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Intensional Transitive Verbs

First published Wed Nov 3, 2004

A verb is transitive iff it usually occurs with a direct object, and in such occurrences it is said to occur transitively. Thus ‘ate’ occurs transitively in ‘I ate the meat and left the vegetables’, but not in ‘I ate then left’ (perhaps it is not the same verb ‘left’ in these two examples, but it seems to be the same ‘ate’). A verb is intensional if the verb phrase (VP) it forms with its complement is anomalous in at least one of three ways: (i) interchanging expressions in the complement referring to the same entity can change the truth-value of the sentence embedding the VP; (ii) the VP admits of a special “unspecific” reading if it contains a quantifier, or a certain type of quantifier; and (iii) the normal existential commitments of names and existential quantifiers in the complement are suspended even when the embedding sentence is negation-free.

Intensional phenomena are puzzling, and worth studying, because (a) it seems that the only way to account for language speakers’ capacities to produce and understand sentences of their native languages which they have never encountered before is to posit compositional structure in language and an interpretive capacity in speakers that exploits it. But (b) the simplest ideas about what such structure is like cannot accommodate intensionality. So we want to know what the smallest complication is which allows for the intensional. Investigation of intensional verbs has focussed mainly on propositional attitude reports, which take clauses rather than direct objects as their complements. However, as we will see below, intensional transitive verbs (henceforth ITVs) do not merely duplicate the problems raised by propositional attitude verbs, but make special difficulties of their own.

1. Some groups of ITVs and their behavior

Search verbs and desire verbs manifest all three of the behaviors listed in the prologue as “marks” or effects of intensionality. First, Lois Lane may be looking for Superman. But it does not seem to follow that she is looking for Clark, even though Superman is Clark, and so we have an example of substitution-failure, one in which interchange of two names for the same person leads to a change in truth-value for the embedding sentence. Similarly, a thirsty person who believes that water quenches thirst and that H2O is a kind of rat poison may want some water but not some H2O. [According to some, the alleged substitution-resistance here is an illusion; but for reasons of space I do not pursue this theory — its locus classicus is (Salmon 1986).]

Second, both types of verb create specific-unspecific ambiguities in their containing VP's when the syntactic object of the verb consists in a determiner followed by a nominal (this ambiguity is also known as the relational/notional ambiguity, following Quine 1956, where it was first studied, at least in the modern period). For example, ‘Oedipus is looking for a member of his family’ could be true because Oedipus is looking specifically for Jocasta, who is a member of his family, though he doesn’t realize it. On such an occasion, what is true can be more carefully stated as ‘there is a member of his family such that Oedipus is looking for that person’. The alternative, unspecific or notional reading, is forced by adding ‘but no particular one’: ‘Oedipus is looking for a member of his family, but no particular one’. Here Oedipus is implied just to have a general intention to find some member or other of his family. Contrast the extensional ‘embrace’: Oedipus cannot embrace a member of his family, but no particular one.

Third, it is obvious that it is possible both to want, and to search for, that which does not exist, for instance, a fountain of eternal youth. But it isn’t possible to, say, stumble across such a thing, unless it exists.

Depiction verbs, such as ‘draw’, ‘sculpt’, and ‘imagine’, resist substitution in their syntactic objects, at least if the clausal ‘imagine’ does: if imagining that Superman rescues you is not the same thing as imagining that Clark Kent rescues you, it is hard to see why imagining Superman would be the same thing as imagining Clark. A specific/unspecific ambiguity is also possible, as is well-attested by the wall label for Guercino's The Aldrovandi Dog (ca. 1625) in the Norton Simon Museum, which states ‘this must be the portrait of a specific dog’, thereby implicating that ‘Guercino drew a dog’ could be taken to mean that he drew a dog, but no particular dog — he just made one up. And we can clearly draw or imagine that which does not exist (as opposed to, say, photographing it).

However, whether or not a notional reading of a depiction VP is possible depends on which quantificational determiner occurs in the noun phrase complement. If we say ‘Guercino drew every dog’, ‘Guercino drew most dogs’, or ‘Guercino drew the dog’ (non-anaphoric ‘the dog’), we seem to advert to some antecedent domain with respect to which ‘drew every/most/the dog(s)’ are to be evaluated. So specific readings are required.[1] This resistance to unspecific construal is robust across languages and is typical of those quantificational determiners which do not occur naturally in existential contexts such as ‘there is’: contrast ‘there is a dog in the garden’ with ‘there is every dog in the garden’, ‘there are most dogs in the garden’, or ‘there is the dog in the garden’. An account of what is wrong with ‘there is every dog in garden’ (see Keenan 2003) might well contain the materials for explaining the lack of unspecific readings of depiction VP's with determiners like ‘every’, ‘most’ and ‘the’.

It should be emphasized that depiction verbs are special in this respect, for there is no problem getting unspecific readings with ‘every’, ‘most’ and ‘the’ using desire verbs or search verbs. Guercino might be looking for every dog on Aldrovandi's estate, though there are no particular dogs he is looking for; the reader might be driving around an unfamiliar airport rental car lot, looking for the exit, and in this case there is no exit such that it is being sought.

Mixed behavior is also manifested by evaluative verbs, for example ‘respect’, ‘admire’, ‘disdain’, ‘worship’, including emotion verbs such as ‘lust (after)’ and ‘fear’. Lex Luthor might fear Superman, but not Clark, and Lois might disdain Clark, but not Superman. However, unspecific readings of VP's with quantified complements are harder to hear, at least when the quantifier is existential. ‘Lois admires an extraterrestrial’ can be heard in two ways: there is the ‘admires a particular extraterrestrial’ reading, and there is a generic reading, which means that among the kinds of thing she admires are extraterrestrials. Generic readings of evaluative VP's attribute dispositions, and are not the same as unspecific or notional readings, since generic interpretations are common with extensional transitives: ‘British universities underpay their faculty’ (see Cohen 1999 for a good discussion of generics). There does not seem to be a sensible non-generic construal of ‘Lois admires an extraterrestrial, but no particular one’.

The verb ‘need’ is an interesting case. A sports team might need a better coach, though no specific better coach, and might need a better coach even if there are none to be had. So two out of three marks of intensionality are present. However, ‘need’ contrasts with ‘want’ as regards substitution: our dehydrated subject who does not want H2O because he believes it to be a kind of rat poison, nevertheless needs H2O. It seems that co-denoting terms may be interchanged in the complement of ‘need’. But merely accidentally co-extensive ones cannot be: Larson (2001, 232) gives the example of Max the theater impresario, who needs more singers but not more dancers, even though all who sing dance, and vice-versa. The property singer and the property dancer are different properties, so expressions for them cannot be exchanged in the complement of ‘need’. Similar restricted substitutivity is observed with transaction verbs such as ‘wager’, ‘owe’, ‘buy’, ‘sell’, ‘reserve’, and perhaps the transaction resultative ‘own’. One may reserve a car with a car rental company, though there is rarely a specific car one has reserved at the time of the transaction. But these verbs do allow interchange of co-referential expressions (a purchase of water-rights is a purchase of H2O-rights) though not (Zimmerman 1993, 151) of accidentally co-extensive ones. For ‘own’ see (Zimmerman 2002, passim).

Indeed, it is even arguable that some marks of intensionality are present with verbs that allow interchange of accidentally co-extensive expressions. A case in point is verbs of absence, such as ‘omit’ and ‘lack’. If it so happens that all and only the physicists on the faculty are the faculty's Nobel prize winners, then a faculty committee that lacks a physicist lacks a Nobel prize winner. However, not too much weight can be put on this case, since it may be that at some level, ‘lack’ should be analyzed (possibly in a complicated way) in terms of not having, in which case it would not really be an intensional verb at all; though so far as the author knows, no convincing analysis of this type has been formulated. See (Zimmerman 2002, 516–20) for further discussion of relationships among the marks of intensionality.

How many mechanisms for how many marks?

We have distinguished three “marks” or effects of intensionality: substitution-resistance, the availability of unspecific readings, and existence-neutrality. A natural question is whether one and the same semantic mechanism underlies all three effects, whether they are entirely independent, or whether two have a common source distinct from the third’s.

In the context of a discussion of propositional attitude verbs, that is, verbs which take clausal or clause-embedding noun-phrase complements rather than simple noun-phrase (NP) objects, one hypothesis which keeps explanatory apparatus to the minimum is that all three effects of intensionality arise from the possibility of the complement having narrow scope with respect to the attitude verb. Thus we might distinguish two readings of

(1) Lex Luthor fears that Superman is nearby,


(2a) Lex Luthor fears-true the proposition that Superman is nearby[2]


(2b) Superman is someone such that Lex Luthor fears(-true the proposition) that he is nearby.

In (2a) we make the clause ‘that Superman is nearby’ the complement of ‘proposition’ to guarantee that ‘Superman’ is within the scope of ‘fears’ (the resulting NP ‘the proposition…’ is a “scope island”). And in (2b) we use a form of words that encourages an interpreter to process ‘Superman’ ahead of ‘fears’. We can associate substitution-resistance with (2a), while allowing substitution in (2b). (2b) ascribes a complex property to Superman, and therefore also to Clark; namely, being an x such that Lex fears x to be nearby. (2a), on the other hand, puts Lex in the fearing-true attitude relation to a certain proposition, with essentially no implications about what other propositions he may fear-true. So, provided the proposition that Superman is nearby is distinct from the proposition that Clark Kent is nearby, substitution-failure in (1) construed as (2a) is explicable.

As for taking these two propositions to be distinct, there are many serviceable accounts, mostly involving some variation of the original proposal in modern philosophical semantics, found in (Frege 1892, 1970). According to Frege, every meaningful expression or phrase has both a customary reference that it denotes, and a customary sense that it expresses. In the case of clauses, the customary reference would be a truth-value which is compositionally derived from the denotations of the words of the clause, and the customary sense would be a way of thinking of that truth-value, compositionally derived from the senses of the words of the clause. Therefore, provided that ‘Superman’ and ‘Clark Kent’ have different though coreferential senses (i.e., provided they express different ways of thinking of the same individual) we will get different propositions.

However, on the face of it, this only has (1), intended in the (2a) manner, expressing a different proposition from

(2c) Lex Luthor fears that Clark is nearby.

Since truth-value is on the level of reference, and the corresponding words of (2a) and (2c) all have the same referents, the resulting truth-values for (2a) and (2c) will be the same; but they are supposed to be different. So Frege makes the ingenious suggestion that it is an effect of embedding in intensional contexts (he only considered clausal verbs) that expressions in such contexts no longer denote their customary references, but rather their customary senses. Then (1) intended as (2a) is true iff the reference of ‘Lex’ stands in the fearing-true relation to the switched reference of ‘Superman is nearby’, namely, its customary sense. Now we have our explanation of why merely interchanging customarily co-referential expressions in (1) can produce falsehood from a truth: the substitution does not preserve reference, since the names are now denoting their customary senses. However, if (1) is intended as (2b), there will be no truth-value switch, since there is no name-reference switch: in (2b) ‘Superman’ is not in the scope of ‘fears’, therefore it denotes its customary reference, and interchange with any other expression denoting that same referent must of necessity be truth-value preserving. (Readers in search of more detailed discussion of Frege's notion of sense might consult the section on Frege's philosophy of language in the entry on Frege. See also the entry on propositional attitude reports.)

A view like this has the capacity to explain the other intensionality effects. The specific-unspecific ambiguity in ‘Lex fears that an extraterrestrial is nearby’ is explained in terms of scope ambiguity, the notional or unspecific reading corresponding to

(3a) Lex Luthor fears-true the proposition that an extraterrestrial is nearby

and the relational or specific reading to

(3b) An extraterrestrial is such that Lex Luthor fears that it is nearby.

Existence-neutrality is also explained, for obviously the proposition that an extraterrestrial is nearby is available for its truth to be feared, believed, doubted or denied, whether or not there are extraterrestrials.

There are other accounts of substitution failure, but details are incidental at this point. For there are real issues about (A) whether a single mechanism could be responsible for all three effects, and (B) whether an account of any effect in terms of a scope mechanism is workable for transitive, as opposed to clausal, verbs.

(A) The behaviors cited in the previous section suggest that substitution-resistance and the availability of an unspecific reading have different explanations. For we saw that the verb ‘need’ contrasts with the verb ‘want’ as regards substitution-resistance, but is similar as regards the availability of unspecific readings of embedding VP’s. So it seems that there is a mechanism that blocks substitution, perhaps the Fregean reference-switch one, perhaps something else more compatible with what Davidson calls “semantic innocence” (Davidson 1969, 172). And this mechanism cannot occur with ‘needs’, but can with ‘wants’ (‘can’ rather than ‘does’ because it is optional; this is to allow for “transparent” or substitution-permitting readings of the likes of ‘Lex fears Superman’ analogous to (3b)). On the other hand, whatever accounts for notional readings is evidently available to both verbs, and therefore it is not the same mechanism as underlies the substitution-resistance of ‘wants’. However, this reasoning is not conclusive, since the substitution-resistance mechanism may be present with ‘needs’ (and transaction verbs) but somehow rendered ineffective (see Parsons 1997, 370).

Evaluative verbs present the converse challenge: substitution-resistance but apparently no unspecific readings of embedding VP’s, certainly not existential ones. It is less clear how a defender of a ‘single explanation’ theory would handle this, at least if the single explanation is a scope mechanism, since it appears from the other cases that occurrence within the scope of the intensional verb immediately produces an unspecific reading.

Suspension of existential commitment may group with availability of unspecific readings for explanatory purposes. There appear to be no cases of intensional transitives which allow notional readings of embedded VP’s, but where those VP's have the same existential consequences as ones which differ just by the substitution of an extensional for the intensional verb.

(B) The scope account is the only real contender for a single explanation of the intensionality effects. But there is a major question about whether it can be transferred at all from clausal to transitive verbs. For the intensionality effects would all be associated with narrow-scope occurrences of noun phrases (NP’s), and with a transitive verb such syntactic configuration is problematic when the NP is quantified. This is because, in standard first-order syntax, a quantifier must have a sentence within its scope (an open sentence with a free variable the NP binds, if redundant quantification is ruled out in the syntax). We can provide this for relational or wide-scope readings, for example

(4) An extraterrestrial is such that Lois is looking for it

in which ‘Lois is looking for it’ is the scope of ‘an extraterrestrial’. But if ‘an extraterrestrial’ is supposed to be within the scope of ‘looking for’ there is no clause to be its scope; it has to be an argument of the relation, which is not allowed in first-order language. As Kaplan says, ‘without an inner sentential context…distinctions of scope disappear’ (Kaplan 1986, 266). (However, readers who teach symbolic logic will be very familiar with the student who, having symbolized ‘Jack hit Bill’ as ‘Hjb’, then offers something like ‘Hj(∃x)’ as the symbolization of ‘Jack hit someone.’)

The description of the problem suggests two forms of solution. One is to preserve first-order syntax by uncovering hidden material to be the scope of a quantified NP even when the latter is within the scope of the intensional verb. The other is to drop first-order syntax in favor of a formalism which permits the meanings of quantified NP's to be arguments of intensional relations such as fearing and seeking. We consider these options in turn in the following two sections.


The idea of uncovering hidden material to provide NP's in notional readings of intensional VP's with sentential scope was prominently endorsed in (Quine 1956), where the proposal is to paraphrase search verbs with ‘endeavor to find’. So for (5a) we would have (5b):

(5a) Lois is looking for an extraterrestrial

(5b) Lois is endeavoring to find an extraterrestrial.

Partee (1974, 97) objects that this cannot be the whole story, since search verbs are not all synonyms (contrast ‘groping for’ and ‘rummaging about for’), but Parsons (1977, p. 381) and Larson (2001, p. 233) suggest that the search verb itself be used in place of ‘endeavor’. So we get

(6a) Lois is looking to find an extraterrestrial

or in somewhat non-Quinean lingo,

(6b) Lois is looking in order to make true the proposition that an extraterrestrial is such that she herself finds it.[3]

Here ‘an extraterrestrial’ is within the scope of ‘looking’ but has the open sentence ‘she herself finds it’ as its own scope.

It may or may not be meaning-preserving to replace (5a)'s prepositional phrase with (6a)'s purpose clause, but even if it is meaning-preserving, that is insufficient to show that (6a) or (6b) articulates the semantics of (5a); it may merely be a synonym. However, with ‘need’ and desire verbs, evidence for the presence of a hidden clause is quite strong. For example, in

(7) Physics needs some new computers soon

it makes little sense to construe ‘soon’ as modifying ‘needs’; it seems rather to modify a hidden ‘get’ or ‘have’, as is explicit in ‘Physics needs to get some new computers soon’, i.e., ‘Physics needs it to be the case that soon, for some new computers, it gets them’. (For ‘have’ versus ‘get’, see (Harley 2004).)

Secondly, there is the phenomenon of propositional anaphor (Larson et al., 1997), illustrated in

(8) Physics needs some new computers, but its budget won’t allow it.

What is not allowed is the truth of the proposition that Physics gets some new computers.

Third, attachment ambiguities suggest there is more than one verb present for modifiers to attach to (Den Dikken et al., 1996, 332):

(9) Physics will need some new computers next year

could mean that a need for new computers will arise in the department next year, but could also mean that next year is when Physics should get new computers, if its need (which may arise later this year) is to be met.

Finally, ellipsis generates similar ambiguities:

(10) Physics will need some new computers before Chemistry

could mean that the need will arise in Physics before it does in Chemistry, but could also mean that Physics will need to get some new computers before Chemistry gets any.

However, the strength of the case for a hidden ‘get’ with ‘need’ or ‘want’ contrasts with the case for propositionalism about search verbs. As observed by Partee (1974, 99) there are no attachment ambiguities like those in (9). For example,

(11) Physics will shop for some new computers next year

can only mean that the shopping will occur next year. There is no second reading, corresponding to the other reading of (9), in which ‘next year’ attaches to ‘find’. The phenomena in (8) and (10) also lack parallels with search verbs; for example, ‘Physics will shop for some new computers before Chemistry’ lacks a reading that has Physics shopping to find new computers before Chemistry finds any. And although the propositionalist might offer something like

(12) Physics is seeking more office space by noon

as an analog of (7), it is not easy to decide if ‘by noon’ gives the deadline by which any finding of more office space must occur, or rather the deadline by which the seeking must end.

Other groups of intensional transitives, such as depiction verbs and evaluative verbs, raise the problem that there is no evident propositional paraphrase in the first place. For psychological depiction verbs such as ‘fantasize’ and ‘imagine’, Parsons (1977, 376) proposes what he calls “Hamlet ellipsis”: for ‘Mary imagined a unicorn’ we would have the clausal ‘Mary imagined a unicorn to be’. Larson (2001, 233) suggests that the complement is a “small” or “verbless” clause, and for ‘Max visualizes a unicorn’ proposes ‘Max visualizes a unicorn in front of him’. This is too specific, for we can understand ‘Max visualizes a unicorn’ without knowing whether he visualizes it in front of him, above him or below him, but even if we change the paraphrase to ‘Max visualizes a unicorn spatially related to him’, this proposal, as well as Parsons’, have problems with negation: ‘Mary didn’t imagine a unicorn’ is not synonymous with either ‘Mary didn’t imagine a unicorn to be’ or with ‘Mary didn’t imagine a unicorn spatially related to her’, since the first of these allows for her to imagine a unicorn but not imagine it to be, the second, for her to imagine a unicorn but not as spatially related to her. There may be philosophical arguments that exclude these options,[4] but the very fact that a philosophical argument is needed makes the proposals unsatisfactory as semantics.

Clausal paraphrases for verbs like ‘fear’ are even less likely, since the extra material in the paraphrase can be read as the focus of the fear, making the paraphrase insufficient. For example, fearing x is not the same as fearing encountering x, since it may be the encounter that is feared, say if x is an unfearsome individual with a dangerous communicable disease. In the same vein, fearing x is not the same as fearing that x will hurt you; for instance, you may fear that your accident-prone dentist will hurt you, without fearing the dentist.

We conclude that if any single approach to intensional transitives is to cover all the ground, it will have to be non-propositionalist. But it is also conceivable that intensional transitives are not a unitary class, and that propositionalism is correct for some of these verbs but not for others.

Montague's semantics

The main non-propositionalist approaches to ITVs begin from the work of Richard Montague, especially his paper “The Proper Treatment of Quantification in Ordinary English” (Montague 1973), usually referred to as PTQ in the literature (Montague's condition (9) (1974, 264) defines ‘seek’ as ‘try to find’, but this is optional). Montague developed a systematic semantics of natural language based on higher-order intensional type-theory. We explain this term right-to-left.

Type theory embodies a specific model of semantic compositionality in terms of functional application. According to this model, if two expressions x and y can concatenate into a meaningful expression xy, then (i), the meaning of one of these expressions is taken to be a function, (ii) the meaning of the other is taken to be an item of the kind that the function in question is defined for, and (iii) the meaning of xy is the output of the function when applied to the input. The type-theoretic representation of this meaning is written x(y) or y(x), depending on which expression is taken to be the function and which the input or argument. A functional application such as x(y) is said to be well-typed iff the input that y denotes is the type of input for which the function x is defined.

For example, in the simple theory of types, a common noun such as ‘sweater’ is assigned a meaning of the following type: a function from individuals to truth-values (a function of type ib, for short; b for ‘boolean’). For ‘sweater’ the function in question is the one which maps all sweaters to the truth-value TRUE, and all other individuals to the truth-value FALSE. On the other hand, an (“intersective”) adjective such as ‘woollen’ would be assigned a meaning of the following type: a function from (functions from individuals to truth-values) to (functions from individuals to truth-values), or a function of type (ib)(ib) for short. Thus the meaning of ‘woollen’ can take the meaning of ‘sweater’ as input and produce the meaning of ‘woollen sweater’ as output. woollen(sweater) is of type ib, and is the specific function of this type that maps sweaters made of wool to TRUE, and all other individuals to FALSE.

In this framework, a quantified NP such as ‘every sweater’ has a meaning which can take the meaning of an intransitive verb (e.g., ‘unravelled’) as input and produce the meaning (truth-value) of a sentence (e.g. ‘every sweater unravelled’) as output. Intransitive verbs are like common nouns in being of type ib. For example, unravelled is of type ib, mapping all and only individuals that unravelled to TRUE. So a quantified NP is a function from inputs of type ib to outputs of type b, and is thus of type (ib)b. ‘Every sweater unravelled’ would be represented as (every(sweater))(unravelled), and would denote the truth-value that is the result of applying a meaning of type (ib)b, that of every(sweater), to a meaning of type ib, that of unravelled. Rules specific to every guarantee that every(sweater) maps unravelled to TRUE iff unravelled maps to TRUE everything that sweater maps to TRUE.

So far, the apparatus is extensional, which, besides providing only two possible sentence-meanings, TRUE and FALSE, imposes severe limitations on the range of concepts we can express. Suppose that the Scottish clothing company Pringle has a monopoly on the manufacture of woollen sweaters, and makes no other kind of sweater. Then a garment is a woollen sweater iff it is a Pringle sweater, meaning that woollen(sweater) and pringle(sweater) are the same function of type ib, and these two terms for that function are everywhere interchangeable in the type-theoretic language. Then modal operators such as ‘it is contingent that’ cannot be in the language, since interchanging woollen(sweater) and pringle(sweater) within their scope should sometimes lead to change of truth-value, but cannot if the two expressions receive the same meaning in the semantics. For example, ‘it is contingent that every Pringle sweater is woollen’ is true, but ‘it is contingent that every woollen sweater is woollen’ is false. Therefore the concept of contingency has no adequate representation in the type-theoretic (boldface) language.

Shifting to intensional type theory deals with this difficulty. The intension of any expression X is a function from possible worlds to an extension of the type which that expression has in the extensional theory just sketched, if it has such an extension, otherwise to something appropriate for intensional vocabulary such as ‘it is contingent that’. An intension which is a function from possible worlds to items of type t is said to be of type st. sweater, for instance, will have as its intension a function from possible worlds to functions of type ib, providing for each possible world a function that specifies the individuals which are sweaters at that world; so sweater's intension is of type s(ib). However, a modal sentential operator such as ‘it is contingent that’ will have as its intension a function that, for each possible world, produces one and the same function, which takes as input functions of type sb and produces truth-values as output. So the extension of ‘it is contingent that’ at each world is the same function, of type (sb)b. (The operator is said to be intensional because its extension at each world is a function taking intensions, such as functions of type sb, as input.)

A function of type sb is sometimes called a possible-worlds proposition, since it traces the truth-value of a sentence at each world. For example, with appropriate assignments to the constituents,

(13) (every(woollen(sweater)))(woollen)

should be true, that is, refer to TRUE, at every world. So the intension of (13) is that function f of type sb such that for every world w, f(w) = TRUE. This is a constant intension. On the other hand,

(14) (every(pringle(sweater)))(woollen)

is true at some worlds but false at those where Pringle makes non-woollen sweaters, so its intension is non-constant.

We define the intension of contingent to be the function which, for each world w as input, produces as output the function c of type (sb)b such that for any function p of type sb, c(p) is true at w iff there are worlds u and v such that p(u) = TRUE and p(v) = FALSE (this is the meaning of ‘contingent that’ in the sense ‘contingent whether’). So the intension of ‘contingent’ is also constant, since the same function c is the output at every world.

Since contingent expects an input of type sb, we cannot write

(15) contingent((every(woollen(sweater)))(woollen))

since in evaluating this formula at a world w we would find ourselves trying to apply the reference of contingent at w, namely, the function c just defined, to the reference of (every(woollen(sweater)))(woollen) at w, namely, the truth-value TRUE. But c requires an input of type sb, not b. So we introduce a new operator, written ^, such that if X is an expression and t is the type of X's reference at each w, then at each w, the reference of ^X is of type st. ^X may be read as ‘the intension of X’, since the rule for ^ is that at each world, ^X refers to that function which for each world w, outputs the reference of X at w.

If we now evaluate

(16) contingent^((every(woollen(sweater)))(woollen))

at a world w, the result will be FALSE. This is because the function p of type sb that is the reference of ^((every(woollen(sweater)))(woollen)) at every world, maps every world to TRUE. So there is no v such that p(v) = FALSE. But there is such a v for ^((every(pringle(sweater)))(woollen)), and so

(17) contingent^((every(pringle(sweater)))(woollen))

is TRUE at w. Note that choice of w doesn’t matter, since the intension of contingent produces the same function c at every world, and the reference of, e.g., ^((every(pringle(sweater)))(woollen)), is the same function of type sb at every world.

Finally, our type-theory, intensional or extensional, is higher-order, because the semantics makes available higher-order domains of quantification and reference. sweater refers to a property of individuals, a first-order property. (every(sweater)) refers to a property of properties of individuals, a second-order property. For just as sweater(my favorite garment) attributes the property of being a sweater to a certain individual, so we can think of (every(sweater))(woollen) as attributing a property to the property of being woollen. Which property is attributed to being woollen? The rules governing every ensure that (every(F)) is truly predicated of G iff G is a property of every F. In that case, G has the property of being a property of every F. So (every(F)) stands for the property of being a property of every F.

Treating quantified NP's as terms for properties of properties means they can occur as arguments to any expression defined for properties of properties. We can even rescue the uncomprehending student's attempt at ‘Jack hit someone’, for provided ‘hit’ is of the right type — which is easily arranged — we can have (hit(someone))(jack). Here hit accepts the property of being a property of at least one person, and produces the first-order property of hitting someone, which is then attributed to Jack. In extensional type-theory, hit has the type ((ib)b)(ib) if (hit(someone))(jack) is well-typed and jack is of type i.[5]

The significance of this for the semantics of intensional transitives is that we now have a way of representing a reading of, say,

(18) Jack wants a woollen sweater

in which the quantified NP is within the semantic scope of the verb without having scope over a hidden subsentence with a free variable for the NP to bind: the quantified NP ‘a woollen sweater’ can just be the argument to the verb. To allow for the intensionality of the transitive verb, Montague adopts the rule that if x and y can concatenate into a meaningful expression xy, the reference of the functional expression is a function which operates on the intension of the argument expression. Suppressing some irrelevant detail, this means that if ‘wants’ syntactically combines with ‘a woollen sweater’ to produce the VP ‘wants a woollen sweater’, then in its semantics, want applies to the intension of (a(woollen (sweater))), resulting in the following semantics for (18):

(19) want(^(a(woollen(sweater))))(jack).[6]

In (19), a(woollen((sweater)) is within the scope of want. So if we take (19) to represent the notional reading of (18), the idea that notional readings are readings in which the quantified NP has narrow scope with respect to the intensional verb is sustained.

Revisions and refinements

How does Montague's account of intensional transitives fare vis à vis the three marks of intensionality? The existence-neutrality of existential NP's is clearly supported by (19), for there is nothing to prevent the application at a world w of want to ^(a(woollen(sweater))) from producing a function mapping Jack to TRUE even if, at the same w, (woollen(sweater)) maps every individual to FALSE.

Substitution-failure is supported for contingently coextensive expressions. For instance, (19) does not entail want(^(a(pringle(sweater))))(jack) even if there are worlds where all and only woollen sweaters are Pringle sweaters, so long as there are other worlds where this is not so. Let u be a world of the latter sort. Then a(pringle(sweater)) at u and a(woollen(sweater)) at u are different functions of type (ib)b, making ^(a(pringle(sweater))) and ^(a(woollen(sweater))) different at every world. Therefore want(^(a(pringle(sweater)))) may map Jack to FALSE at worlds where want(^(a(woollen(sweater)))) maps Jack to TRUE: since want is applied to different inputs here, the outputs may also be different.

But this result depends on the fact that (pringle(sweater)) and (woollen(sweater)) are merely contingently coextensive. If ‘water’ and ‘H2O’ are necessarily co-extensive, then wanting a glass of water and wanting a glass of H2O will be indistinguishable in higher-order intensional type theory. This failure to make a distinction, however, traces to the intensionality of the semantics — to its being (merely) a possible-worlds semantics — not to its being higher-order or type-theoretic. So possible solutions include (i) augmenting higher-order intensional type theory with extra apparatus, or (ii) employing a different kind of higher-order type theory. In both cases the aim is to mark distinctions like that between wanting a glass of water and wanting a glass of H2O.

A solution of the first kind, following (Carnap 1947), is proposed in (Lewis 1972:182–6); the idea is that the meaning of a complex expression is not its intension, but rather a tree that exhibits the expression's syntactic construction bottom-up, with each node in the tree decorated by an appropriate syntactic category label and semantic intension. But as Lewis says (p. 182), for non-compound lexical constituents, sameness of intension implies sameness of meaning. So although his approach will handle the water/H2O problem if we assume the term ‘H2O’ has structure that the term ‘water’ lacks, it will not without such an assumption. For the same reason, it cannot explain substitution-failure involving unstructured proper names, on the usual view (deriving from Kripke 1972) that identity of extension (at any world) for such names implies identity of intension. So we have no account of why admiring Cicero is different from admiring Tully.

A solution of the second kind, employing a different kind of higher-order type theory, is pursued in (Thomason 1980). In Thomason's “intentional” logic, propositions are taken as a primitive category, instead of being analyzed as intensions of type sb. In turns out that a somewhat familiar higher-order type theory can be built on this basis, in which, roughly, the type of propositions plays a role analogous to the type of truth-values in extensional type theory. A property such as orator, for example, is a function of type ip (as opposed to ib), where p is the type of propositions: given an individual as input, orator will produce the proposition that that individual is an orator as output. Proper names, however, are not translated as terms of type i, for then cicero and tully would present the same input to orator, resulting in the same proposition as output: orator(cicero) = orator(tully). So there would be no believing Cicero is an orator without believing Tully is an orator. Instead, Thomason assigns proper names the type (ip)p, functions from properties to propositions. And merely the fact that Cicero and Tully are the same individual does not require us to say that cicero and tully must produce the same propositional output given the same property input. Instead, we can have cicero(orator) and tully(orator) distinct.

Applying this to intensional transitives is just a matter of assigning appropriate types so that the translations of, say, ‘Lucia seeks Cicero’ and ‘Lucia seeks Tully’ are different propositions (potentially with different truth-values). We need to keep the verb as function, and we already have the types of cicero and tully set to (ip)p. The translations of ‘seeks Cicero’ and ‘seeks Tully’ should be functions capable of accepting inputs of type (ip)p, such as lucia, and producing propositions as output. seeks therefore accepts input of type (ip)p and produces output that accepts input of type (ip)p and produces output of type p. Thus seeks is of type ((ip)p)(((ip)p)p), and we get substitution-failure because seeks(cicero) and seeks(tully) can be different functions of type ((ip)p)p so long as cicero and tully are different functions of type (ip)p (as we already said they should be). seeks(cicero) can therefore map lucia to one proposition while seeks(tully) maps it (not ‘her’) to another; and these propositions can have different truth-values.[7]

Finally, there is the question whether (19) shows that Montague's semantics supports notional readings. One problem is that Montague's semantics for extensional verbs such as ‘get’ is exactly the same as for intensional verbs, and it takes an extra stipulation, or meaning-postulate, for ‘get’, to guarantee that the extension of get(^(a(woollen(sweater)))) at w maps Jack to TRUE only if the extension of (woollen(sweater)) at w maps some individual to TRUE (you can want a golden fleece even if there aren't any, but you can't get one in these circumstances). So apparently (19)'s pattern embodies something in common to the notional meaning of ‘want a woollen sweater’ and the meaning of ‘gets a woollen sweater’, something which is neutral on the existence of woollen sweaters. This is unintuitive, but is perhaps not a serious problem, since it can be avoided by a different treatment of extensional transitives.

A more pressing question is what justification we have for thinking that (19) captures the notional, ‘no particular one’, reading of (18).[8] On the face of it, (19) imputes to Jack the wanting attitude towards the property of being a property of a woollen sweater. This is the same attitude as Jack may stand in to a particular woollen sweater, say that one. But it is not at all clear that we have any grasp of what a single attitude with such diverse objects could be, and the difficulty seems to lie mainly with the proposed semantics for notional readings. What does it mean to have the attitude of desire towards the property of being a property of a woollen sweater?

Two ways of dealing with this suggest themselves. First, we might supplement the formal semantics with an elucidation of what it is to stand in a common-or-garden attitude to a property of properties. Second, we might revise the analysis to eliminate this counterintuitive aspect of it, but without importing the propositionalist's hidden sentential contexts.

Both (Moltmann 1997) and (Richard 2001) can be read as providing, within Montague's general approach, an account of what it is to stand in an attitude relation to a property of properties. Both accounts are modal, having to do with the nature of possible situations in which the attitude is in some sense “matched” by the situation: an attitude-state of need or expectation is matched if the need or expectation is met, an attitude-state of desire is matched if the desire is satisfied, an attitude-event of seeking is met if the search concludes successfully, and so on. According to Moltmann's account (1997, 22–3) one stands in the attitude relation of seeking to ^(a(woollen(sweater))) iff, in every minimal situation σ in which that search concludes successfully, you find a woollen sweater in σ. Richard (2001, p. 116) offers a more complex analysis that is designed to handle negative quantified NP's as well (‘no woollen sweater’, ‘few woollen sweaters’, etc.). On this account, a search π demands ^(a(P)) iff for every relevant success-story m = <w, s> for π, things in s with a property entailing P are in the extension of ^(a(P)) at w. Here s is the set of things that are found when the search concludes successfully in w.

By contrast, (Zimmerman 1993) and (Forbes 2000) propose revisions in (19) itself and its ilk. Zimmerman (161–2) replaces the quantifier intension with a property intension, since he holds that (i) unspecific readings are restricted to “broadly” existential quantified NP’s, and (ii) the property corresponding to the nominal in the existential NP (e.g., ‘woollen sweater’) can do duty for the NP itself. Of course, the proposed restriction of unspecific readings to existentials is controversial (cf. our earlier example, ‘Guercino is looking for every dog on Aldrovandi's estate’). It may also be wondered whether there is any less of a need to explain what it is to stand in the seeking relation to a property of objects than to a property of properties.

According to (Forbes 2000) the need for such an explanation already threatens the univocality of a verb such as ‘look for’ as it occurs in ‘look for that woollen sweater’ and ‘look for some woollen sweater’. Observing that search verbs are action verbs, Forbes applies Davidson's event semantics to them (Davidson 1967). In this semantics, as developed in (Parsons 1990), search verbs become predicates of events, and in relational (specific) readings, the object searched for is said to be in a thematic relation to the event, one denoted by ‘for’; thus ‘for some search e, e is for that woollen sweater’. But in unspecific readings, no thematic relation is invoked; rather, the quantified NP is used to characterize the search. So we would have ‘for some search e, e is characterized by ^(a(woollen(sweater)))’, i.e., e is an a-woollen-sweater search (Forbes 2000, 174–6).

There is therefore a range of different non-propositionalist approaches to intensional transitives. As we already remarked, one possibility is that propositionalism is correct for some verbs and non-propositionalism correct for others. However, there is also the option that non-propositionalism is correct for all. A non-propositionalist who makes this claim will have to explain the phenomena illustrated in (7)–(10), without introducing degrees of freedom that make it unintelligible that these phenomena do not arise for all intensional transitives.

The logic of intensional transitives

There may be no such topic as the logic of propositional attitudes: it may be doubted whether ‘Mary wants to meet a man who has read Proust and a man who has read Gide’ logically entails ‘Mary wants to meet a man who has read Proust’. Even if standing in the wanting-to-be-true attitude to I meet a man who has read Proust and a man who has read Gide somehow necessitates standing in the wanting-to-be-true attitude to I meet a man who has read Proust, the necessitation appears to be more psychological than logical. On the other hand, what we might call ‘objectual attitudes’, the non-propositional attitudes ascribed by intensional transitives, seem to have a logic (for a compendium of examples, see Richard 2000, 105–7): ‘Mary seeks a man who has read Proust and a man who has read Gide’ does seem to entail ‘Mary seeks a man who has read Proust’.

Yet, as Richard notes (Richard 2001, 107–8), the inferential behavior of quantified complements of intensional transitives is still very different from the extensional case. For example (his ‘Literary Example’), even if it is true that Mary seeks a man who has read Proust and a man who has read Gide, it may be false both that she seeks at most one man and that she seeks at least two men; for she may be indifferent between finding a man who has read both, versus finding two men, one a reader of Proust but not Gide, the other of Gide but not Proust. Contrast ‘saw’, ‘photographed’, or ‘met’: if she met a man who has read Proust and a man who has read Gide, it cannot be false both that she met at most at one man and also false that she met at least two men. As Richard insists, it is a constraint on any semantics of intensional transitives that they get this type of case right.

By contrast, in other cases, even very simple ones, it is controversial exactly what inferences intensional transitives in unspecific readings support. If Mary seeks a man who has read Proust, does it follow that she seeks a man who can read? After all, it is unlikely that a comic-book reader will satisfy her tastes in men.[9] If Perseus seeks a mortal gorgon, does it follow that he seeks a gorgon?[10] After all, if he finds an immortal gorgon, he is in trouble. Zimmerman (1993, 173) takes it to be a refutation of any account of notional readings if it does not validate these deletion or “weakening” inferences. But there are characterizations of unspecific readings on which these inferences are in fact invalid, for instance, a characterization in terms of indifference towards which object of the relevant kind is found (Lewis uses such an ‘any one would do’ characterization in Lewis 1972, p. 199). For even if it is true that Mary seeks a man who has read Proust, and any male Proust-reader would do, it does not follow that Mary seeks a man who can read, and any man who can read would do. For not every man who can read has read Proust.

Is there anything intrinsic to the indifference characterization of unspecificity (‘any one would do’) that we can object to while leaving the status of weakening inferences open? One objection is that the characterization does not work for every verb or quantifier: ‘Guercino painted a dog, any dog would do’ makes little sense, and ‘the police are looking for everyone who was in the room, any people who were in the room would do’ is not much better. More importantly, the characterization seems to put warranted assertibility out of reach, since the grounds which we normally take to justify ascribing an existentially quantified objectual attitude will rarely give reason to think that the agent has absolutely no further preferences going beyond the characterization of the object-kind given in the ascription.

Still, this is not to validate weakening inferences; for that we would need to show that the more usual gloss of the unspecific reading, using a ‘but no particular one’ rider, supports the inferences as strongly as the indifference characterization refutes them. And it is unclear how such an argument would proceed (see further Forbes 2003, 57–9). In addition, making a good case that the inferences are intuitively valid is one thing, getting the semantics to validate them is another. Both the propositionalist and the Montagovian need to add extra principles, since there is nothing in their bare semantics to compel these inferences. For even if Jack stands in the wanting relation to ^(a(woollen(sweater))), that by itself is silent on whether he also stands in the wanting relation to ^(a(sweater)). The accounts of Moltmann and Richard both decide the matter positively, however (e.g., if in every minimal situation in which Jack's desire is satisfied, he gets a woollen sweater, then in every such situation, he gets a sweater; so he wants a sweater).

Another interesting logical problem concerns the “conjunctive force” of disjoined quantified NP's in objectual ascriptions. There is a large literature on the conjunctive force of disjunction in many other contexts (e.g., Kamp 1973, Loewer 1976, Makinson 1984, Jennings 1994, Zimmerman 2000), for instance as exhibited in ‘x is larger than y or z’ and ‘John can speak French or Italian’, in which ‘can’ means ‘is allowed to’, or else ‘whichever you wish’ is understood. In these cases the conjunctive force is easily captured by simple distribution: ‘x is larger than y and larger than z’, ‘John can speak French and can speak Italian’.[11] However, with intensional transitives we find the same conjunctive force, but no distributive articulation. If we say that Jack needs a woollen sweater or a fleece jacket, we say something to the effect that (i) his getting a woollen sweater is one way his need could be met, and (ii) his getting a fleece jacket is another way his need could be met. But ‘Jack needs a woollen sweater or a fleece jacket’ does not mean that Jack needs a woollen sweater and needs a fleece jacket. This last conjunction ascribes two needs, only one of which is met by getting a satisfactory woollen sweater. But the latter acquisition by itself meets the disjunctive need for a woollen sweater or a fleece jacket. So there is a challenge to explain the semantics of the disjunctive ascription, while at the same time remaining within a framework that can accommodate all cases of conjunctive force — comparatives, various senses of ‘can’, counterfactuals with disjunctive antecedents (‘if Jack were to put on a woollen sweater or a fleece jacket he'd be warmer’) and so on; see further (Forbes 2003, 59–64).

A penultimate type of inference we will mention is one in which intensional and extensional verbs both occur, and the inference seems valid even when the intensional VP's are construed unspecifically. An example:

(20a) Jack wants a woollen sweater

(20b) Whatever Jack wants, he gets

(20c) Therefore, Jack will get a woollen sweater

Obviously, (20a,b) entail (20c) when (20a) is understood specifically. But informants judge that the inference is also valid when (20a) is understood unspecifically, with ‘but no particular one’ explicitly appended. If we seek a validation of the inference that hews to surface form, Montague's uniform treatment of intensional and extensional verbs has its appeal: (20b) will say that for whatever property of properties P Jack stands in the wanting relation to, he stands in the getting relation to. So the inference is portrayed as the simple modus ponens it seems to be. It would then be the task of other meaning-postulates to carry us from his standing in the getting relation to ^(a(woollen(sweater))) to there being a woollen sweater such that he gets it.

The final example to be considered here involves fictional names in the scope of intensional transitives. An example (Zalta 1988, 128) of the puzzles these can lead to is:
(21a) The ancient Greeks worshipped Zeus.

(21b) Zeus is a mythical character.

(21c) Mythical characters do not exist.

(21d) Therefore, the ancient Greeks worshipped something that does (did) not exist.

Or even:

(21e) Therefore, there is something that doesn't exist such that the ancient Greeks worshipped it.

One thing the example shows is that specific/unspecific is not to be confused with real/fictional. (21a) is a true specific ascription, just as ‘the ancient Greeks worshipped Ahura Mazda’ is a false one. (21b) is also true. So the ancient Greeks, who would not have knowingly worshipped a mythical character, were making a rather large mistake, if one of a familiar sort.

(21c) is also true, if we are careful about what ‘do not exist’ means in this context. It is contingent that Zeus-myths were ever formulated, and one sense in which we might mean (21c) turns on the assumption that fictional and mythical characters exist iff fictions and myths about them do. In this sense, (21c) is false, though an actual fictional character such as Zeus would not have existed if there had been no Zeus-myths. This also explains why (21a) and (21b) can both be true: ‘Zeus’ refers to the mythical character, a contingently existing abstract object.

However, by far the more likely reading of (21c) is one on which it means that mythical characters are not real. Zeus is not flesh and blood, not even immaterial flesh and blood. With this in mind, (21d) and (21e) are both true. The quantifier ‘something’ ranges over a domain that includes both real and fictional or mythical entities, and there is something in that domain, the mythical character, which was worshipped by the ancient Greeks and which is not in the subdomain of real items.

This gets the right truth-values for the statements in (21), but might be thought to run into trouble with the likes of ‘Zeus lives on Mt. Olympus’: if ‘Zeus’ refers to an abstract object, how can Zeus live anywhere? One way of dealing with this kind of case is to suppose, evidently plausibly, that someone who says this and knows the facts means

(22) According to the myth, Zeus lives on Mt. Olympus.

On the other hand, if an ancient Greek believer says ‘Zeus lives on Mt. Olympus’, he or she says something false, there being no reason to posit a covert ‘according to the myth’ in this case.

However, even the covert operator theory might be contested, on the grounds that we are still predicating ‘lived on Mt. Olympus’ of an abstract object. Simply prefixing ‘according to the myth’ to the unintelligible cannot render it intelligible. But there is the evident fact that (22) is both intelligible and true. So either prefixing ‘according to the myth’ can render the unintelligible intelligible, or what is going on in the embedded sentence is not to be construed as standard predication. For further discussion of these matters, see, for example, van Inwagen 1977, Parsons 1980, Zalta 1988, Thomasson 1998, and Salmon 2002.


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