Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Structuralism in Physics

First published Sun Nov 24, 2002; substantive revision Wed Mar 5, 2008

Under the heading of “structuralism in physics” there are three different but closely related research programs in philosophy of science and, in particular, in philosophy of physics. These programs were initiated by the work of Joseph Sneed, Günther Ludwig, and Erhard Scheibe, respectively, since the begin of the 1970s. For the sake of simplicity we will use these names in order to refer to the three programs, without the intention of ignoring or minimizing the contributions of other scholars. (See the Bibliography.) The term “structuralism” was originally claimed by the Sneed school, see e.g., Balzer and Moulines (1996), but it also appears appropriate to subsume Ludwig's and Scheibe's programs under this title because of the striking similarities of the three approaches. The activities of the structuralists have been mainly confined to Europe, especially Germany, and, for whatever reasons, largely ignored in the Anglo-American discussion.

1. Common traits

The three programs share the following characteristics and convictions:

2. The problem of theoretical terms

A physical theory T consists, among other things, of a group of laws which are formulated in terms of certain concepts. But an apparent circularity arises when one considers how the laws of T and the concepts acquire their content, because each seems to acquire content from the other — the laws of T acquire their content from the concepts used in the formulation of the laws, while the concepts are often “introduced” or “defined” by the group of laws as a whole. To be sure, if the concepts can be introduced independently of the theory T, the circularity does not appear. But typically every physical theory T requires some new concepts which cannot be defined without using T (we call the latter “T-theoretical concepts”). Is the apparent circularity concerning the laws and the T-theoretical concepts a problem? Some examples will help us assess the threat.

2.1 An example

As an example, consider the theory T of classical particle mechanics. For simplicity we will assume that kinematical concepts, such as the positions of particles, their velocities and accelerations are given independently of the theory as functions of time. A central statement of T is Newton's second law, F=ma, which asserts that the sum F of the forces exerted upon a particle equals its mass m multiplied by its acceleration a.

While we customarily think of F=ma as an empirical assertion, there is a real risk that it turns out merely to be a definition or largely conventional in character. If we think of a force merely as “that which generates acceleration” then the force F is actually defined by the equation F=ma. We have a particle undergoing some given acceleration a, then F=ma just defines what F is. The law is not an empirically testable assertation at all, since a force so defined cannot fail to satisfy F=ma. The problem gets worse if we define the (inertial) mass m in the usual manner as the ratio |F|/|a|. For now we are using the one equation F=ma to define two quantities F and m. A given acceleration a at best specifies the ratio F/m but does not specify unique values for F and m individually.

In more formal terms, the problem arises because we introduced force F and mass m as T-theoretical terms that are not given by other theories. That fact also supplies an escape from the problem. We can add extra laws to the simple dynamics. For example, we might require that all forces are gravitational and that the net force on the mass m be given by the sum FiF i of all gravitational forces Fi acting on the mass due to the other masses of the universe, in accord with Newton's inverse square law of gravity. (The law asserts that the force Fi due to attracting mass i with gravitational mass mgi is Gmgmgi ri / ri3, where mg is the gravitational mass of the original body, ri the position vector of mass i originating from the original body, and G the universal constant of gravitation.) That gives us an independent definition for F. Similarly we can require that the inertial mass m be equal to the gravitational mass mg. Since we now have independent access to each of the terms F, m and a appearing in F=ma, whether the law obtains is contingent and no longer a matter of definition.

Further problems can arise, however, because of another T-theoretical term that is invoked implicitly when F=ma is asserted. The accelerations a are tacitly assumed to be measured in relation to an inertial system. If the acceleration is measured in relation to a different reference system, a different result is obtained. For example, if it is measured in relation to a system moving with uniform acceleration A, then the measured acceleration will be a′ = (aA). A body not acted on by gravitational forces in an inertial frame will obey 0=ma so that a=0. The same body in the accelerated frame will have acceleration a′ = -A and be governed by -mA = ma′. The problem is that the term -mA behaves just like a gravitational force; its magnitude is directly proportional to the mass m of the body. So the case of a gravitation free body in a uniformly accelerated reference system is indistinguishable from a body in free fall in a homogeneous gravitational field. A theoretical underdetermination threatens once again. Given just the motions how are we to know which case is presented to us?[1] Resolving these problems requires a systematic study of the relations between the various T-theoretical concepts, inertial mass, gravitational mass, inertial force, gravitational force, inertial systems and accelerated systems and how they figure in the relevant laws of the theory T.

Similar problems arise in the formulation of almost all fundamental physical theories.

2.2 Structuralistic solutions of the problem of theoretical terms

There are various ways to cope with this problem. One could try to unmask it as a pseudo-problem. Or one could try to accept the problem as part of the usual way science works, albeit not in the clean manner philosophers would like it. The structuralistic programs, however, agree that this is a non-trivial problem to be solved and devise meta-theoretical machinery to enable its solution. They further agree on dividing the vocabulary of the theory T into T-theoretical and T-non-theoretical terms, the latter being provided from outside the theory.

2.2.1 Sneed's solution

In the Sneedean approach the “empirical claim” of the theory is formulated by using an existential quantifier for the T-theoretical terms (i.e., in terms of the “Ramsey sentence” for T). In our above example, Newton's law for gravitational forces would be reformulated as: “There exist an inertial system and constants G, mi, mgi such that for each particle the product of its mass times its acceleration equals the sum of the gravitational forces as given above.” This removes the circularity but leaves open the question of content. Here the structuralists à la Sneed would argue that the empirical claim of the theory T′ has to contain all the laws of the theory as well as higher-order laws, called “constraints”. In our example, the constraints would be statements such as “all particles have the same inertial and gravitational masses and the gravitational constant assumes the same value in all models of the theory.” The theory would thereby acquire more content and become non-vacuous.

2.2.2 Ludwig's solution

Although Ludwig's meta-theoretical framework is slightly different, the first part of his solution is essentially equivalent to the above one. On the other hand, he proposes a stronger program (“axiomatic basis of a physical theory”) which proceeds by considering an equivalent form T* of a theory T in which all T-theoretical concepts are eliminated by explicit definitions. This seems to be at variance with older results about the non-definability of theoretical terms, but a closer inspection removes the apparent contradiction. For example, the concept of “mass” may be non-definable in a theory dealing only with single orbits of a mechanical system, but definable in a theory containing all possible orbits of that system.

However, to formulate the axiomatic basis of a real theory, not just a toy model, is a non-trivial task and typically requires one or two books; see the examples Ludwig (1985, 1987) and Schmidt (1979).

2.3 The measurement problem

Both programs address the further problem of how to determine the extension, e.g., the numerical values, of a theoretical term from a given set of observational data. We will call this the “measurement problem”, not to be confounded with the well-known measurement problem in quantum theory. Typically the measurement problem has no unique solution. Rather the values of the theoretical quantities can only be measured within a certain degree of imprecision and using auxiliary assumptions which, although plausible, are not confirmed with certainty. In the above Newton example one would have to use the auxiliary assumption that the trajectories of the particles are twice differentiable and that other forces except the gravitational forces can be neglected.

2.4 Measurement and approximation

The feature of imprecision and approximation plays a prominent rôle in the structuralistic programs. In the context of the measurement problem, imprecision seems to be a defect of the theory which impedes the exact determination of the theoretical quantities. However, imprecision and non-uniqueness is crucial in the context of evolution of theories and the transition to new and “better” theories. Otherwise the new theory could in general not encompass the successful applications of the old theory. Consider for example the transition of Kepler's theory of planetary motion to Newton's and Einstein's theories: Newtonian gravitation theory and general relativity replace the Kepler ellipses with more complicated curves. But these should still be consistent with the old astronomical observations, which is only possible if they don't fit exactly into Kepler's theory .

3. Problems of reduction

3.1 Reduction relation between theories

Part of the structuralistic program is the definition of various intertheoretic relations. Here we will concentrate on the relation(s) of “reduction”, which play an important rôle in the philosophical discourse as well as in the work of the physicists, albeit not under this name. Consider a theory T which is superseded by a better theory T′. One could use T′ in order to understand some of the successes and failures of T. If there is some systematic way of deriving T as an approximation within T′, then T is “reduced” to or by T′. In this case, T is successful where it is a good approximation to T′ and T′ is successful. On the other hand, in situations where T′ is still successful but T is a poor approximation to T′, T will fail. For example, classical mechanics should be obtained as the limiting case of relativistic mechanics for velocities small compared with the velocity of light. This would explain why classical mechanics was, and is still, successfully applied in the case of small velocities but fails for large (relative) velocities.

As mentioned, the investigation of such reduction relations between different theories is part of the every-day work of theoretical physicists, but usually they do not adopt a general concept of reduction. Rather they intuitively decide what has to be shown or to be calculated, depending on the case under consideration. Here the work of the structuralists could lead to a more systematic approach within physics, although there does not yet exist a generally accepted, unique concept of reduction.

3.2 Reduction and incommensurability

Another aspect is the rôle of reduction within the global picture of the development of physics. Most physicists, but not all, tend to view their science as an enterprise which accumulates knowledge in a continuous manner. For example, they would not say that classical mechanics has been disproved by relativistic mechanics, but that relativistic mechanics has partly clarified where classical mechanics could be safely applied and where not. This view of the development of physics has been challenged by some philosophers and historians of science, especially by the writings of T. Kuhn and P. Feyerabend. These scholars emphasize the conceptual discontinuity or “incommensurability” between reduced theory T and reducing theory T′. The structuralistic accounts of reduction now opens the possibility of discussing these matters on a less informal level. The preliminary results of this discussion are different depending on the particular program.

3.3 Ludwig's account

In the writings of Ludwig there is no direct reference to the incommensurability thesis and the corresponding discussion. But obviously his approach implies the most radical denial of this thesis. His reduction relation is composed of two simpler intertheoretic relations called “restriction” and “embedding”. They come in two versions, exact and approximate. Part of their definitions are detailed rules of translation of the non-theoretic vocabulary of T′ into that of T. Hence commensurability, at least on the non-theoretical level, is insured by definition. The problem is then shifted to the task of showing that some of the interesting cases of reduction, which are discussed in the context of incommensurability, fit into Ludwig's definition. Unfortunately, he gives only one extensively worked-out example of reduction, namely thermodynamics vs. quantum statistical mechanics, in Ludwig (1987). Incommensurability of theoretical terms could probably be more easily incorporated in Ludwig's approach since it could be traced back to the difference between the laws of T and T′.

3.4 Sneed's account

The relation between incommensurability and the Sneedean reduction relation is to some extent discussed in Balzer et al. (1987, chapter VI.7). The authors consider an exact reduction relation as a certain relation between potential models of the respective theories. More interesting for physical real-life examples is the approximate version which is obtained as a “blurred exact reduction” by means of a subclass of an empirical uniformity on the classes of potential models. The Kepler-Newton case is discussed as an example of approximate reduction. The discussion of incommensurability suffers from the notorious difficulties of explicating such notions as “meaning preserving translation”. There is an interesting application of the interpolation theorem of meta-mathematics which yields the result that, roughly speaking, (exact) reduction implies translation. However, the relevance of this result is questioned in Balzer et al. (1987, 312 ff). Thus the discussion eventually ends up as inconclusive, but the authors admit the possibility of a spectrum of incommensurabilities of different degrees in cases of pairs of reduced/reducing theories.

3.5 Scheibe's account

Scheibe in his (1999) also explicitly refers to the theses of Kuhn and Feyerabend and gives a detailed discussion. Unlike the other two structuralistic programs, he does not propose a fixed concept of reduction. Rather he suggests a lot of special reduction relations which can be combined appropriately to connect two theories T and T′. Moreover, he proceeds by means of extensive real-life case studies and considers new types of reduction relations if the case under consideration cannot be described by the relations considered so far. Scheibe concedes that there are instances of incommensurability which make it difficult to find a reduction relation in certain cases. As a significant example he mentions the notions of an “observable” in quantum mechanics on the one hand, and in classical statistical mechanics on the other hand. Although there are maps between the respective sets of observables, Scheibe considers this as a case of incommensurability, since these maps are not Lie algebra homomorphisms, see Scheibe (1999, 174).

Summarizing, the structuralistic approaches are capable of discussing the issues of reduction and incommensurability and the underlying problems on an advanced level. Thereby these approaches have a chance of mediating between disparate camps of physicists and philosophers.

4. Three structuralist programs

In this section we will describe more closely the particular programs, their roots and some of the differences between them.

4.1 Sneed's program

4.1.1 History and general traits

This program has been the most successful with respect to the formation of a “school” attracting scholars and students who adopt the approach and work on its specific problems. Hence most of the structuralistic literature concerns the Sneedean variant. Perhaps this is partly also due to the circumstance that only Sneed's approach is intended to apply (and has been applied) to other sciences and not only physics.

The seminal book was Sneed (1971) which presented a meta-theory of physics in the model-theoretical tradition connected with P. Suppes, B. C. van Fraassen, and F. Suppe. This approach was adopted and popularized by the German philosopher W. Stegmüller, see e.g., Stegmüller (1979) and further developed mainly by his disciples. In its early days the approach was called the “non-statement view” of theories, emphasizing the rôle of set-theoretical tools as opposed to linguistic analyses. Later this aspect was considered to be more of practical importance than a matter of principle, see Balzer et al. (1987, 306 ff). Nevertheless, the almost exclusive use of set-theoretic tools remains one of the characteristic stylistic features of this program and one that distinguishes it conspicuously from the other programs.

4.1.2 Central notions of Sneed's program

According to Moulines, in Balzer and Moulines (1996, 12-13), the specific notions of the Sneedean program are the following. We illustrate these notions by simplified examples, inspired by Balzer et al. (1987), which are based on a system of N classical point particles coupled by springs satisfying Hooke's law.

4.2 Ludwig's program

4.2.1 History and general traits

Günther Ludwig (1918 - 2007) was a German physicist mainly known for his work on the foundations of quantum theory. In Ludwig (1970, 1985, 1987), he published an axiomatic account of quantum mechanics, which was based on the statistical interpretation of quantum theory. As a prerequisite for this work he found it necessary to ask “What is a physical theory?” and developed a general concept of a theory on the first 80 pages of his (1970). Later this general theory was expanded into the book Ludwig (1978). A recent elaboration of Ludwig's program can be found in Schröter (1996).

His underlying “philosophy” is the view that there are real structures in the world which are “pictured” or represented, in an approximate fashion, by mathematical structures, symbolically PT = W (−) MT. The mathematical theory MT used in a physical theory PT contains as its core a “species of structure” Σ. This is a meta-mathematical concept of Bourbaki which Ludwig introduced into the structuralistic approach. The contact between MT to some “domain of reality” W is achieved by a set of correspondence principles (−), which give rules for translating physical facts into certain mathematical statements called “observational reports”. These facts are either directly observable or given by means of other physical theories, called “pre-theories” of PT. In this way a part G of W, called “basic domain” is constructed. But it remains a task of the theory to construct the full domain of reality W, that is, the more complete description of the basic domain that also uses PT-theoretical terms.

4.2.2 Typical features of Ludwig's program

Superficially considered, this concept of theory shows some similarity to neo-positivistic ideas and would be subject to similar criticism. For example, the discussion of the so-called ‘theory-laden’ character of observation sentences casts doubts on such notions as “directly observable facts”. Nevertheless, the adherents of the Ludwig approach would probably argue for a moderate form of observationalism and would point out that, within Ludwig's approach, the theory-laden character of observation sentences could be analyzed in detail.

Another central idea of Ludwig's program is the description of intra- and inter-theoretical approximations by means of “uniform structures”, a mathematical concept lying between topological and metrical structures. Although this idea was later adopted by the other structuralistic programs, it plays a unique rôle within Ludwig's meta-theory in connection with his finitism. He believes that the mathematical structures of the infinitely large or small, a priori, have no physical meaning at all; they are preliminary tools to approximate finite physical reality. Uniform structures are vehicles for expressing this particular kind of approximation.

4.2.3 Ludwig's late work

One year before his death Ludwig, together with Gérald Thurler, published a revised and simplified edition of Ludwig (1990) with the title “A new foundation of physical theories”. This work cannot be used as a textbook but it is a remarkable document of the central themes of his approach and his general views on physics. The book clearly shows that Ludwig's main concern is about scientific realism, i.e., about the question of how hypothetical objects and relations occurring within a successful theory acquire the status of physical reality. Entities which cannot claim this status are dubbed as “fairy tales” throughout the book. Examples of fairy tales in quantum theory are hidden variables and, perhaps surprising for some readers, also the single-particle-state interpretation (in contrast to the ensemble interpretation fostered by Ludwig).

Among the new concepts and tools developed in Ludwig/Thurler (2006) are the following:

4.2.4 Summary

Generally speaking, Ludwig's program is, in comparison to those of Sneed and Scheibe, less descriptive and more normative with respect to physics. He developed an ideal of how physical theories should be formulated rather than reconstructing the actual practice. The principal worked-out example that comes close to this ideal is still the axiomatic account of quantum mechanics, as described in Ludwig (1985, 1987).

4.3 Scheibe's program

The German philosopher Erhard Scheibe has published several books and numerous essays on various topics of philosophy of science; see, for example, Scheibe (2001). He has often commented on the programs of Sneed and Ludwig, such as in his “Comparison of two recent views on theories”, reprinted in Scheibe (2001, 175-194). Moreover, he published one of the earliest case studies of approximate theory reduction; see Scheibe 2001 (306-323) for the 1973 case study.

In his recent books on “reduction of physical theories,” Scheibe (1997, 1999) developed his own concept of theory, which to some extent can be considered an intermediate position between those of Ludwig and Sneed. For example, he conveniently combines the model-theoretical and syntactical styles of Sneed and Ludwig, respectively. Since his main concern is reduction, he does not need to cover all the aspects of physical theories that are treated in the other approaches. As already mentioned, he proposes a more flexible concept of reduction that is open to extensions arising from new case studies.

A unique feature of Scheibe's approach is the thorough discussion of almost all the important cases of reduction considered in the physical literature. These include classical vs. special-relativistic spacetime, Newtonian gravitation vs. general relativity, thermodynamics vs. kinetic theory, and classical vs. quantum mechanics. He essentially arrives at the conclusion of a double incompleteness: the attempts of the physicists to prove reduction relations in the above cases are largely incomplete according to their own standards, as well as according to the requirements of a structuralistic concept of reduction. But this concept is also not complete, Scheibe argues, since, for example, a satisfactory understanding of “counter-factual” limiting processes such as ℏ→0 or c→∞ has not yet been developed.

5. Summary

We have sketched three structuralistic programs which have been developed in the past three decades in order to tackle problems in philosophy of physics, some of which are relevant also for physics itself. Any program which employs a weighty formal apparatus in order to describe a domain and to solve specific problems has to be scrutinized with respect to the economy of its tools: to what extent is this apparatus really necessary to achieve its goals? Or is it concerned mainly with self-generated problems? We have tried to provide some arguments and material for the reader who ultimately has to answer these questions for him- or herself.


This bibliography is restricted to a selection of a few books which are of some importance for the three structuralistic programs. An extended ‘Bibliography of Structuralism’ connected to Sneed's program appeared in Erkenntnis 44 (1994). An analogous bibliography of articles and books pertaining to Ludwig's program is in preparation. Unfortunately, the central books of Ludwig (1978) and Scheibe (1997, 1999) are not yet translated into English, but see the recent Ludwig and Thurler (2006). For an introduction into the respective theories, English readers could consult chapter XIII of Ludwig (1987) and chapter V of Scheibe (2001).

Sneed's program

Ludwig's program

Scheibe's program

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Related Entries

model theory | physics: experiment in | physics: intertheory relations in | quantum mechanics | scientific realism


The author is indebted to John D. Norton, Edward N. Zalta, and Susanne Z. Riehemann for helpful suggestions concerning the content and the language of this entry.