Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Antoine Le Grand

First published Fri Sep 14, 2001; substantive revision Fri Jun 9, 2006

Antoine Le Grand (1629-1699) was a philosopher and catholic theologian who played an important role in propagating the Cartesian philosophy in England during the latter half of the seventeenth century. He was born in Douai, (at the time under rule by the Spanish Hapsburgs), and early in life was associated with an English community of Franciscans who had a college there. Le Grand became a Franciscan Recollect friar prior to leaving for England as a missionary in 1656. In England, he taught philosophy and theology, advocating Catholicism and eventually Cartesianism, the latter being as unpopular as the former was perilous. It is not clear how Le Grand came to Cartesianism, but the first evidence of his adoption of the new philosophy was in his Institutio Philosophiae, published in London in 1672. His early works show affinities to the philosophies of Seneca and Epicurus. He is noted for his polemical exchanges with Samuel Parker and John Sergeant, and for having given Descartes's work a Scholastic form so that it would be accepted in the schools.

1. Life and Writings

Le Grand lived in London for many years before retiring to Oxfordshire towards the close of his life in 1695. He was generally well-received at the University of Cambridge, perhaps owing to the influence of some leading Neo-Platonists at Cambridge such as John Smith, Henry More, and Ralph Cudworth, who were at least initially sympathetic to Descartes's ideas. John Smith, author of Select Discourses (1660), and the earliest recorded partisan of the Cartesian philosophy in England, was the first to introduce the study of Descartes to Cambridge. Henry More corresponded with Descartes, and was sympathetic until about 1665, when he launched the most vigorous attack on Cartesianism in the age, in his Enchiridion Metaphysicum (1671). Cudworth, like More although with less venom, objected to Descartes's mechanistic account of the material world in his The True Intellectual System of the Universe (1678). It was Le Grand who debated and defended Descartes's philosophy to these English critics.

It is likely that Le Grand's edition of Jacobi Rohaulti tractatus physicus (1682) was the first of his Cartesian works accepted at Cambridge. This was a new edition, which included Le Grand's commentary, of Bonnet's 1672 Latin translation of Rohault's immensely popular tract of the Cartesian physics, Traité de physique (1671). In 1692, Samuel Clarke published his own Latin version of the text, which incorporates his and Le Grand's commentary in the form of footnotes. Clarke, though an adherent of Newton's physics, thought he could best propagate the new doctrine by publishing Rohault's text with suggestive notes directed at the necessity of modifying Cartesian theory. According to the biographical preface to Clarke's Works, at the time of his entrance to Cambridge in 1691, Rohault's Traité was the standard modern scientific text, and Newton's Principia (1687), had not yet been accepted: "The philosophy of Des Cartes was then the Established philosophy of that university, and the system of nature hardly allowed to be explained any otherwise than his principles … . The Great Sir Isaac Newton had indeed then published his Principia. But this book was but for the few." Eventually Clarke's translation of the Traité, which underwent four editions, became the new preferred Cambridge textbook, as the Cartesian physics gave way to that of Newton early in the eighteenth century.

At Oxford, Le Grand received a hostile reception. Samuel Parker aligned Hobbes's mechanism with that of Descartes, charging both with atheism. Parker's condemnations led to the banning of Descartes's philosophy at Oxford, quashing its public entrance at the University. Le Grand responded to Parker's charges of atheism in his Apologia de Descartes (1679), challenging Parker's criticisms with various proofs of God's existence. Another long-time, Oxford critic of Le Grand was the English secular priest and Aristotelian, John Sergeant. Sergeant, best known for his criticisms of Locke's philosophy, was also highly critical of the Cartesian philosophy. Le Grand responded to Sergeant's criticisms of the Cartesian criterion of truth in his Dissertatio de ratione cognoscendi … in 1679. A second major controversy occurred between the two authors late in Le Grand's life, this time over the nature of ideas. This dispute led Le Grand to write a series of short pieces, published later as Several Smaller Pieces Against M. J. Sergeant (1698). In response, Sergeant attacked the Cartesian idea of extension, to which the aging Le Grand never publicly responded. Le Grand died at the home of a wealthy farmer in Oxfordshire, where he had served as a tutor until his death in 1699.

Antoine Le Grand's most substantial work, An Entire Body of Philosophy According to the Principles Of the Famous Renate des Cartes (1694), is a Cartesian tract from beginning to end. It is based on a Latin text that underwent four editions before being translated into English by Richard Blome, and it includes corrections, alterations and additions by Le Grand himself. This work, as the title reveals, consists of three books. The first book, The Institution, is intended as a treatment of the general nature of things according to Descartes's principles; book two, The History of Nature, illustrates, by means of a great variety of reported experiments and examples, the operation of these first principles in nature. In this book, Le Grand applied the general Cartesian principles to his study of particular bodies and their qualities, showing how such principles can explain all natural phenomena. His extensive discussion includes bodies as various as the loadstone, plants, and insects. And finally, in his third book, A Dissertation of the Want of Sense and Knowledge in Brute Animals, he argued against the supposed link of life and sense from Plato onwards, and after offering a brief survey of various hypotheses on the nature of soul by Aristotle, Gassendi, Fabri, and Descartes, he adopted Descartes's view. In the Preface, Le Grand wrote that, " … this whole work contains nothing else, but his [Descartes's] opinions, or what may clearly and distinctly be deduced from them."

2. Metaphysics

Le Grand defended the first principles of Descartes's philosophy with great fidelity. He held to Descartes's views that the essence of matter is extension; that the essence of mind is thought; that material substance and mental substance are essentially, and really distinct; that mind and body interact; that while humans have souls, brutes and other living things are mere machines; and that material things operate by means of moving parts according to the laws of motion. Le Grand did not make any substantial revisions to Cartesian metaphysics. However, he did make two important contributions: first, he attempted to clarify Descartes's account of motion which had direct consequences for the Cartesian account of matter, causation, and mind-body interaction; secondly, he extended the scope of Cartesian physics, treating such subjects as metals, plants, insects, animals, and the human body in detail.

Le Grand's contribution to the Cartesian account of motion may either be seen as an extension or a revision of Descartes's, sometimes ambiguous, treatment. Le Grand took seriously the claims that God is the total and efficient cause of motion in the universe, and that matter is entirely passive, and hence bodies are incapable of self-movement, or of moving other bodies. In his Entire Body of Philosophy, he argued that since a body may be in motion or at rest, motion must be a mode non-essential to matter. Moreover, given that matter itself is inert, it cannot be the source of the order and direction of motion. To provide order and direction, God laid down the laws of motion. Thus, motion itself as well as the orderly movement of bodies derives from God who acts as the effective principle. While the specific position, constitution, and configuration of the parts of a particular body determine how certain local motions are transferred, the source and ultimate direction of the motion itself is God. What this means for body-body interaction is that bodies function as secondary causes, directing local motions in virtue of the specific configurations of their parts. Bodies do not possess any causal power to produce or cease movement.

Le Grand's account of body-body interaction clears the way to explain mind-body interaction. In the same way as finite bodies, God functions as the effective principle of finite minds, providing the ultimate source of change: " … there is nothing, besides motion, which can strike the organs of the senses, or affect the mind itself." (1694, p. 284) Although mind and matter are substances sharing no common properties, it is in virtue of God acting as the effective principle that mind and body interact. This kind of interaction is no more or no less problematic than the interaction of two physical bodies. There was no real problem of interaction for Le Grand, since he believed that it was not the substances per se that acted on one another but in all cases God alone provided the motive force in the universe. Although things by their nature respond to this motive force in an orderly way, i.e., according to the laws of nature, the fact that they exist as they do and that they interact is a fact completely dependent on God's will. God's power is expressed as local motions in bodies and as passions/thoughts in minds. In short, it is in virtue of God, their effective principle, that a mind and body, or a body and body, or even a mind and mind, are said to interact.

Le Grand described the mind-body union in terms directly borrowed from Descartes. However, Le Grand attempted to explicate further than did Descartes the nature of the mind-body union. According to Le Grand, there are three kinds of union, each possessing its own principle which effects that union: the first is that of two minds whose principle of union is love; the second is that of two physical bodies whose principle of union is local presence; and the third is that of the mind and body whose principle of union is actual dependence. Just as two physical bodies are joined by physical contact, and as two minds are joined by love, the mind and body are joined by a mutually dependent activity. So long as the body actually receives  its specific motions dependently on the soul, and the soul actually receives its local motions (passions) dependently on the body, the spirit and the body are joined. Although there can be no mode common to mind and matter, there is this mutual action. While there is no mode shared by two different substances, there is a similitude and relation that exists between mind and body: "This similitude and relation we have formerly affirmed to consist in action and passion." (1694, p. 325) In other words, just as the body is capable of receiving and transmitting local motions since motion is a mode of matter, the mind is capable of varying passions since passions are a mode of the mind. It is by the mutual commerce of such motions and passions that the mind and body are said to be united. The mutual activity said to occur between the mind and the body is a property which follows only from the union of mind and body and cannot proceed from either alone, "And the truth is, since neither body can think, nor mind be capable of dimension, there can be no mode common to mind and body, except a mutual acting of each upon each, from which alone the properties of both can follow." (1694, p. 325)

Le Grand's extensions to Descartes's physics included phenomena now classified as metallurgy, entomology, botany, biology, physiology, medicine, and psychiatry. Part II of the Entire Body of Philosophy, entitled The History of Nature, catalogues and critically discusses the latest experiments of his time, as well as the theories of the ancients and moderns. Prominent in his discussions is the importance of secondary causes in nature (both exemplary and secondary efficient causes), and the need for experiments, not just as tools of confirmation, but also as a means of discovering the true nature of things. This was due to his application of mechanism to explain not only the behavior of material bodies but also the entire institution of nature. Le Grand believed that God laid down the laws of nature and the principles of being by acting as the primary efficient cause, and that the operation of these laws and principles manifested themselves in nature in the form of secondary causes and effects. Although the laws and their specific mechanisms of operation are not visible, secondary causes and their effects are. These causes and effects then are known by experience and are the starting point of all science, which is characterized by reasoning from effects (observed in nature) to causes (first principles discerned by reason).

3. Epistemology

Le Grand's account of sensations and ideas is orthodox Cartesianism. Sensory impressions are what mediate the external object and our mind's idea of it, and they consist in nothing more than the immediate motions of the sensory organs in the body. Such motions are produced by a natural necessity and they share no similarity or affinity with the particular objects that cause them. Like Descartes, Le Grand used the example of the sword wounding the body to illustrate the non-resemblance or dissimilitude of the relations between external objects and sensations, and sensations and ideas. (1694, p. 327)  The sword that produces pain in us is nothing like our sensation or idea of pain, nor is our idea of pain anything like our sensation of pain. Yet, we maintain that there is a causal and representational relation between the sword and the idea it produces. In addition, Legrand like Descartes made a clear distinction between sensory impressions, which are particular, quantifiable motions, and ideas, which are representational or propositional in character. Given that sensations are non-resembling and non-representational (they are mere patterns of local motions) it follows that ideas, which are essentially representational, could not be derived from them.

From the lack of any form of similitude or affinity between object/sensation, and sensation/idea, it follows that there is no such relation which holds between an idea and an external (material) object. From this lack of similitude, Le Grand concluded that adventitious ideas (coming from material objects outside us) must be innate or inbred in the mind. For, if the external object is not like the idea we form of it, then the only explanation remaining is that the mind is responsible for it. Likewise, fictitious ideas, like sirens and chimeras, have no exemplar outside the mind and so must be formed according to forms natural to the human mind. And finally, common notions such as substance, truth, goodness, equity, and God, as well as axioms such as the same thing cannot be and not be, are innate, that is, they proceed from the mind alone, since all corporeal motions are particular but these notions are universal. The sense in which they are innate differs from adventitious and fictitious ideas; innate ideas do not proceed from the senses or the imagination but "are congenite and inbred with the said mind, from their original." (1694, p. 328) By this Le Grand meant that the mind or thought itself, not any of its faculties such as sense or intellection, is the principle or original of such ideas. These ideas are formed in the mind by the mind and from the mind.

Thus as Descartes held, there are three kinds of ideas (adventitious, fictitious, and innate), which are distinguished by their differing sources as well as the way in which they are inbred in the mind. Adventitious ideas proceed from the senses, fictitious ideas proceed from the imagination and the intellect, and innate ideas proceed from thought itself, which acts as their ground or original. Nonetheless, all ideas, regardless of their source or origin, depend on the mind in some essential way for their form. But this gives rise to the problem of explaining how ideas can be said to represent, if they in no way resemble their objects. This problem is especially acute for Cartesians who held that there is a modal difference between what is found at the level of sensory perception and intellection, such that impressions cannot contain any of the properties found at the level of ideas. What arrives at our faculty of thinking from the senses is not ideas such as we form them in our thought, as the scholastic empiricists held, but rather only various particular motions emitted by external objects. (1694, p. 328)

Le Grand's solution to the problem of how ideas represent their objects employed the notion of substitution or ‘supplying a stead’ -- wherein the cause (the object) contains all the properties found in the effect (the idea) not actually but in virtue of its ability to supply the substitute properties or proxies. And a relation, according to Le Grand, "…is nothing else but a mode of our understanding, comparing one thing with others, because of some properties or acts that are found in them." (1694, p. 17) Descartes himself never cashed out the notion of representation in terms of substitution, although he came close to suggesting it in the French version of the Third Meditation, in which he claimed that such things as extension, shape, position and movement may be contained in him eminently, "…and as it were the garments under which corporeal substance appears to us." (1985-91b, fn.1, p. 31) One could conceivably interpret this to mean that the garments of corporeal substance, namely extension, shape, position and movement are the garments supplied by the mind as the forms or the conceptions under which the mind grasps material things. Although the mind itself is not extended, shaped, locally positioned or moved, it dresses material substance in these properties in order to perceive particular material things. But there is no suggestion in Descartes regarding how the dressing is related to the material object grasped. Le Grand's notion of substitution was intended as an explication of this relation, and is his contribution to the Cartesian dialectic on ideas.

Le Grand was one of the few Cartesians to defend Descartes's doctrine of the creation of essences and eternal truths. The thesis is that God is the efficient cause of all things, both actual and possible, including all the truths we call eternal, "In like manner as a king is the maker of all laws in his kingdom. For all these truths are inborn in us from him; as a king also would have them so in his subjects, if he had power enough to write his laws in their hearts." (1694, p. 63)  The main worry that critics, like Malebranche, had of this doctrine was that it would remove any necessary foundation for the propositions of science and theology, making them contingent and uncertain. To answer this worry, Le Grand added that there is one important difference between kings and God in the way they set down their laws, "A king can change his laws because his will is changeable, but God's will is unchangeable, for it is His perfection to be invariable in manner." (1694, p. 63) In this way, Le Grand attempted to account for the dependence of all things on God's will, while at the same time accounting for the immutable foundation of the truths of natural philosophy.

Whereas the creation of true and immutable natures was the work of God's freewill (not dictated according to his Wisdom, as Malebranche and other critics held), once created, they were necessary. In order to tie this necessity to the immutability of God's will without limiting God in any way, Le Grand drew on a Scholastic distinction between antecedent and consequent necessity. He argued that true and immutable natures, such as mathematical truths, only possessed a consequent necessity. God did not will that 6+4=10 because he saw it could not be otherwise, but in virtue of his free will, 6+4 [necessarily] = 10; therefore it could not be otherwise. As Descartes put this same point, "And even if God has willed that some truths should be necessary, this does not mean that he willed them necessarily; for it is one thing to will that they be necessary, and quite another to will this necessarily, or to be necessitated to will it." [1985-91c, p. 235]. For nothing outside of God, not even the eternal truths or immutable essences, necessitate that God act in one way or another, but rather, they are themselves eternal and immutable in virtue of the fact that God, whose existence is necessary and immutable, willed them in their essence and existence. Eternal truths and immutable essences are necessary only in that they presuppose and are consequent to the act of God who caused them.

Echoing Descartes in part VI of the Discourse on Method, Le Grand held that God implanted certain simple, true, and immutable ideas in our minds so that we could have a science of nature; yet, He also created a nature whose power is so ample and vast that only observation can close the gap between the two. Thus, while Le Grand remains essentially a rationalist in his claim that knowledge of immutable essences, laws and truths remains the autonomous domain of reason, which is independent of the appearances of the senses, it is a rationalism tempered by his view that truths and laws are dependent on the will of God, and hence, are in some sense contingent. This dependence means that truth must be sought after in the effects of nature, and not in something independent of those effects, and that secondary causes, although dependent both on God's will and on the primary truths of nature, have a genuine role in causal explanation. In other words, our search for truth is in the specific operations of things, and even though our understanding of these truths is importantly independent of these specific operations, our discovery of them is not.

4. Ethics

Le Grand's early ethical and political writings are not Cartesian. In Le Sage des Stoïques, ou l'Homme sans Passions, Selon les Sentiments de Sénèque (1662), later translated and published as Man Without Passions (1675), he expounds the Stoical doctrines of Seneca, for which the goal of the moral person is to expunge the passions. He later rejected this view of the passions and argued the Cartesian view that the passions ought to be trained (not expunged) in the moral life. Le Grand also wrote a curious political treatise, Scydromedia (1669), which is a semi-fictional, utopian work describing his vision of the ideal state.

There is nothing innovative in Le Grand's moral theory, yet his discussions are rich with references to ancient and contemporary theories. He borrows from the ancient Atomists, the Stoics, the Scholastics, and the "Moralists" of his time, and frames it, where possible, in Cartesian terms. Le Grand acknowledges that Descartes himself wrote little on ethics, but he argues that Descartes's treatment of the soul and the passions provides a solid foundation for the treatment of moral matters. According to Le Grand, the object of ethics is right reason, its end is the perfection of man, and it is an active not a speculative science. An example of his reconciling project can be seen in Book I, Part X of his Entire Body of Philosophy (1694), where Le Grand attempted to reconcile the doctrines of Seneca and Epicurus on the role of pleasure in the virtuous life, by drawing on Descartes's theory of the passions. (1694, p. 347)  He argues that pleasure has a role to play in the moral life, since virtue depends on freewill (as the Stoics held) and pleasure derives from the satisfaction of the mind in possessing the good (as Epicurus held). What Descartes's theory provided was an explanation of how pleasure (a passion) could aid the will in choosing the right course of action, while maintaining the voluntary nature of the will and virtue.

Le Grand, although not an innovator, is worthy of study for his contribution to the development of Cartesianism in the latter half of the seventeenth century. No less important is the fact that he spent most of his life in England, where his contact with members of the Royal Society and the universities of Cambridge and Oxford had a lasting impact on the reception of Descartes's ideas in England, Germany, and France.


Primary Texts

Selected Studies and Critical Discussions

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Descartes, René | Malebranche, Nicolas