperature and entropy in kinetic theory are incommensurable with those of phenomenological thermodynamics (1962, 78); whereas the Newtonian concepts of mass, length and time are incommensurable with those of relativistic mechanics (1962, 80). Feyerabend repeatedly used the idea of incommensurability to challenge a wide range of forms of conceptual conservativism, arguing that they unjustifiably favor successful, entrenched concepts over potential improvements, overlooking the possibility of developing incommensurable alternatives (Oberheim 2005, 2006).

Although the application of the notion of incommensurability to scientific theories can be traced back at least to LeRoy and Adjukiewicz in Poincaré's conventionalist tradition (Oberheim 2005), we have chosen to focus on the more modern notions of incommensurability. The entry is organized around and limited to the 1962 popularisations of the concept of incommensurability by Kuhn and Feyerabend and those ideas that directly influenced their developments of the notion. First, Kuhn's notion of incommensurability as it was initially developed is characterized, as is its cause and its purported consequences. That is followed by an examination of Kuhn's route to the idea, and then his subsequent development after 1962. The sections on Feyerabend's notion of incommensurability mirror the same basic structure. They are followed by a brief comparison of Kuhn and Feyerabend's views on incommensurability, especially its relation to theory comparison.

2. Revolutionary paradigms: Thomas Kuhn on incommensurability

Kuhn's notion of incommensurability in The Structure of Scientific Revolutions misleadingly appeared to imply that science was somehow irrational, and consequently it faced many challenges and caused many confusions. This led to many clarifications, and eventually to a substantial redevelopment of a more precise and restricted version of it over the following decades. Kuhn initially used the term holistically to capture methodological, observational and conceptual disparities between successive scientific paradigms that he had encountered in his historical investigations into the development of the natural sciences (Kuhn 1970 [1962], 148–150). Later, he refined the idea arguing that incommensurability is due to differences in the taxonomic structures of successive scientific theories and neighbouring contemporaneous sub-disciplines. Kuhn's developing notion of incommensurability has received much attention, and it continues to provoke plenty of controversy.

2.1 The Structure of Scientific Revolutions

In The Structure of Scientific Revolutions (1970 [1962]), Thomas Kuhn used the term ‘incommensurable’ to characterize the holistic nature of the changes that take place in a scientific revolution. His investigations into the history of science revealed a phenomena often now called ‘Kuhn loss’: Problems whose solution was vitally important to the older tradition may temporarily disappear, become obsolete or even unscientific. On the other hand, problems that had not even existed, or whose solution had been considered trivial, may gain extraordinary significance in the new tradition. Kuhn concluded that proponents of incommensurable theories have different conceptions of their discipline and different views about what counts as good science; and that these differences arise because of changes in the list of problems that a theory must resolve and a corresponding change in the standards for the admissibility of proposed solutions. So for example, Newton's theory was initially widely rejected because it did not explain the attractive forces between matter, something required of any mechanics from the perspective of the proponents of Aristotle and Descartes' theories (Kuhn 1970 [1962], 148). According to Kuhn, with the acceptance of Newton's theory, this question was banished from science as illegitimate, only to re-emerge with the solution offered by general relativity. He concluded that scientific revolutions alter the very definition of science itself.

Changes in problems and standards come with corresponding conceptual changes, so that after a revolution, many (though not all) of the older concepts are still used, but in a slightly modified way. Such conceptual changes have both intensional and extensional aspects, which is to say that the same terms take on different meanings and are used to refer to different things when used by proponents of competing incommensurable theories. The changes in the intensional aspects of concepts result because the terms used to express a theory are inter-defined and their meanings depend on the theories to which they belong. For example, the meanings of the terms ‘temperature’, ‘mass’, ‘chemical element’ and ‘chemical compound’ depend on which theories are used to interpret them. Conceptual changes also result in the exclusion of some old elements of the extension of a concept, while new elements come to be subsumed by it, so that the same term comes to refer to different things. For example, the term ‘Planet’ referred to the sun but not the earth in the Ptolemaic theory, whereas it refers to the earth and not the sun in the Copernican theory. Incommensurable theories use some of the same terms, but with different meanings, to refer to different sets of things. Two scientists who perceive the same situation differently, but nevertheless use the same vocabulary to describe it, speak from incommensurable viewpoints (Kuhn 1970, 201).

One of the most controversial claims to emerge from Kuhn's assertions about the incommensurability of scientific theories is that the proponents of different paradigms work in different worlds (Kuhn 1970 [1962], 150; cf. Hoyningen-Huene 1990; 1993). Drawing on experiments in the psychology of perception, Kuhn argued that the rigorous training required for admittance to a paradigm conditions scientist's reactions, expectations and beliefs (Kuhn 1970 [1962], 128; 2000 [1989], 66–71), so that learning how to apply the concepts of a theory to solve exemplary problems determines scientists' experiences. So for example, where a proponent of the Newtonian theory sees a pendulum, an Aristotelian saw constrained free fall; where Priestley saw dephlogisticated air, Lavoisier saw oxygen; where Berthollet saw a compound that could vary in proportion, Proust saw only a physical mixture. Kuhn (and Feyerabend) used the analogy of a Gestalt switch to illustrate this point. In this way, one main source of the notion of incommensurability of scientific theories has been the development of Gestalt psychology.

According to Kuhn, these three interrelated aspects of incommensurability (changes in problems and standards that define a discipline, changes in the concepts used to state and solve those problems, and world change) jointly constrain the interpretation of scientific advance as cumulative. Scientific progress, Kuhn argued, is not simply the continual discovery of new facts duly explained. Instead, revolutions change what counts as the facts in the first place. When reigning theories are replaced by incommensurable challengers, the purported facts are re-described according to new and incompatible theoretical principles. The main goal of Kuhn's Structure was to challenge the idea of scientific progress as cumulative, according to which what is corrected or discarded in the course of scientific advance is that which was never really scientific in the first place, and Kuhn used incommensurability as the basis of his challenge. Instead of understanding scientific progress as a process of change toward some fixed truth, Kuhn compared his suggestion to that of Darwin's: scientific progress is like evolution in that its development should be understood without reference to a fixed, permanent goal ([1970] 1962, 173).

2.2 Kuhn's route to incommensurability

2.2.1 Kuhn's discovery of incommensurability

According to Kuhn, he discovered incommensurability as a graduate student in the mid to late 1940s while struggling with what appeared to be nonsensical passages in Aristotelian physics (Kuhn 2005 [1989], 59–60). He could not believe that someone as extraordinary as Aristotle could have written them. Eventually patterns in the disconcerting passages began to emerge, and then all at once, the text made sense to him: a Gestalt switch that resulted when he changed the meanings of some of the central terms. He saw this process of meaning changing as a method of historical recovery. He realized that in his earlier encounters, he had been projecting contemporary meanings back into his historical sources (Whiggish history), and that he would need to peel them away in order to remove the distortion and understand the Aristotelian system in its own right (hermeneutic history). For instance, when he encountered the word “motion” in Aristotle (the standard translation of the Greek kinesis), he was thinking in terms of the change of position of objects in space (as we do today). But to get more closely at Aristotle's original usage, he had to expand the meaning of motion to cover a much broader range of phenomena that include various other sorts of change, such as growth and diminution, alternation, and generation and corruption, making an objects motion in space (displacement or ‘locomotion’) just a special case of motion. Kuhn realized that these sorts of conceptual differences indicated breaks between different modes of thought, and he suspected that such breaks must be significant both for the nature of knowledge, and for the sense in which the development of knowledge can be said to make progress. Having made this discovery, Kuhn changed his career plans, leaving theoretical physics to pursue this strange phenomenon. Some fifteen years later the term ‘incommensurable’ first appears in his classic The Structure of Scientific Revolutions (1962).

2.2.2 Conceptual replacement and theory-ladenness of observation: Ludwik Fleck

Of all the sources influencing Kuhn on incommensurability, at least one deserves special attention. In the foreword of The Structure of Scientific Revolutions, Kuhn acknowledged a deep debt to Ludwik Fleck, a bacteriologist who developed the first explicit sociology of natural science, and anticipated many contemporary views about the social construction of knowledge. Around 1950, Kuhn was enticed by the potential relevance to his experience of incommensurability of Fleck's paradoxical title: Entstehung und Entwicklung einer wissenschaftlichen Tatsache: Einführung in die Lehre von Denkstil und Denkkollektiv (1935)(Genesis and Development of a Scientific Fact, 1979). There and in other earlier works, Fleck had already used ‘inkommensurabel’ to describe different styles of thinking within the natural sciences as well as to discuss the ramifications of radical conceptual change in the history of science. For example, Fleck used the term ‘inkommensurabel’ to describe the differences between ‘medical thinking’ and ‘scientific thinking’. The former addresses irregular, temporally dynamic phenomena such as an illness, while the later addresses uniform phenomena (Fleck 1986 [1927], 44–45). Fleck also used the term ‘inkommensurabel’ to describe conceptual replacements in theoretical transitions within what he considered the most vital of the natural sciences, the medical sciences. For example, he claimed that an old concept of disease became incommensurable with a newer concept that was not a completely adequate substitute for it (Fleck 1979 [1935], 62). While Fleck's program of comparative epistemology anticipates Kuhn's ideas in many significant respects, it is also strikingly different (Harwood 1986; Oberheim 2005). The most pervasive differences concerning incommensurability are that Fleck treats meaning and meaning change as a function of how concepts are received and developed by the collective, while for Kuhn it is individuals who develop and apply the concepts that advance science. Moreover, for Fleck meaning change is a continuous feature of scientific development, whereas Kuhn distinguishes normal scientific development that does not change meanings from revolutionary developments that do.

Even so, Fleck emphasized all three of the interrelated aspects of the shifts that Kuhn called revolutions and tried to capture by calling theories ‘incommensurable’ (changes in problems and standards (1979 [1935], 75–76; 1979 [1936], 89), conceptual change (e.g. 1979 [1935]; 1979 [1936], 72, 83) and world change (e.g. 1986 [1936], 112). Fleck argued that science does not approach the truth because successive thought-styles raise new problems and discard older forms of knowledge (Fleck 1986 [1936], 111–112; 1979 [1935], 19, 51, 137–139; cf. Harwood 1986, 177). Fleck emphasized that scientific terms acquire their meanings through their application within a particular theoretical context and that those meanings change when theories change in the course of advance, even offering the example of ‘chemical elements’ and ‘compounds’ repeated by Kuhn (Fleck 1979 [1935], 25, 39, 40, 53–54). Fleck emphasized the theory-ladenness of observation with explicit reference to Gestalt switches; stressing that a ‘thought-style’ determines not only the meanings of the concepts it uses, but also the perception of phenomena to be explained, developing examples from the history of anatomical representation (1979 [1935], 66; 1986 [1947]). Fleck (like Kuhn, Feyerabend and Wittgenstein) acknowledged Wolfgang Köhler's work in psychology of perception in this regard. Fleck concluded that scientific advance is not cumulative, that conceptual differences between members of different scientific communities cause communication difficulties between them (1979 [1936], 109), and later for historians trying to understand older ideas (1979 [1936], 83–85, 89). Fleck even emphasized that meaning change in the course of scientific advance causes translation failure between theories, anticipating a central aspect of Kuhn's later notion of taxonomic incommensurability (e.g. 1986 [1936], 83). While Fleck is often celebrated as an influential figure in the development of sociology of science, recent research has been highly critical of Fleck's shoddy scientific research and dubious experimental practices that include experimentation on humans involving obvious ethical violations (Hedfors 2007a; 2007b).

2.2.3 Gestalt psychology and organized perception

Another major source of Kuhn's idea of the incommensurability of scientific theories is Gestalt psychology, especially as developed by Wolfgang Köhler. He emphasized the active role of organization in perception and argued that in psychology one begins with Gestalten (organized, segregated wholes such as the objects of human perception or identifiable human behaviours) and then proceeds to discover their natural parts (and not vice versa, like in particle physics). Köhler suggested that while Gestalten are common in psychology, their existence in physics would violate the fundamentals of exact science, emphasizing that the ideas and language of physics were established from a different perspective than that of Gestalt psychology (1938 [1920], 17). Köhler's strategy for attempting to overcome this problem with the relation of psychological wholes to the reductionist concepts of physics was to attempt to find the former in physics. In the opening sentences of the condensed English version of Köhler's investigation of the relationship between the mental concepts of psychology and the material concepts of physics, Köhler wrote: “In order to orient itself in the company of natural sciences, psychology must discover connections wherever it can between its own phenomena and those of other disciplines. If this search fails, then psychology must recognize that its categories and those of natural science are incommensurable” (1938 [1920], 17).

2.3 Kuhn's subsequent development of incommensurability

Kuhn continued to struggle with, develop, and then refine his understanding of incommensurability until his death in 1996. Although his development of incommensurability went through several stages (cf. Hoyningen-Huene 1993, 206-222), he claimed to have made a “series of significant breakthroughs” beginning in 1987 (Kuhn 2000 [1993], 228). They are described in a number of essays and published lectures that were collected in (Kuhn 2000, cf. chs. 3, 4, 5, 10 & 11), and a last as yet unpublished book by Kuhn on incommensurability is still pending (Conant and Haugeland 2000, 2). The nature of these developments is controversial. Some commentators claim that Kuhn's incommensurability thesis underwent a ‘major transformation’ (Sankey 1993), while others (including Kuhn himself) see only a more specific characterization of the original core insight (Hoyningen-Huene 1993, 212; Kuhn 2000, [1983], 33ff.; Chen 1997). Kuhn's original holistic characterization of incommensurability has been distinguished into two separate theses. ‘Taxonomic incommensurability’ involves conceptual change in contrast to ‘methodological incommensurability’, which involves the epistemic values used to evaluate theories (Sankey 1991; Sankey and Hoyningen-Huene 2001; see Section 2.3.2 below).

2.3.1 Taxonomic incommensurability

Kuhn continued to emphasize the difference between normal, cumulative growth that does not change existing concepts; such as the discovery of Boyle's law, which left the concepts of gas, pressure and volume and the instruments used to measure them unchanged, from revolutionary discoveries that could not have been made on the basis of antecedently available concepts; such as the discovery of Newton's theory (Kuhn 2000 [1981], 14). Such developments require replacing existing concepts with new concepts that are incompatible with the older ideas. To help explain the nature of this conceptual incompatibility, Kuhn adopted the notion of a ‘lexical taxonomy’ or ‘lexicon‘ from linguistics (2000 [1989]). A lexical taxonomy stores and structures the vocabulary used to state laws and theories; or more specifically, the kinds of things that they describe. It is the “mental module” in which members of a speech community store the kind terms prerequisite to generalization and description (2000 [1991], 92–97; 2000 [1993], 229, 233, 238–239, 242, 244). To communicate, the terms that speakers use do not have to have the same meanings, nor do speakers need to use the same criteria for identifying something as a member of a particular kind (one ornithologist might identify ducks by their beaks, another by their tails) (cf. Hoyningen-Huene 1993, 99). Speakers need only share homologous lexical structures; that is, vocabularies incorporating the same system of taxonomic classification. This suffices to ensure that they refer to the same objects with the same kind terms. If two theories do not share the same taxonomic lexical structure, then they are incommensurable (2000 [1989], 63; 2000 [1991]; cf. Sankey 1997).

To help explicate incommensurability in terms of taxonomic classification, Kuhn developed the no-overlap principle. The no-overlap principle precludes cross-classification of objects into different kinds within a theory's taxonomy. According to the no-overlap principle, no two kind terms may overlap in their referents unless they are related as species to genus. For example, there are no dogs that are also cats; no gold that is also silver, and that is what makes the terms ‘dogs’, ‘cats’, ‘silver’, and ‘gold’ kind terms (Kuhn 2000 [1991], 92). Such kind terms are used to state laws and theories and must be learned together through experience (2000 [1993], 230; cf. Barker et al. 2003, 214 ff.). There are two possibilities. Most kind terms must be learned as members of one or another contrast set. For example to learn the term ‘liquid’, one must also master the terms ‘solid’ and ‘gas’. Other types of kind terms are not learned through contrast sets, but together with closely related terms through their joint application to situations that exemplify natural laws. For example, the term ‘force’ must be learned together with terms like ‘mass’ and ‘weight’ through an application of Hooke's law and either Newton's three laws of motion or else the first and third laws together with the law of gravity (2000 [1993], 231). According to Kuhn, scientific revolutions change the structural relations between pre-existing kind terms, breaking the no-overlap principle (2000 [1991], 92–96]. This is to say that theories separated by a revolution cross-classify the same things into mutually exclusive sets of kinds. A kind from one taxonomy is mutually exclusive with another if it cannot simply be introduced into it because the objects to which it refers would be subject to different sets of natural laws. This would result in conflicting expectations about the same objects, loss of logical relations between statements made with those concepts, and ultimately incoherence and miscommunication (Kuhn 2000 [1993], 232, 238). For example, Ptolemy's theory classifies the sun as a planet, where planets orbit the earth, while Copernicus' theory classifies the sun as a star, where planets orbit stars like the sun. A correct statement according to Copernican theory, such as “Planets orbit the sun” is incoherent in Ptolemaic vocabulary (2000 [1991], 94). Moreover, the Copernican claim that the planets orbit the sun could not even have been made without abandoning the Ptolemaic concepts and developing new ones to replace (and not supplement) them.

Furthermore, Kuhn (in a move toward Feyerabend's view) now claims that the same types of difficulties in communication that arise due to incommensurability between members of different scientific communities separated by the passage of time also occur between members of different contemporaneous sub-disciplines that result from scientific revolutions (Kuhn 2000 [1993], 238). This represents a significant change to his original phase-model of scientific advance, and a corresponding shift in his application of the notion of incommensurability. Kuhn no longer represents scientific advance as a linear progression from pre-normal science to normal science, through crisis to revolution that results in a new phase of normal science. Instead, scientific revolutions are compared to the process of speciation in biology, in that they result in branching into sub-disciplines that resemble a phylogenetic tree. The application of the relation of incommensurability is no longer restricted to diachronic episodes of scientific advance in which two theories are separated by a revolution. The contemporaneous sub-disciplines that result from a scientific revolution can also be incommensurable with each other. The incommensurability derives from different training required to master the incompatible kind terms used to state their laws and theories. These shared kind terms cross-classify the same set of objects into different sets of kinds, resulting in mutually exclusive lexical taxonomies that break the no-overlap principle. Moreover, now not only are both processes (scientific progress and biological evolution) similar in that they are not fixed in advance on some set goal (i.e. truth), but driven from behind (i.e. away from anomalies that play an analogous role to selection pressure), but also the incommensurability of scientific theories is presented as analogous to the isolating mechanisms required for speciation (Kuhn 2000 [1990], 94–99).

Kuhn compared the function of such lexical taxonomies to Kant's a priori when taken in a relativized sense. Each lexicon makes a corresponding form of life possible within which the truth or falsity of propositions may be both claimed and rationally justified. For example, with the Aristotelian lexicon, one can speak of the truth or falsity of Aristotelian assertions, but these truth values have no bearing on the truth of apparently similar assertions made with the Newtonian lexicon (Kuhn 2000 [1993], 244). A lexicon is thus constitutive of the objects of knowledge (Kuhn 2000 [1993], 245); and consequently, Kuhn rejected characterizations of scientific progress according to which science zeros in on the truth: “no shared metric is available to compare our assertions … and thus to provide a basis for a claim that our (or, for that matter, his) are closer to the truth” (2000 [1993], 244). Instead, the logical status of a lexical structure, like that of word-meanings in general, is that of convention, and the justification of a lexicon or of lexical change can only be pragmatic (2000 [1993], 244). Kuhn thus reaffirmed his earlier claim that the notion of a match or correspondence between the ontology of a theory and its real counterpart in nature is illusive in principle (1970, 206; 2000 [1993], 244). The implications that incommensurability has for scientific realism have been widely discussed and continue to be controversial (cf. Devitt 2001, Oberheim and Hoyningen-Huene 1997, Sankey forthcoming).

A lexicon is not only prerequisite to making meaningful statements, it also sets limits on what can be meaningfully said within the community of speakers that share it: “There is, for example, no way, even in an enriched Newtonian vocabulary, to convey the Aristotelian propositions regularly misconstrued as asserting the proportionality of force and motion or the impossibility of a void. Using our conceptual lexicon, these Aristotelian propositions cannot be expressed — they are simply ineffable — and we are barred by the no-overlap principle from access to the concepts required to express them ” (Kuhn 2000 [1993], 244; cf. 2000 [1989], 76). In this way, Kuhn's later notion of the incommensurability of scientific theories is based on effability. The structure of the lexicon shared by a particular community determines how the world can be described by its members, as well as how they will misunderstand the history of their own discipline; that is, unless they learn to understand older terms according to the structure of the older lexicon. Where Kuhn had earlier likened the process by which historians come to understand antiquated science as a special type of translation, he retracted these claims, insisting that the process is one of language learning, not translation (2000 [1993], 238, 244). Kuhn often claimed that incommensurable theories are untranslatable (e.g. Kuhn 1990, 94). However, he also emphasized that translation is neither needed in the comparison of incommensurable theories, nor in the hermeneutic historical method necessary to understand antiquated sciences (Kuhn 1993, 237, 238, 244). To overcome the barriers posed by incommensurability to understanding antiquated sciences, and to understanding the special technical vocabulary used by contemporaneous, phylogenetically related sub-disciplines, it is neither necessary not possible to translate between them. Rather, one must become bilingual, learning to use (and keep separate) the incongruently structured lexical taxonomies underwriting different laws and theories.

2.3.2 Methodological incommensurability

As Kuhn refined his notion of incommensurability as a special type of conceptual incompatibility, some commentators began to distinguish it from ‘methodological incommensurability’. Methodological incommensurability is the idea that there are no shared, objective standards of scientific theory appraisal, so that there are no external or neutral standards that univocally determine the comparative evaluation of competing theories (Sankey and Hoyningen-Huene 2001, xiii). This idea has also been recently discussed in detail under the rubric “Kuhn-underdetermination” (Carrier 2008, 278). The basic idea was developed out of Kuhn and Feyerabend's rejections of the traditional view that a distinguishing feature of science is a uniform, invariant scientific method, that remains fixed throughout its development (Kuhn 1970 [1962], 94, 103; Feyerabend 1975, 23–32; cf. Farrell 2003). Feyerabend famously argued that every proposed methodological rule has been fruitfully violated at some point in the course of scientific advance, and that only by breaking such rules could scientists have made the progressive steps for which they are praised (1975). He concluded that the idea of a fixed, historically invariant scientific method is a myth. There are no universally applicable methodological rules. The only methodological rule that is universally applicable is ‘anything goes’, which buys its universality at the cost of being completely empty (1970a, 105). Kuhn challenged the traditional view of scientific method as a set of rules, claiming that the standards of theory appraisal, such as simplicity, accuracy, consistency, scope and fruitfulness (1977, 322), depend on and vary with the currently dominant paradigm. He is often cited for having pointed out that as in political revolutions, so in choice of paradigm, there is no standard higher than the assent of the relevant community (1970 [1962], 94), and as having argued that there is “no neutral algorithm for theory choice, no systematic decision procedure which, properly applied, must lead each individual in the group to the same decision” (1970, 200). Kuhn developed the idea that such epistemic standards do not function as rules that determine rational theory choice, but as values that merely guide it (1977, 331). Different scientists apply these values differently, and they may even pull in different directions, so that there may be rational disagreement between scientists from incommensurable paradigms, who support different theories due to their weighing the same values differently.

3. Combating conceptual conservativism: Paul Feyerabend on incommensurability

An examination of Feyerabend's use and development of the idea of incommensurability of scientific theories reveals just how widespread it was prior to 1962. It also reveals the veiled common core of Feyerabend's philosophy of science, which otherwise appears to be a series of critical papers on unrelated topics (Oberheim 2005, 2006). That common core is the use of the idea of incommensurability to challenge many different forms of conceptual conservativism in science and philosophy. Conceptual conservativism unjustly favors existing ideas over potential improvements offered by incommensurable alternatives. Feyerabend used the notion of incommensurability to attack the following forms of conceptual conservativism: Heisenberg's idea of closed theories (1951), attempts to distinguish philosophical accounts of ontology from physics (1954), the foundational role of the stability thesis in logical positivism (1951, 1958a), Bohr's principle of complementarity (1958b, 1961, 1962, 1965b, 1970a), and the logical empiricists' models of explanation and reduction (1962, 1963a). He also used the idea of incommensurability to attack forms of conceptual conservativism implicit in the models of theory testing promoted by classical empiricists, the logical positivists, the logical empiricists, Popper, and Kuhn (1958a, 1962, 1963a, 1965b, 1970a), Kantian transcendental necessities (1962, 1965b, 1965c), traditional philosophical conundrums like the problem of the existence of the external world, the problem of the existence of other minds, and especially the mind-body problem (1962, 1965b, 1967, 1969a), certain aspects of Wittgenstein's later philosophy, as well as the linguistic philosophical movement that takes the utility of everyday concepts as given and merely attempts to analyze them, without changing their meanings (or ‘arguments from synonymy’) (1962, 1963a, 1965b, 1969b, 1970a), Popper's conception of verisimilitude (1970b), and scientific realist characterizations of scientific knowledge and scientific advance (1970b). Feyerabend argued that all of these views cannot accommodate the fact that the history of science reveals revolutionary developments in which incommensurable alternatives replaced existing ideas in the course of progress.

3.1 ‘Explanation, Reduction and Empiricism’ (1962)

In his landmark 1962 “Explanation, Reduction and Empiricism”, Paul Feyerabend initially introduced the term ‘incommensurable’ as part of a criticism of the conceptual conservativism that he found in Nagel's theory of reduction and the Hempel-Oppenheim theory of explanation. He argued that formal accounts of reduction and explanation are impossible for general theories because they cannot accommodate the development of incommensurable concepts in the course of scientific advance. Feyerabend used the notion of incommensurability to characterize the relation between two successive fundamental, universal scientific theories interpreted realistically; i.e. as purported descriptions of reality. By limiting incommensurability to universal theories, Feyerabend meant only those that apply to all objects in the universe. By limiting incommensurability to fundamental theories, Feyerabend meant those that have ontological implications; i.e., those that have implications about the very nature of reality. Universal, fundamental scientific theories can be incommensurable only if they are interpreted realistically, according to Feyerabend, because otherwise they cannot compete as the one true theory, and are thus not mutually exclusive. By calling two such theories incommensurable, Feyerabend meant that they were conceptually incompatible: The main concepts of one could neither be defined on the basis of the primitive descriptive terms of the other, nor related to them via a correct empirical statement (1962, 74, 90). As a consequence, it is impossible to reduce incommensurable theories formally.

In 1962, Feyerabend illustrated the incommensurability of scientific theories with a comparison of six pairs of central concepts drawn from three episodes of fundamental theory change in the course of scientific advance: (1) The dynamical characterization of impetus in the impetus theory of motion and the concept of force in the conceptual apparatus of Newtonian mechanics, (2 & 3) the concepts of temperature and entropy in the transition from phenomenological thermodynamics to kinetic theory, and (4, 5 & 6) the concepts mass, length and time in the transition from Newtonian to relativistic mechanics. Feyerabend subsequently added the example of geometrical optics and wave optics (1965b, 227). In 1962, Feyerabend also claimed that incommensurability occurs between traditional, fundamental theories in philosophy, and consequently arises in the discussions of the mind-body problem, the problem of the reality of the external world, and the problem of other minds (1962, 31, 90). Feyerabend argued that such age-old philosophical problems have not been solved because the disputants resist the kind of meaning change necessary for their dissolution. Concepts are incommensurable, according to Feyerabend, because they belong to mutually exclusive theoretical perspectives. These perspectives are mutually exclusive because they give incompatible accounts of the nature of reality. Feyerabend argued that because the meanings of their terms are provided by the theories to which they belong, when there is theoretical change, there are meaning changes (1962, 68, 94). Feyerabend argued that these changes in meaning affect our theoretical and observational terms, as well as our conception of the nature of reality. When this occurs, there is incommensurability; or as Feyerabend later characterized his view: “a theory is incommensurable with another if its ontological consequences are incompatible with the ontological consequences of the latter” (1981a, xi). The idea is intended to capture conceptual incompatibility due to changes of meaning that occur in theoretical transitions that affect our ontological beliefs. Two fundamental theories are incommensurable because the meanings of their terms are determined by the theoretical principles that govern their use, and these principles are qualitatively incompatible (1962, 58).

Feyerabend used the idea of incommensurability to attempt to expose a dogmatic element that contemporary empiricists share with school philosophies such as Platonism and Cartesianism (from whom empiricists had tried to distance themselves by insisting on an empirical foundation for scientific knowledge). The dogmatic element is due to the assumption that the meanings of empirical terms remain stable through theoretical transitions; or what Feyerabend called the principle of meaning invariance (1962, 30). Feyerabend argued that this principle is inconsistent with the existence of incommensurable concepts. Feyerabend drew two main consequences from the insight that some pairs of successive scientific theories are incommensurable. First, successive scientific theories that are incommensurable have no logical relations: “The order introduced into our experiences by Newton's theory is retained and improved by relativity. This means that the concepts of relativity theory are sufficiently rich to allow us to state all the facts which were stated before with the help of Newtonian physics. Yet these two sets of categories are completely different and bear no logical relation to each other” (1962, 88–89). Because their concepts have different meanings, they cannot be brought into formal logical relations. Second, a revision in the logical empiricist conception of scientific advance is required. Older theories, and the concepts used to state them, are not corrected and absorbed, and thereby legitimised. Rather, they are rejected and replaced, having been falsified. In this way, the logical empiricists' conceptually conservative (or retentive) accounts of reduction and explanation are undermined. They cannot accommodate the development of incommensurable concepts in the course of scientific advance.

In 1965, Feyerabend attempted to clarify his notion, claiming that two theories are incommensurable when the meanings of their main descriptive terms depend on mutually inconsistent principles (1965c, 227; 1975, 269–270, 276). He also claimed that two theories are incommensurable if a new theory entails that all the concepts of the preceding theory have zero extension or if it introduces rules that change the system of classes itself (1965a, 268). On this account, in order for there to be incommensurability, the “situation must be rigged in such a way that the conditions of concept formation in one theory forbid the formation of the basic concepts of the other” (Feyerabend 1978, 68; cf. 1975, 269; 1981b, 154). Still later, he claimed that with the term “incommensurability” he always meant “deductive disjointedness, and nothing else” (1977, 365). These subsequent formulations were all intended to capture the same idea.

3.2 Feyerabend's route to incommensurability

Although Feyerabend first used the term ‘incommensurable’ to describe successive fundamental scientific theories in 1962, he had developed his notion of the incommensurability of scientific theories more than ten years prior to the appearance of Kuhn's Structure of Scientific Revolutions (1962). Feyerabend first discussed his notion of incommensurable concepts with the Kraft Circle from 1949–1951 (Feyerabend 1978, 108ff.). The Kraft circle was a student group named after Viktor Kraft (Feyerabend's Ph.D. supervisor) and modelled after the Vienna circle (of which Kraft was a member). Guests such as Elizabeth Anscombe and Ludwig Wittgenstein attended meetings (Feyerabend 1978, 115–116; 1993, 259–260; 1995, 92). Feyerabend's route to the idea of the incommensurability of scientific theories was heavily influenced by a number of prominent individuals who had been discussing a wide range of related topics.

Feyerabend traced the origins of his notion of incommensurability back to his ‘thesis I’ in “An attempt at a realistic interpretation of experience” (1958a), a condensed version of his 1951 doctoral thesis Zur Theorie der Basissätze (On the Theory of Protocol Sentences). In his (1958a), Feyerabend criticized two conceptions of meaning. He argued against the logical positivist idea that the meaning of an observational term is determined by immediate experiences, as well as against the Wittgensteinian idea that the meaning of an observational term is determined by its use. Instead, Feyerabend argued for the idea that the meaning of a term, even an observation term, is determined by its theoretical context, or more precisely, by the theoretical principles that govern its correct use according to our best theories. For example, according to Feyerabend, the correct meaning of the term ‘temperature’ is not determined by its everyday use, but by the principles of statistical thermodynamics. From this perspective, Feyerabend developed ‘thesis I’, according to which the interpretation of an observation language is determined by the theories that we use to explain what we observe, and it changes as soon as those theories change (1958a, 163). Feyerabend proceeded to argue that when older theories are replaced, the meanings of the observational terms used to test the theories change. Just as in (1962), the result is incommensurability: The idea that successive scientific theories are conceptually incompatible and consequently logically disjoint. Feyerabend's ‘thesis I’ is thus an early version of his incommensurability thesis. In his (1958a), with this notion of incommensurability, Feyerabend challenged an implicit conceptual conservativism in logical positivism: The assumption that theoretical terms derive their meaning solely through their connection with experience, and that experience itself is a stable (or unchanging) foundation on which theoretical meaning can be based. Instead of such a bottom-up version of the relation of experience and theoretical knowledge, according to which experience determines the meanings of our theoretical terms, Feyerabend argued for a top-down version, according to which our theories determine the meaning we attach to our experiences. According to Feyerabend, experience cannot be taken for granted as some kind of fixed, neutral basis for comparing theories. Rather, it takes on its particular character in light of the theories we bring to it. An investigation of the source of these ideas reveals the founding father of the notion of incommensurability in the contemporary history and philosophy of science.

3.2.1 Progress through meaning change: Pierre Duhem

Feyerabend drew heavily from Duhem's The Aim and Structure of Physical Theory (1954 [1906]) in his development of the notion of incommensurability of scientific theories. The main points Feyerabend emphasized by calling scientific theories incommensurable had been developed already by Duhem, who had argued that logic is insufficient for determining the outcome of theoretical disputes in the natural sciences, and who documented the difficulties historians have in understanding the development of the natural sciences due to meaning change. Duhem also already highlighted the communication difficulties between proponents of competing scientific theories because of these differences in meaning. For example, Duhem had claimed that what a physicist states as the result of an experiment is not simply the recital of some observed facts. Rather, it is the interpretation of these facts on the basis of the theories the scientist regards as true (1954 [1906], 159). It follows, according to Duhem, that in order to understand the meanings that scientists ascribe to their own statements, it is necessary to understand the theories that they use in order to interpret what they observe. Thus, Duhem had stated an early version of Feyerabend's incommensurability thesis. Moreover, Duhem explicitly limited his discussion to non-instantial, physical theories, as opposed to mere experimental laws. This is very similar to the criteria that marks the most significant difference between Kuhn and Feyerabend's development of the idea of incommensurability (see Section 4), and that also delimits Einstein's use of ‘incommensurable’ while discussing the problems of theory comparison (see Section 3.2.3).

After explaining that the meaning of a term depends on the theory to which it belongs, and that a consequence of theoretical advance is meaning change, Duhem continued: “If the theories admitted by this physicist are those we accept, and if we agree to follow the same rules in the interpretation of the same phenomena, we speak the same language and can understand each other. But that is not always the case. It is not so when we discuss the experiments of a physicist who does not belong to our school; and it is especially not so when we discuss the experiments of a physicist separated from us by fifty years, a century, or two centuries” (1954 [1906], 159). Duhem continued: “How many scientific discussions there are in which each of the contenders claims to have crushed his adversary under the overwhelming testimony of the facts! … How many propositions are regarded as monstrous errors in the writings of those who have preceded us! We should perhaps commemorate them as great truths if we really wished to enquire into the theories which gave their propositions their true meaning” (Duhem 1954 [1906], 160–161). These passages make the same basic points that both Feyerabend and Kuhn made with their claims about incommensurability of scientific theories: Because older ideas are misunderstood, as a result of taking them out of their theoretical context, proponents of incommensurable scientific theories misunderstand each other, both claiming to have the facts on their side. Kuhn and Feyerabend both claimed that in such a situation, even empirical arguments can become circular (Feyerabend 1965b, 152; Kuhn 1970 [1962], 94).

3.2.2 The square root of 2 and complementarity: Niels Bohr

In his autobiography, Feyerabend acknowledged Niels Bohr's direct influence on the development of his notion of incommensurability in the 1950s. Feyerabend recalled a conversation in which Bohr had talked about the discovery that the square root of two cannot be an integer or a fraction. According to Feyerabend, Bohr presented the event as having led to the extension of a concept of number that retained some properties of integers and fractions, but changed others; and claimed that the transition from classical to quantum mechanics was carried out in accordance with precisely this principle (1995, 78). Feyerabend also used the notion of incommensurability in a publication on Bohr's complementarity thesis, where Feyerabend argued that Bohr's complementarity thesis is an example of an unjustified conceptual conservativism, taking issue with Bohr's contention that all quantum mechanical evidence will always necessarily be expressed in classical terms (Feyerabend 1958b). He presented Bohr's defence of the principle of complementarity as based on the conviction that every experience must necessarily make its appearance within the frame of our customary points of view, which is currently that of classical physics. However, according to Feyerabend, even though classical concepts have been successful in the past, and even though at the moment it may be difficult, or even impossible, for us to imagine how to replace them, it does not follow that the classical framework could not one day be superseded by an incommensurable rival. Consequently, it does not follow that all our future microscopic theories will have to take the notion of complementarity as fundamental. Instead, according to Feyerabend, a theory may be found whose conceptual apparatus, when applied to the domain of validity of classical physics, would be just as comprehensive and useful as the classical apparatus, without coinciding with it. He claimed that such a situation is by no means uncommon, and he used the transition from Newtonian to relativistic physics to bolster his point. According to Feyerabend, while the concepts of relativity theory are sufficiently rich to state all of the facts captured by Newtonian physics, the two sets of concepts are “completely different” and bear “no logical relations” to each other (1958b, 83; 1961, 388; 1962, 88–89). This is clearly an early version of his incommensurability thesis. On Feyerabend's fallibilist view of empirical knowledge, no element of our knowledge can be held to be necessary or absolutely certain. In our search for satisfactory explanations, we are at liberty to change any parts of our existing knowledge, however fundamental they may seem, including the concepts of classical physics.

3.2.3 ‘Kant on wheels’ and universal theories: Albert Einstein

Albert Einstein used the term ‘incommensurable’ to apply specifically to difficulties selecting and evaluating scientific theories before Kuhn and Feyerabend, and there are strong reasons to believe that Feyerabend's development of incommensurability was directly inspired by Einstein's use of the term. In his ‘Autobiographical notes’ (1949), Einstein attempted to explain that assessing the relative merits of universal physical theories involves making difficult judgments about their ‘naturalness’ that requires making judgments based on the reciprocal weighing of incommensurable qualities: “The second point of view is not concerned with the relation to the material observation but with the premises of the theory itself, with what may briefly but vaguely be characterized as the ‘naturalness’ or ‘logical simplicity’ of the premises (of the basic concepts and of the relations between these which are taken as a basis). This point of view, an exact formulation of which meets with great difficulties, has played an important role in the selection and evaluation of theories since time immemorial. The problem here is not simply one of a kind of enumeration of the logically independent premises (if anything like this were at all unequivocally possible), but that of a kind of reciprocal weighing of incommensurable qualities” (1949a, 23).

There are strong reasons to believe that these admittedly cryptic remarks directly inspired Feyerabend's use and development of the idea of incommensurability. Although Feyerabend did not cite from Einstein (1949) in his (1962), he does cite from Bohr's paper in that very same edited volume (Schilpp 1949). Moreover, there are striking similarities between Feyerabend and Einstein's uses of the term. First, both make a distinction between universal theories and theories that do not apply to the totality of all physical appearances, and then use this distinction to limit the application of incommensurability in the same way; i.e., the problem of weighing incommensurable qualities in selecting and evaluating theories is explicitly only meant to apply to such universal physical theories, and not just any pair of scientific theories (cf. Feyerabend 1962a, 28 and Einstein 1949a, 23). Second, Einstein's theoretical attitude is explicitly a form of neo-Kantianism very much like that of Feyerabend and Kuhn's. According to Einstein, his theoretical attitude “is distinct from that of Kant only by the fact that we do not conceive of the ‘categories’ as unalterable (conditioned by the nature of the understanding) but as (in the logical sense) free conventions. They appear to be a priori only insofar as thinking without the positing of categories and of concepts in general would be as impossible as is breathing in a vacuum” (Einstein 1949b, 374). This is the same basic perspective that both Kuhn and Feyerabend delineated when they developed their ideas of incommensurability. For example, Kuhn says, “I go around explaining my own position saying I am a Kantian with moveable categories” (Kuhn 2005 [1993], 264), an idea developed in detail by Hoyningen-Huene (1993). As for Feyerabend, he set out such a ‘Kant on wheels’ approach – to use Peter Lipton's apt expression (Lipton 2001) – at the beginning of ‘Explanation, Reduction and Empiricism’ (1962a). Feyerabend overtly adopted such a neo-Kantian metaphysical perspective with changing categories in order to pursue the question: If universal theories determine all of our experiences of the world, how can experience be used to test such theories? Third, the main example Feyerabend used to illustrate that and how incommensurable theories can indeed be compared on the basis of a ‘crucial experiment’ was Einstein's quantitative prediction, and Perrin's subsequent confirmation, of Brownian motion, which served as a crucial experiment between classical and statistical thermodynamics – one of only three examples of incommensurable scientific theories in Feyerabend (1962a) (cf. Oberheim 2006, 253ff.; Sirtes and Oberheim 2006). Feyerabend argued that although Brownian motion was already a well-known phenomenon, it became evidence for statistical thermodynamics and against classical thermodynamics only after the development of the kinetic theory, which was needed to interpret it as such. Even though there was a crucial experiment between these two universal theories, the theories have no common measure as the observations of Brownian motion that confirmed statistical thermodynamics were not couched in a neutral observation language. The observations only became evidence after they were interpreted according to statistical theory. Einstein discussed exactly this episode at length in his ‘Autobiographical notes’, where he used the term ‘incommensurable’ to apply to difficulties in judging the merits of universal physical theories. Fourth, later Feyerabend often defended his view that there is no fixed scientific method (e.g. 1975, 10–11) by citing Einstein: “The external conditions which are set for [the scientist] by the facts of experience do not permit him to let himself be too much restricted, in the construction of his conceptual world, by the adherence to an epistemological system. He therefore must appear to the systematic epistemologist as a type of unscrupulous opportunist” (Einstein1949b, 683ff.). Although Feyerabend's development of the idea of incommensurability of scientific theories was received by the philosophic and scientific communities as propagating radical, irrationalist ideas about science, he was actually trying to develop something he found in Einstein. In the preface to the German version of Against Method, Feyerabend wrote, “I want to emphasize yet again that the views in this book are not new – for physicist like Mach, Boltzmann, Einstein and Bohr they were a triviality. But the ideas of these great thinkers have been distorted [by positivist philosophers] beyond recognition” (1983, 12, our translation).

3.2.4 The mental and the material

Feyerabend, like Kuhn, explicitly drew from Wolfgang Köhler's work in Gestalt psychology in the development of his notion of incommensurability. Moreover, Köhler had already applied the notion of incommensurability to scientific theories (see Section 2.2.2). Köhler's use applies to different areas within natural science, not to successive scientific theories such as in early Kuhn (1962). Köhler's use of the term ‘incommensurable’ to describe the relationship between the concepts of psychology and physics was a main source of Feyerabend's development of the idea of the incommensurability (Oberheim 2005). Feyerabend's discussion of incommensurability in the formulation of the mind-body problem derives directly from Köhler's claims (Oberheim 2005). However, Feyerabend's (Wittgensteinian) strategy for overcoming the incommensurability in the dissolution of philosophical conundrums is not Köhler's (Oberheim 2006, 43–45). Feyerabend suggested that the insolubility is due to the unwillingness of philosophers of different persuasions to change the deeply entrenched meanings of their terms, and that in this case, the mental should be reinterpreted so that it is compatible with materialism (Feyerabend 1963b).

3.3 Feyerabend's later notion of incommensurability

While Feyerabend's notion of the incommensurability did not significantly change throughout his early writings in the philosophy of science, in his later more general philosophy, Feyerabend extended the application of the term beyond universal scientific theories. For example, he used it to characterize the transition from the Greek archaic, aggregate worldview of Homer to the substance world-view of the Pre-Socratics (1975, 261-269), and thereafter in a very broad sense, discussing incommensurable frameworks of thought and action (1975, 271), incommensurability in the domain of perceptions (1975, 225, 271), incommensurable discoveries and attitudes (1975, 269) and incommensurable paradigms (1981b [1970], 131–161), where such incommensurability involves the suspension of some of the universal principles of the received view. Feyerabend characterized this wider notion of incommensurability as a historical, anthropological thesis (1975, 271), but also applied it to different stages of the development of thought and perception in the individual (1975, 274). He also further developed his notion of incommensurability, claiming that it involves major conceptual changes of both ‘overt’ and ‘covert classifications’ (in Whorff's sense), so that incommensurability is difficult to explicitly define, and can only be shown (1975, 224–225). Still later, Feyerabend argued that ‘potentially every culture is all cultures’, apparently retracting a wider, cultural notion of incommensurability (Feyerabend 1994).

4. A comparison of Kuhn and Feyerabend on incommensurability

Initially, Feyerabend had a more concrete characterization of the nature and origins of incommensurability than Kuhn. On Feyerabend's view, because the nature of objects depends on the most advanced theories about them, and because the meaning of observation statements depends on the nature of those objects, the interpretation of an observation language is determined by the theories we use to explain what we observe. Kuhn, by contrast, was initially much less sure about the exact meaning of his notion of incommensurability, especially regarding world change, which he saw as the most fundamental aspect of incommensurability. Kuhn frankly confessed to have been at a loss: “In a sense that I am unable to explicate further, the proponents of competing paradigms practice their trades in different worlds” (1970 [1962], 150). He suggested that “we must learn to make sense of statements that at least resemble these” (1970 [1962], 121), and then spent a great deal of effort attempting to do so.

Furthermore, Feyerabend's concept of incommensurability of scientific theories was much more restricted than Kuhn's. For Kuhn, incommensurability had three prima facie heterogeneous domains, holistically bound: a change of problems and standards, a change of concepts used to state and solve them, and a change of world-view in which they arise. Feyerabend's focus, on the other hand, was initially exclusively on concepts occurring in universal or fundamental theories, together with their ontological implications. Ironically, however, in developments after 1962, both authors move in opposite directions. Kuhn gradually eliminated everything from his notion of incommensurability that does not concern scientific concepts, and ended more or less where Feyerabend began (see Carrier 2001; Chen 1997; Hoyningen-Huene 1990, 487-488; Hoyningen-Huene 1993, 212-218; Hoyningen-Huene 2004, Sankey 1993; Sankey 1994, 16-30; Sankey 1997). Feyerabend, by contrast, increasingly emphasized aspects of perceptual change (1975, 225–229, 273–274; 1978, 68; 1988, 172–176), and also changes to the set of legitimate problems a discipline should handle (1975, 274–275), and his later philosophy emphasizes one of Kuhn's original points; the role of non-binding, epistemic values in theory choice (cf. Farrell 2003).

With respect to the range of theories that are subject to incommensurability, Feyerabend's concept is again much more restricted than Kuhn's. For Feyerabend, only universal, fundamental, non-instantial theories that are interpreted realistically can be incommensurable (Feyerabend 1962, 44; 1965b, 216; 1975, 114, 271, 284; 1975, 221–222; 1987, 272). Feyerabend was interested in fundamental, universal theories that apply to everything, because he believed that only “such comprehensive structures of thought” have ontological implications that are capable of sustaining entire worldviews (Feyerabend 1962, 28; cf. Feyerabend 1954 and Oberheim 2006, 157ff.). He restricted incommensurability to non-instantial theories, which he distinguished from empirical generalizations, on the basis of the differences in their test procedures. Generalizations of the form ‘All A's are B's’ (regardless of whether the A's or B's are observable) are tested by inspecting instances. So for example, Kepler's first law makes claims about the planets, which can be tested directly by inspecting their motion. In order to test non-instantial theories, such as Newton's theory of gravitation, first empirical generalizations must be derived from them with the help of auxiliary hypothesis, and only thereafter can they be tested by inspection (Feyerabend 1962, 28). Due to these restrictions (only universal, fundamental, non-instantial theories), for Feyerabend, incommensurability of scientific theories occurs comparatively rarely (1987, 272). Kuhn included a wider range of theories as candidates for incommensurability. For him, even smaller episodes, like unexpected discoveries, might be incommensurable with the earlier tradition (cf. Hoyningen-Huene 1993, 197-201). This difference in the range of incommensurability between Kuhn and Feyerabend's versions finds its most striking expression in the way they regard the transition from the Ptolemaic to the Copernican theory. For Kuhn, the differences between these two theories comprise an exemplary illustration of incommensurability. For Feyerabend, however, because planetary theory lacks the quality of universality, there is no incommensurability (1975, 114). Furthermore, in his later writings Kuhn insisted that the version of incommensurability he championed had always been “local incommensurability,” a notion that restricts conceptual change to a few, typically interconnected concepts (cf. Hoyningen-Huene 1993, 213, 219). Thus, there may be empirical consequences of incommensurable theory pairs that can be immediately compared. For instance, the geocentric and heliocentric planetary theories are incommensurable in Kuhn's sense, while predictions of the planetary positions of both theories are fully commensurable, and can be immediately compared regarding their empirical accuracy. By contrast, Feyerabend always thought of his concept more globally, as affecting all statements derivable from two fundamental theories (1962, 93; 1965c, 117; 1965b, 216; 1975, 275–276; 1981a, xi).

Both Kuhn and Feyerabend have often been misread as advancing the view that incommensurability implies incomparability (cf. Hoyningen-Huene 1993, 218ff.; Oberheim 2006, 235). In response to this misreading, Kuhn repeatedly emphasized that incommensurability does not imply incomparability (cf. Hoyningen-Huene 1993, 236ff.). Theory comparison is merely more complicated than imagined by some philosophers of science. In particular, it cannot fully be made ‘point-by-point’. It is not an algorithmic procedure (cf. Hoyningen-Huene 1993, 147-154; Feyerabend 1975, 114; 1981a, 238), nor one that requires translation into a neutral observation language. Different epistemic values, such as universality, accuracy, simplicity, fruitfulness may pull in different directions (cf. Hoyningen-Huene 1992, 492–496; 1993, 150–154; Feyerabend 1981a 16, 1981c, 238) allowing for the possibility of rational disagreement. But even if a full point-by-point comparison of incommensurable theories is impossible, and even if theory comparison does not have the status of a proof, a comparative evaluation of incommensurable theories is still possible (cf. Hoyningen-Huene 1993, 236-258; Carrier 2001) and rational in a means/ends or instrumental sense. For example, according to Kuhn it is rational to choose theories that are better problem-solvers because they better serve the ends of science. This property of theory choice makes the overall process of science both rational and progressive. With the notion of incommensurability, Kuhn was not so much challenging the rationality of theory choice, as trying to make room for the possibility of rational disagreement between proponents of competing paradigms. In fact, according to Kuhn, “incommensurability is far from being the threat to rational evaluation of truth claims that it has frequently seemed. Rather, it's what is needed, within a developmental perspective, to restore some badly needed bite to the whole notion of cognitive evaluation. It is needed, that is, to defend notions like truth and knowledge from, for example, the excesses of post-modernist movements like the strong program” (2000 [1993], 91).

The extent of the misreading of incommensurability as implying incomparability is even more dramatic in Feyerabend's case. A far cry from claiming that incommensurable theories cannot be compared, Feyerabend explicitly and repeatedly argued that incommensurable alternatives actually offer a better means of comparing the merits of theories than the mere development of commensurable alternatives (Feyerabend 1962, 66; cf. Oberheim 2006, 235ff.). He illustrated this point with an example of a crucial experiment between incommensurable theories. He argued that even though the central concepts of statistical and classical phenomenological thermodynamics are incommensurable, it was still possible indirectly to stage a crucial experiment between them (Perrin's confirmation of Einstein's quantitative predictions of Brownian motion). This was the centre piece of Feyerabend's argument for pluralism. The argument turns on the claim that this refutation of classical phenomenological thermodynamics could not have been conducted without the development of statistical thermodynamics, which is an incommensurable alternative. Feyerabend concluded that some observations can only be interpreted as refutations of an existing theory after an incommensurable alternative has been developed with which to interpret them (cf. Oberheim 2006, 240–245). His unorthodox image of scientific progress is delineated as an increase in a set of incommensurable alternatives, each forcing the others into greater articulation (Feyerabend 1965c, 107; 1975, 30; cf. Oberheim 2005; Oberheim 2006, 260ff.).

The source of the misunderstanding concerning incomparability appears to be Feyerabend's onetime suggestion that “incommensurable theories may not possess any comparable consequences” (1962, 94). However, here Feyerabend was arguing that although the same experimental set-up might produce a numerical result that can be used to confirm both of two incommensurable theories (e.g. measuring the time of a freefalling stone to test predictions by both Newtonian mechanics and Relativity theory), in order to use the result to confirm a theory, it must be interpreted by that theory. Given that the two incommensurable theories will use qualitatively incompatible concepts to interpret quantitatively identical results, they will interpret the same quantitative sentences as different qualitative statements. Feyerabend concluded directly thereafter: “Hence, there may not exist any possibility of finding a characterization of the observations which are supposed to confirm two incommensurable theories” (1962, 94, italics inserted). This does rule out the possibility of using a neutral observation language to compare the empirical consequences of two incommensurable theories. Yet Feyerabend did not conclude that this inhibits their comparison, but rather that there is no need for a neutral observation language in order to compare them. Feyerabend also mentions other possibilities of comparing incommensurable theories (Feyerabend 1965b, 217; 1970, 228; 1975, 284; 1978, 68; 1981a, 16). Some of these involve making subjective judgments about how to weigh different values that may pull in different directions (methodological incommensurability).

Finally, there is one central, substantive point of agreement between Kuhn and Feyerabend. Both see incommensurability as precluding the possibility of interpreting scientific development as an approximation to truth (or as an “increase of verisimilitude”) (Feyerabend, 1965c, 107; 1970, 220, 222, 227–228; 1975, 30, 284; 1978, 68; Kuhn 1970, 206; 1991, 6; 1993, 330; cf. Oberheim 2006, 180ff.; Hoyningen-Huene 1993, 262-264). They reject such characterizations of scientific progress because they recognize and emphasize that scientific revolutions result in changes in ontology. Such changes are not just refinements of, or additions to, the older ontology, such that these developments could be seen as cumulative additions to already established theoretical views. Rather, the new ontology replaces its predecessor. Consequently, neither Kuhn nor Feyerabend can correctly be characterized as scientific realists who believe that science makes progress toward the truth.


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Duhem, Pierre | Einstein, Albert: Einstein-Bohr debates | Feyerabend, Paul | Kuhn, Thomas | physics: structuralism in | reduction, scientific | scientific progress | scientific revolutions | scientific unity