Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
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Emmanuel Levinas

First published Sun Jul 23, 2006; substantive revision Sun Mar 18, 2007

Levinas's philosophy has been called ethics. If ethics means rationalist self-legislation and freedom (deontology), the calculation of happiness (utilitarianism), or the cultivation of virtues (virtue ethics), then Levinas's philosophy is not an ethics. Levinas claimed, in 1961, that he was developing a “first philosophy.” This first philosophy is neither traditional logic nor metaphysics, however.[1] It is an interpretive, phenomenological description of the rise and repetition of the face-to-face encounter, or the intersubjective relation at its precognitive core; viz., being called by another and responding to that other. If precognitive experience, that is, human sensibility, can be characterized conceptually, then it must be described in what is most characteristic to it: a continuum of sensibility and affectivity, in other words, sentience and emotion in their interconnection.[2]

This entry will focus on Levinas's philosophy, rather than his Talmudic lessons (see the bibliography) and his essays on Judaism (notably, Difficult Freedom: Essays on Judaism, 1963). Levinas's philosophical project can be called constructivist. He proposes phenomenological description and a hermeneutics of lived experience in the world. He lays bare levels of experience described neither by Husserl nor by Heidegger. These layers of experience concern the encounter with the world, with the human other, and a reconstruction of a layered interiority characterized by sensibility and affectivity.

1. Introduction

1.1 Overview of Levinas's Philosophy

Jacques Derrida pointed out in 1967 that “Levinas does not want to propose laws or moral rules…it is a matter of [writing] an ethics of ethics.”[3] An ethics of ethics means, here, the exploration of conditions of possibility of any interest in good actions or lives. In light of that, it can be said that Levinas is not writing an ethics at all. Instead, he is exploring the meaning of intersubjectivity and lived immediacy in light of three themes: transcendence, existence, and the human other. These three themes structure the present entry.

At the core of Levinas's mature thought (i.e., works of 1961 and 1974) are descriptions of the encounter with another person. That encounter evinces a particular feature: the other impacts me unlike any worldly object or force. I can constitute the other person cognitively, on the basis of vision, as an alter ego. I can see that another human being is “like me,” acts like me, appears to be the master of her conscious life. That was Edmund Husserl's basic phenomenological approach to constituting other people within a shared social universe. But Husserl's constitution lacks, Levinas argues, the core element of intersubjective life: the other person addresses me, calls to me. He does not even have to utter words in order for me to feel the summons implicit in his approach. It is this encounter that Levinas describes and approaches from multiple perspectives (e.g., internal and external). He will present it as fully as it is possible to introduce an affective event into everyday language without turning it into an intellectual theme. Beyond any other philosophical concerns, the fundamental intuition of Levinas's philosophy is the non-reciprocal relation of responsibility. In the mature thought this responsibility is transcendence par excellence and has a temporal dimension specific to it as human experience.

The phenomenological descriptions of intersubjective responsibility are built upon an analysis of living in the world. These are unique to Levinas. They differ from Heidegger's analytic of existence. For Levinas, an ‘I’ lives out its embodied existence according to modalities. It consumes the fruits of the world. It enjoys and suffers from the natural elements. It constructs shelters and dwellings. It carries on the social and economic transactions of its daily life. Yet, no event is as affectively disruptive for a consciousness holding sway in its world than the encounter with another person. In this encounter (even if it later becomes competitive or instrumental), the ‘I’ first experiences itself as called and liable to account for itself. It responds. The ‘I’'s response is as if to a nebulous command. Nothing says that the other gave a de facto command. The command or summons is part of the intrinsic relationality. With the response comes the beginning of language as dialogue. The origin of language, for Levinas, is always response—a responding-to-another, that is, to her summons. Dialogue arises ultimately through that response. Herein lie the roots of intersubjectivity as lived immediacy. Levinas has better terms for it: responsibility is the affective, immediate experience of “transcendence” and “fraternity.” We will return to these themes.

The intersubjective origin of discourse and fraternity can only be reached by phenomenological description. Otherwise, it is deduced from principles that have long since been abstracted from the immediacy of the face-to-face encounter with the other. Levinas's descriptions show that ‘in the beginning was the human relation’. The primacy of relation explains why it is that human beings are interested in the questions of ethics at all. But for that reason, Levinas has made interpretative choices. To situate first philosophy in the face-to-face encounter is to choose to begin philosophy not with the world, not with God, but with what will be argued to be the prime condition for human communication. For this reason, Levinas's first philosophy starts from an interpretive phenomenology. Like Husserl's, his first philosophy sets aside empirical prejudices about subjects and objects. Like Husserl's phenomenology, it strips away accumulated layers of conceptualization, in order to reveal experience as it comes to light. For Levinas, intersubjective experience, as it comes to light, proves ‘ethical’ in the simple sense that an ‘I’ discovers its own particularity when it is singled out by the gaze of the other. This gaze is interrogative and imperative. It says “do not kill me.” It also implores the ‘I’, who eludes it only with difficulty, although this request may have actually no discursive content. This command and supplication occurs because human faces impact us as affective moments or, what Levinas calls ‘interruptions’. The face of the other is firstly expressiveness. It could be compared to a force. We must, of course, use everyday language to translate these affective interruptions. Therein lie difficulties that this entry will clarify.

Suffice it to say that first philosophy is responsibility that unfolds into dialogical sociality. It is also Levinas's unique way of defining transcendence in relation to the world and to what Heidegger called Being. Throughout this entry, we will refer to the themes of transcendence and Being in light of the work of Husserl and Heidegger. It is Levinas's project to uncover the layers of pre-intellectual (what Husserl called pre-intentional or objectless intentionality), affective experience in which transcendence comes to pass. Thus, the phenomenological descriptions that Levinas adapts from Husserl and Heidegger extend both of their approaches. However, Levinas's particular extension of Husserl and Heidegger unfolds over the course of an entire philosophical career. For that reason, this entry will follow that career chronologically, as it evolves. We will emphasize, in what follows, how it is that Levinas's thought is: (1) a unique first philosophy; (2) not a traditional ethics (neither virtue, nor utilitarian, nor deontological ethics); (3) the investigation of the lived conditions of possibility of any de facto human interest in ethics; (4) a highly original adaptation of phenomenology and the interpretation of pre-intentional embodied existence (viz., descriptions of sensibility and affectivity).

1.2 Life and Career

1906 Born January 12 in Kaunas (or Kovno, in Russian), Lithuania. Lithuania is a part of pre-Revolutionary Russia in which the then surrounding culture ‘tolerates’ Jews. He is the eldest child in a middle class family and has two brothers, Boris and Aminadab.
1914 In the wake of the War, Levinas's family emigrates to Karkhov, in the Ukraine. The family returns to Lithuania in 1920, two years after the country obtains independence from the Revolutionary government.
1923 Goes to study philosophy in Strasbourg (France). Levinas studies philosophy with Maurice Pradines, psychology with Charles Blondel, and sociology with Maurice Halbwachs. He meets Maurice Blanchot who will become a close friend.
1928-29 Levinas travels to Freiburg to study with Edmund Husserl; he attends Heidegger's seminar.
1930 Publishes his thesis in French, The Theory of Intuition in Husserl's Phenomenology.
1931 French translation, by Levinas, of Husserl's Sorbonne lectures, Cartesian Meditations, in collaboration with Gabrielle Peiffer.
1932 He marries Raïssa Levi, whom he had known since childhood.
1934 Levinas publishes a philosophical analysis of “Hitlerism,” Reflections on the Philosophy of Hitlerism.
1935 Levinas publishes an original essay in hermeneutic ontology, On Escape, in the Émile Bréhier's journal Recherches philosophiques (reprinted in 1982).
1939 Naturalized French; enlists in the French officer corps.
1940 Captured by the Nazis; imprisoned in Fallingsbotel, a labor camp for officers. His Lithuanian family is murdered. His wife Raïssa, and daughter, Simone, are hidden by religious in Orléans.
1947 Following the publication of Existence and Existents (which Levinas began writing in captivity), and Time and the Other that regrouped four lectures given at the Collège Philosophique (founded by Jean Wahl), Levinas becomes Director of the École Normale Israélite Orientale, Paris.
1949 After the death of their second daughter, Andrée Éliane, Levinas and his wife have a son, Michael, who becomes a pianist and a composer.
Levinas publishes En découvrant l'existence avec Husserl et Heidegger (selections of which appear in 1998 as Discovering Existence with Husserl).
1957 He delivers his first Talmudic readings at the Colloque des Intellectuels juifs de Langue française. A colloquium attended by Vladimir Jankélévitch, André Neher, and Jean Halpérin, among others.
1961 Publishes his doctorate (ès Lettres), Totality and Infinity: An Essay on Exteriority. Position at the Université de Poitiers.
1963 Publishes Difficult Freedom: Essays on Judaism.
1967 Professor at the Université de Paris, Nanterre, with Paul Ricœur.
1968 Publishes Quatres lectures talmudiques (English translation in Nine Talmudic Readings).
1972 Humanism of the Other.
1973 Lecture at the Université de Paris IV-Sorbonne.
1974 Otherwise than Being, or Beyond Essence, the second magnum opus.
1975 Sur Maurice Blanchot (no English translation).
1976 Proper Names.
1977 Du sacré au saint (English translation in Nine Talmudic Readings).
1982 Of God Who Comes to Mind, Beyond the Verse and the radio conversations with Philippe Nemo, Ethics and Infinity.
1984 Transcendance et Intelligibilité (English translation in Emmanuel Levinas: Basic Philosophical Writings)
1987 Outside the Subject, a collection of texts, old and new on philosophers, language, and politics.
1988 In the Time of the Nations.
1990 De l'oblitération: Entretien avec Françoise Armengaud (no English translation); a discussion about the sculpture of fellow Lithuanian, Sasha Sosno.
1991 Entre Nous: On Thinking-of-the-Other. An issue of the prestigious Les Cahiers de L'Herne is dedicated to Levinas's work.
1993 Sorbonne lectures of 1973-74, published as God, Death, and Time. The annual colloquium at Cerisy-la-Salle publishes a volume devoted to him.
1994 Raïssa Levinas dies in September. Levinas publishes a collection of essays, Liberté et commandement (no English translation) and Unforeseen History, edited by Pierre Hayat.
1995 Alterity and Transcendence.
Emmanuel Levinas dies in Paris, December 25.
1996 New Talmudic Readings (published posthumously).
1998 Éthique comme philosophie première (no English translation, published posthumously).

2. Philosophical Beginnings: Transcendence as the Need to Escape

Levinas published his thesis, The Theory of Intuition in Husserl's Phenomenology in 1930. It was the first book-length introduction to Husserl's thought in French. By privileging the theme of intuition, Levinas established what German speaking readers would have found in Husserl's Ideas (published 1913): every human experience is open to phenomenological description; every human experience is from the outset meaningful and can be approached as a mode of intentionality.[4] The following year, he published a translation of Husserl's Cartesian Meditations, in which the latter laid out a systematic presentation of transcendental phenomenology.[5] In the 1930s, Levinas continue to publish studies of the thought of his two principal teachers, Husserl and Heidegger. These included “Martin Heidegger and Ontology”[6] and the comprehensive “The Work of Edmund Husserl.”[7] In the 1930s and 40s, his philosophical project is influenced by Husserl's phenomenological method, which turned around the centrality of the “transcendental ego.” However, suspicious of an excessive intellectualism in Husserl's approach to essences, Levinas embraced the concrete, worldly approach to existence in Heidegger's Being and Time.[8] Between 1930 and 1935, he will nevertheless turn away from Heidegger's approach to Being and transcendence and develop the outlines of a counter-ontology. He will reconceive transcendence as a need for escape, and work out a new logic of lived time in that project.

Levinas's first experimental essay, On Escape (De l'évasion, 1935), examined the relationship between the embodied (sentient) self and the intentional ego,[9] from the perspectives of physical and affective states, including need, pleasure, shame, and nausea. In this original philosophical exercise, Levinas revisited Heidegger's approach to time and transcendence.[10] He was less concerned than was Heidegger with the question of existence that opens up before us when, beset by profound anxiety, we experience the ‘dissolving’ of things in the world. Levinas's question was not: “Why is there Being instead of simply nothing?” His concern was to approach Being differently, through the (human) being for which the primary experiences of Being are of its embodied, but not physiological, existence. Unlike Heidegger, Levinas's approach gave priority to embodiment and its lived “moods,” as well as to humans' failed attempts to get away from the being that we ourselves are. “Escape,” he wrote, “is the need to get out of oneself, that is, to break that most radical and unalterably binding of chains, the fact that the I [moi] is oneself [soi-même].”[11] In the two, crossing dimensions of human life, sentient-affective and intentional, our experience of Being comes to pass.

Levinas's early project approached transcendence in light of humans' irreducible urge to get past the limits of their physical and social situations. His transcendence is less transcendence-in-the-world than transcendence through and because of sensibility. This approach to transcendence as evasion poses the question of mortality, finite being, and so, infinity.

Levinas accepted Heidegger's arguments that a human being experiences itself as if cast into its world,[12] without control over its beginning and ending. Heidegger's human being, or Dasein, lives out its time projecting itself toward diverse possibilities, and may confront its own mortality in this way. The projective element of transcendence, which Heidegger described in The Basic Problems of Phenomenology[13] as simply a “stepping over to…as such,” was of interest to Levinas. But he would enquire: to what are we ‘stepping over’? And from what are we ‘stepping over’? Levinas writes:

And yet modern sensibility wrestles with problems that indicate…the abandonment of this concern with transcendence. As if it had the certainty that the idea of the limit could not apply to the existence of what is…and as if modern sensibility perceived in being a defect still more profound (OE, 51).

The objection Levinas raised against Heidegger's transcendence was not that it rejected theology. Rather, it was that ‘stepping over’, or being out ahead of oneself, suggested that Being, as Heidegger understood it, was finite or somehow flawed. That places Being in a cultural and historical context,[14] or, to put it more philosophically, it poses the question of the meaning of the finite and the infinite; that is, the question of the “idea of the limit.” Levinas asks: “[Is] the need for escape not the exclusive matter of a finite being?…Would an infinite being have the need to take leave of itself?” We are admittedly finite. But how do we know this, and from what perspective do we contemplate Being as finite? “Is this infinite being not precisely the ideal of self-sufficiency and the promise of eternal contentment?” (OE, 56). The decision about the ultimate meaning of the infinite is not made in the 1935 essay. It returns as a theme in the 1940s essays, however. Important here are: (1) Levinas's argument that Heidegger's conception of existence is historically specific. (2) To be embodied is to struggle with the limits of one's facticity and one's situation, and it is here that the question of Being first arises.

If Heidegger's Dasein confronted the question of Being by finding itself brought before itself in anxiety, Levinas proposes other ways by which the gap narrows between Being itself and the beings that we are. Following the leitmotif of our irrepressible need to escape, Levinas examines a host of attempted and disappointed transcendences: need, pleasure, shame, and nausea. In these possibilities, the corporeal self is posited, set down as a substance, in its existence. Unlike Heidegger's Being, these states are not abstract. Here begins Levinas's protracted insistence that Being is continuous presence, not, as Heidegger insisted, an event of disclosure and withdrawal.

From the outset, the “fact of existing” refers to concrete human existence. In identifying existence as firstly human, Levinas establishes that Heidegger's Being, or the “being of that which is,” answers a formal ontological question, to which determinations like finiteness and infinity, not to mention escape and transcendence, apply only vaguely. He will therefore concentrate on what it means for a human being to posit itself, in an act that is not already abstracted from its everyday life.

Affective self-positing, not Heidegger's Dasein with its projective temporality, would offer the purest and most concrete access possible to our finite existence. I am my joy or my pain, if provisionally. Our diverse attempts to get out of our everyday situations are not the same as projections toward new possibilities, where our death lies behind all the others (death is the ultimate limit, or “possibility of impossibility,” for Heidegger). Escape represents, for Levinas, a positive, dynamic need. But needs are not equivalent to mere suffering. Within many needs is the anticipation of their fulfillment. If need, whether for sustenance or diversion, cannot assure an enduring transcendence of everyday existence, it nevertheless beckons and enriches us, even if it can sometimes be experienced as oppressive. In this youthful work, Levinas thus rethinks need in light of fullness rather than privation, as was commonly done. In so doing, he opens a different understanding of existence itself. Whether it is experienced by pleasure or suffering, need is the ground of our existence. That means that transcendence, in Levinas's understanding of it, is continually directed toward “something other than ourselves” (OE, 58). And it suggests that the deep motivation of need is to get out of the being that we ourselves are—our situation and our embodiment. In 1935, Levinas's counter-ontology moves Heidegger's Being toward the unified duality of sentient self and intentional ‘I’, here and now, not projected toward its ultimate disappearance in death

Reconceived as need, pleasure, or even nausea, transcendence gives us access to a temporality that is neither Aristotle's “measure of motion,” nor the fullness of awaiting (the kairos or moment in the early Heidegger). Pleasure and pain are intensities: “something like abysses, ever deeper, into which our existence…hurls itself” (OE, 61). The priority of the present, concentrated into an extended moment is opened up through sensibility and affectivity. In pleasure as in pain, we need—not out of lack—but in desire or in hope. “Pleasure is…nothing less than a concentration in the instant…” (OE, 61). The present thus receives existential priority over Heidegger's projections of lived temporality. Levinas's emphasis on the embodied present is a theme he never abandons.[15] In as much as he received it from Husserl, he will vastly enrich it.[16]

In sum, Levinas's early project is structured around the reconceptualization of fundamental existential categories. If Husserl's transcendental ego[17] returns, here, as the ‘I’ of conscious intentions, which Levinas differentiated from the self of embodiment, it remains the case that the embodied self holds priority, precisely as the site from which transcendence first arises. If the ‘self’ and ‘I’ duality is where the positivity of Being is clearest, then the precedence of the world and of Being is necessarily displaced. On the other hand, Heidegger's finite Being, which he understood as disclosure and withdrawal, is interpreted in a pre-Heideggerian fashion, as constant presence. That presence is modalized through our manifold sensations, emotions and states of mind.

In 1935, Levinas was convinced that through sensation and states of mind, we discover both the need to escape ourselves and the futility of getting out of existence. In the physical torment of nausea, we experience Being in its simplest, most oppressive neutrality. To this, Levinas adds three provocative themes. First, a being that seeks to escape itself, because it finds itself trapped in its own facticity, is not a master, but a “creature” (OE, 72). Second, nausea is not simply a physiological event. If nausea shows us, dramatically, how existence encircles us on all sides, to the point of submerging us, then social and political actuality can also nauseate. Third, if Being is experienced in its pure form as neutrality and impotence, then we can neither bypass Being (following the “aspirations of Idealism” [OE, 73]), nor accept it passively. Being is existence, but it is our existence. The mark of our existence is need, or the non-acceptance of neutral Being. In 1935, Levinas concludes, “Every civilization that accepts being—with the tragic despair it contains and the crimes it justifies—merits the name ‘barbarian’,” (OE, 73). The question remains: How shall we conceptualize a sensuous need to transcend Being? Embodied need is not an illusion; but is transcendence one?

3. Inflections of Transcendence and Variations on Being

The writings of the 1940s prolong Levinas's counter-ontology (against Heidegger's question of Being, but always with recourse to interpretations of embodiment). They inflect the notion of transcendence, away from the partial transcendence of need and pleasure, toward the promise of fecundity.

In late 1939, Levinas was mobilized as a reserve officer in the French army and sent to the front, where he was captured less than a year later. While interned in the Fallingsbotel camp near Hanover, Levinas studied Hegel and began work on Existence and Existents. There is no doubt that the uncertainty about his wife and daughter, not to mention rumors about the liquidation of the Jews of Lithuania, influenced his work at this time. We need only recall Levinas's anecdote about “the last Kantian” in Nazi Germany.[18] The only being, who was not a prisoner, to acknowledge the sequestered officers, was a dog. A more critical evaluation of the period can be seen in his conception of Being in Totality and Infinity (1961).

In Existence and Existents (1947) and Time and the Other (1947), existence has the surprising, dual aspect of “light,” and of a dark indeterminacy. It is as though it were divided between the Being of the created world and the darkness out of which light was created. This shifts the phenomenological focus onto Being as light and visibility, in which we can constitute objects at a distance and Being as the dark turmoil into which we sink, in insomnia. The attempt to close the hiatus between Heidegger's Being and the being that we are has also changed. Following Husserl's transcendental phenomenology, in which an ‘I’ grounds the movements of intentionality like a magnetic pole, Levinas's embodied ego is neither preceded nor outstripped by its world. The corporeal self, now called the “hypostasis,” is its own explicit basis; we awaken out of ourselves, into light. We fall asleep, curled about ourselves. To put it succinctly, consciousness, with its moods and activity, begins and ends with itself. It awakens, acts, and falls asleep.

The question of transcendence continues in these middle-period essays. The meaning of transcendence is refined to the temporal transcendence promised by “fecundity,” or the birth of the son. The partial transcendences of pleasure and voluptuosity, sketched in 1935, receive a fuller development and variations. As to the son, he is myself and not-myself, Levinas will say. The open future of the family responds to two significant limits imposed on human knowledge and representation: death and the other person. While not denying Heidegger's intuition that death (if viewed from a stance of the living) is the “possibility of impossibility,” Levinas argues that we witness death only as the death of the other, but even as such it escapes understanding as an absolute limit. Hence he will qualify it as a radical alterity; the same sort of alterity as that which the other human being presents me. Against these enigmas, every mode of comprehension runs aground. For this reason, Levinas insists that death is really the impossibility of (all our) possibilities. The other person is an event I can neither predict nor control.

Two reversals should be noted relative to 1935. First, against Hegel's conception of work as the dialectic of spirit transforming nature (and nature naturalizing labor), Levinas describes labor phenomenologically as effort and fatigue,[19] highlighting the divergence between embodied self and the intending ego. The second reversal concerns moods themselves. While anxiety was the state of mind, for the early Heidegger, by which humans came before themselves and the question of their existence, in subsequent years, Heidegger would expand his “attunements,” to include joy, boredom, and awe. All of these open Dasein to being and the world. In his middle period, Levinas also addresses our openness to the world, privileging it over questions of Being. However, instead of adumbrating revelatory moods, Levinas has recourse to bodily states like fatigue, indolence, and insomnia, in which the gap between self and I is clearest. Themes of joy and love of life appear in regard to the world, because the world is now understood as light. But this, too, is part of Levinas's counter-project to Heidegger, for whom our concern for the world coexists with instrumentalist relationships with it: entities in the world are as if on display, at the reach of the hand; tools are used like material. Ever in search of a primordial, sense-rooted, relation to the world, Levinas situates his discovery, offering a profoundly Husserlian insight: “The antithesis of the a priori and the a posteriori is overcome by light” (DEAE, 76).

It is worth recalling that light figured as the very heart of Husserl's phenomenological intuition. Light is awakened consciousness, whose intentionality[20] Levinas rethinks as “lived affectivity” (DEAE, 56), rather than as a ray of intentional focus, aiming at objects. In Existence and Existents, the emotions characteristic of being in a world of light are desire and sincerity, not Heidegger's care and circumspection. We see at work, here, a significant rethinking of the transcendental-anthropological distinction (expressed as a priori and a posteriori). These levels represent the legacy of Kantianism and inform the early Heidegger's “ontological difference.” Levinas sublates the distinction phenomenologically; light functions, here, as a quasi-transcendental, a condition of possibility that is nevertheless in and of the world and its experience.

Being, as we noted, also is dark indeterminacy. Having suspended the binaries of de facto inside and outside as part of his own phenomenological bracketing,[21] Levinas will approach this indeterminacy not as objectivity, but as something revealed through mood. Whether it is the dark indeterminacy that besets the insomniac self, or whether it is the rustling of nocturnal space, Being's dark aspect horrifies us. “The things of the day world then do not in the night become the source of the ‘horror of darkness’ because our look cannot catch them in their ‘unforeseeable plots’; on the contrary, they get their fantastic character from this horror. Darkness…reduces them to undetermined, anonymous being, which they exude” (EE, 54). This anonymous being, also called the il y a [there is], does not ‘give’ the way Heidegger's Being does. And it is not revealed through mere anxiety. Nevertheless, it is a beginning. Insomniac and in the throes of horror, the hypostasis falls asleep. Or again, it lights a light and reassembles its consciousness. It “sobers up.” Therein lays our first, constitutive escape from neutral Being. But the il y a gives the lie to the question: Why is there Being instead of simply nothing? Nothing, as pure absence, may be thinkable, but it is unimaginable. Indeterminate Being fills in all the gaps, all the temporal intervals, while consciousness arises from it in an act of self-originating concentration. This is the first sketch of Being as totality. The self-‘I’ dyad becomes a limited transcendence arising in the midst of the self's encompassing horror. It hearkens to a call that comes not from neutral Being but from the Other. The stage is thus set for Totality and Infinity's elaborate analyses of world, facticity, time as now-moment, transcendence in immanence, and transcendence toward future fecundity. These themes constitute the core of Totality and Infinity: An Essay on Exteriority.

4. Transcendence as Responsibility, and Beyond

Levinas's first book-length essay, Totality and Infinity (1961), was written as his Habilitation or Doctorat d'État.[22] Transcendence is a significant focus of Totality and Infinity, coming to pass in the face-to-face relationship. For Levinas, to escape deontology and utility, ethics must find its ground in an experience that cannot be integrated into logics of control, prediction, or manipulation. Whether it takes the form of the conscious ‘fit’ between subject and object in Husserl's phenomenology, or whether a unity of mind and being evolves dialectically, rational activity can never become ‘angelic’. That is, it cannot step outside the totalizing logics of metaphysical systems, without supposing them or restoring them. There is no formal bridge, for Levinas, between practical and pure reason. Philosophy in the twentieth century (Heidegger, the Frankfurt School, deconstruction) has shown, at least, that the universality of concepts and the necessity carried by transcendental arguments are simply not sufficient to prevent the triumph of ends-rationality and instrumentalization. Ethics is therefore either an affair of inserting particulars into abstract scenarios, or ethics itself speaks out of particularity about the first human particularity: the face-to-face relationship.

For much Jewish thought after Kant, the ethical message of the biblical prophets held a dignity equal to the justice aimed at in Jewish law. Levinas carries this insight into phenomenology, starting with a relationship that is secular, yet non-finite (not conceptually limitable), because it continuously opens past the immediacy of its occurring, toward a responsibility that repeats and increases as it repeats. The new framework of transcendence as human responsibility involves an extensive exploration of the face-to-face relationship, and it opens onto questions of social existence and justice. Finally, Levinas approaches to Being more polemically as exteriority. We will examine these themes in what follows.

4.1 Logic of Totality and Infinity

Totality and Infinity unfolds around phenomenological descriptions of Being, understood mechanistically as nature. Being as love of life holds an important place here, much the way need as positivity, and existence as light, did in the 1930s and ‘40s. Levinas again reframes labor, less as mastery and humanization of nature, and more as the creation of a store of goods with which an other can be welcomed. Thanks to his joy in living and his creation of a home, the human being is able to give and to receive the other into his space. On the basis of these descriptions, transcendence comes to pass in several stages. First, the onset of the other, as the expression of the face, causes freedom of will to falter and opens a ‘me’ to goodness. Second, in accounting for itself, the subject approached by the other engages the first act of dialogue. Out of this, discourse eventually arises. The unfolding of discourse carries a trace of ethical investiture and self-accounting, and may become conversation and teaching. As the breadth of dialogical engagement expands, the trace of the encounter with the other becomes attenuated; and this, to the point where the meaning of justice poses a question. Is the essence of justice the reparation of wrongs; is it disinterested equity, or is it the interest of the stronger? Because justice is clearly all these things, it constitutes a kind of pivot between the mechanism evident in Being and the supererogatory gesture of responsibility. Levinas's logic unfolds up to the question of justice and then takes an unanticipated tack. Rather than pursuing justice as it is refined through civil society into the State, Levinas focuses on an ‘institution’, the family, which is common to all of humanity. In the family, election by the father and service to the brothers, set forth a justice more decisively conditioned by face-to-face responsibility than the justice of the State could ever be. The phenomenology of the family, entitled “beyond the face,” crowns Levinas's first major work.

4.2 Time and Transcendence in Totality and Infinity

Totality and Infinity does not devote much attention to clock time or to the time of history. Because Being is accepted in its Hobbesian character as mechanistic causality and competition, human time will not be situated firstly in social time with the invention of clocks and calendars. History, too, seems to be a history of metaphysicians: Levinas describes history as violence, punctuated by extremes of war and annihilation. However, an alternative history, in which the wrongs done to particulars can be attested, is envisionable. It will not be recorded in a history of the State.

Levinas will not focus on time as the measure of movement, or even on time as Henri Bergson's “duration.” Duration denoted a temporality lacking all subjectivity. It was like the time of ritual participation in dream worlds, as observed by French ethnographers. For Levinas, time will consist in two axes: (1) the flowing synthesis of now moments, Husserl's structure of transcendental consciousness; (2) and a peculiar kind of interruption that Levinas will call the event of transcendence.

Transcendence is, above all, relational: it is a human affair. It is difficult to determine whether transcendence is an “event” per se or not. An event should be characterized as a force that introduces a decisive break into the historical status quo and redirects it in function of its own magnitude. The encounter with the other person, so far as it is an event, merely inflects history or leaves a trace in it. But this is not the history found in the textbooks. It is more like a history of isolated acts or human ideals (justice, equity, critique, self-sacrifice). Transcendence in Levinas is lived and factical. How could transcendence be factical? While it has the temporality of an interruption that ‘I’ cannot represent to myself, transcendence nevertheless has a circular relationship with everyday life. That is, transcendence, understood as the face-to-face relation, lives from our everyday enjoyment and desire even as it precedes these. Human existence, as sensibility, is full and creative, before it is instrumentalist or utilitarian. From enjoying the elements to constructing a home, human existence is never solipsistic. Our life with others is never a flight from a more resolute stance toward our reason for being (our mortality). We are always already in social relations; more importantly, we have always already been impacted by the expression of a living other. Because this impact is affective, because transcendence is not conceptualizable, we forget the force the other's expression has on us. We therefore carry on, in our respective worlds, motivated by our desire for mastery and control. Nevertheless, desire in Totality and Infinity always proves to be double. There is a naturalistic desire, subject to imperatives of consumption and enjoyment. This desire is coextensive with the exercise of our concrete freedom. And there is a desire that comes to light in the failure of our will to mastery. This failure of the will is experienced in the face-to-face encounter. The other's face is not an object, Levinas argues. It is pure expression; expression affects me before I can begin to reflect on it. And the expression of the face is dual: it is command and summons. The face, in its nudity and defenselessness, signifies: “Do not kill me.” This defenseless nudity is therefore a passive resistance to the desire that is my freedom. Any exemplification of the face's expression, moreover, carries with it this combination of resistance and defenselessness: Levinas speaks of the face of the other who is “widow, orphan, or stranger.” These figures are more than allegorical. Each one lacks something essential to its existence: spouse, parents, home.

It is as summons that we see expression precipitating transcendence. In other words, if I am self-sufficient in my everyday cognition and my instrumental activities, then that is because I am a being that inhabits overlapping worlds in which my sway is decisive for me. The approach of the other person halts the dynamism of my cognitive and practical sway. Passive resistance inflects my freedom toward an affective mood already explored in 1935: shame. Freedom experiences itself as imperial, unjustifiable; in thus coming out of itself, the ‘I’ accounts for itself. It gives an account to another, who is experienced as “higher” than the ‘I’ in two respects: (1) the passive resistance and ‘facing’ quality of the face holds the other outside of structures of force and conflict; (2) the “demand” the face makes on me (described phenomenologically as the ‘I’) is unavoidable, at least in its coming to pass. Thus the ‘I’ is singled out by the other, extracted from its context of interests. It “trans-ascends,” rising to the other in an affective intentionality, which other philosophies may well have understood as moral sentiments. Of course, Levinas's descriptions are presented under phenomenological bracketing, so this is not a philosophy of moral feeling or a psychology of empathy. Now, Levinas argues that the instant of trans-ascendence belongs to an order different from that of existence or Being: this is the order of the “Good beyond Being,” already glimpsed by Platonism.

It is impossible to set up a linear logic of priority between Being and the Good beyond Being. For humans, the Good comes to pass, as if trivially, in that responsibility and generosity are perceivable in human affairs. Cruelty and competition are also readily discerned. The two moments in the philosophical tradition in which the irreducible value of the Good has been pinpointed are, for Levinas, Plato's Idea of the Good, and Descartes's Idea of Infinity, which points beyond itself to an unknowable cause. It may be that insisting that the Good is prior to, rather than just beyond, Being, is necessary to deconstructing Hegel's phenomenology of consciousnesses in struggle for recognition, that there are moments of inexplicable generosity, even occasional sacrifices for another (person or group), is otherwise inexplicable within a logic of competing freedoms and reductive desires. In that respect, the trace of the Good is always present within Being, as a possibility that something other than consumption or instrumentalization may take place.

Trans-ascendence, or Levinas's transcendence, evinces the surprising characteristic of being both a common everyday event, a relation, and what he will call “Infinity.” Now, insofar as Infinity means the not-finite, it refers to the unmasterable quality of human expression. So far as Infinity has a positive sense, then it has the affective qualities of desire for sociality, and of joy. Thus, Infinity, before we interpret it as “God” or reify it as a highest being, is a quotidian event that takes place at the sensuous-affective level, and repeats. If it repeats without leaving a clear memory of itself, then this is because it repeats pre-cognitively and pre-intentionally—like a memory ‘of the flesh’, as adumbrated by Merleau-Ponty and his fundamental historicity.[23] Having bracketed any psychological unconscious, always too much the mirror of consciousness itself, Levinas will insist on the ontological significance of the body and the flesh: these are always already in relation with something, be it only air and light. And sensibility consists of an indeterminate number of affectations, of which we become conscious only by turning our attention to them. Levinas's ‘pre-conscious’ sensibility is thus the ongoing shadow or double of the intentional ‘I’. Like the embodied self, who suffocated within itself in 1935 (in nausea), the self of sensibility is the locus of relationality and transcendence in 1961.

The implication of this is radical. Whereas light and consciousness afforded Levinas the means by which to sublate the a priori-a posteriori distinction in 1947, and therewith Heidegger's ontological difference between Being and beings, here, the everyday facticity of the face-to-face encounter destabilizes transcendental versus pragmatic distinctions. Transcendence is “anthropological,” a human affair, or it is nothing. Any philosophical translation of embodied concrete life must consider the human subject as it is constituted through relations with others in a simultaneous occurrence of particularization and loss of self.

4.3 Willing, Being, and Two Histories (the State and the Family)

In Time and the Other, Levinas first voiced “the profound need to quit the climate of [Heidegger's] philosophy.” In 1961, he will do so, albeit not without a certain violence in his interpretation of Heidegger's ontology. As we have seen, it is possible to envisage Being as existence by way of the concepts of willing and strife in Levinas. Certainly, the experience of the Shoah is reflected in this work, notably in the very anti-Heideggerian characterization of Being as constant presence. For Levinas, this Being has two modes of carrying on. In nature, it is mechanism, drives, and linear causality. In social life, it is the ‘totalization’ or absorption of individuals and institutions by the State. In 1961, the State, no matter what period of its history we examine, decides questions of security and property, life and death. In the “Preface” to Totality and Infinity, the State is the ‘organism’ of politics: it declares and manages war—whether military or commercial (trade wars). This leaves the question of justice suspended between the moral responsiveness coming out of the face-to-face encounter, and the conflict of ontological forces. It is unclear which of these two human possibilities for justice represents what Carl Schmitt, then later Walter Benjamin called, the “state of exception.”

Being, in Levinas, is never Heidegger's disclosure and withdrawal. Thus, Being is not an event per se. Levinas never addressed the question of whether an ethics could be derived from Heidegger's ontology. But it is clear that no thinking whose primary focus was on an openness toward the world, and a confrontation with one's mortality, afforded the means necessary for grasping the hidden meaning of consciousness, which begins in the double constitution of the subject by life and by the encounter with the Other. For Levinas, Heidegger's philosophy was a thinking of the neuter, a recrudescent paganism that sacralized natural events and anonymous forces. Worse, it was a thinking that drew its inspiration from an ancient structure of temporality, Paul's kairos, which was the time of awaiting the messiah's return for the early Christian community. If the evacuation of lived, religious content gave Heidegger access to a temporality more substantial than what was available to the neo-Kantian, formalist tradition, one question remained: How can one preserve the living source of human facticity while removing all connection to its contents? It is for this reason that Levinas returns to a conception of Being more familiar to the metaphysical tradition than to Heidegger's Being, glimpsed in the ‘moment’.

Being carries on as continuous presence for Levinas. The face-to-face encounter inflects it toward the possibility of responsibility and hospitality. But an inflection does not mean a transformation. Inflection opens to what Kant called “interests of practical reason,” through the repetition of responsibility. This inflection of Being also opens a course toward universality as ethical humanity rather than universality as politics. An inflection toward humanity is fragile, because it is continually absorbed by the rhetoric of political institutions. However, in 1961, Levinas's inflection is best seen in the family. How the responsibility and election experienced by fathers, sons, and brothers, passes into a larger history and public space remained a difficult question—probably best addressed through critique, witnessing, perhaps even limited demands for justice. Nevertheless, the constituent ‘moments’ of the family are universal. Beginning with fecundity, in which the time of an individual (life span) is opened beyond its limits by one (the son) who is both (the image of) the father and other than he, the life of the family continues through election and responsibility enacted between parents and offspring—and between brothers. This is illustrated by the fact that there are events and crimes that the son or grandson may pardon, whereas the father could not. However, the logic of fecundity-election-responsibility leaves the State and the family as two distinct human collectivities with nothing to mediate between their ontological and moral characteristics. Being, understood as existence in all its dimensions, may be modified, but not durably. Thus Being could be called absolute, were it not for the fragile interruption of transcendence and the persistence of its trace.

If family and State represent two irreconcilable instances in Levinas's 1961 thought, willing and ethical responsibility prove likewise irreconcilable. Moreover, given Levinas's characterization of the will—naturalistic and drive-based—it is hard to see how this natural inheritance could be halted in its élan or caused to question itself. If Derrida is right, and Totality and Infinity is a “treatise on hospitality,” then the transcendence that comes to pass in the face-to-face must have nothing to do with the will. It must never be a matter of nature, even human nature. That excludes from transcendence not only an intentional component (already bracketed by Levinas's phenomenology), but also anything like moral sentiments or innate capacities to be affected by the other. The non-violent force of the face as expression can be reduced neither to physical force nor to inertia. In such a case, there would be no question of escaping the mechanistic order of Being. This requires the conception of a different kind of force, which Levinas will call “Illeity.” An attempt to express, differently, the unbridgeable distance between myself and the other, “he-ness” or Illeity, signifies the impossibility of initially pronouncing a “thou” in some kind of reciprocity with the other person. Thus the moment of address in the second person comes after the impact of the face as widow and as He. Moral height is thus not expressed in thou-saying; it is a third person relationship. Here lies the point at which a reading begins that bridges the philosophical and the religious, particularly the Jewish dimension of Levinas's thought. It is and must remain a question too large for philosophy to know what explains the force of the other's expression. Nothing explains it. There are, Levinas insists, objects behind their objects only in ages of penury. The face-to-face encounter likely gives rise to the impetus to pronounce an impossible signifier like “God.” Be that as it may, whatever we attribute to God must be subject to the conditions Levinas already placed on transcendence: non-thematizable, it is an experience of assignation and command. To say more than this is to return to the confidence that representation and conceptuality capture every aspect of meaning lived out in a human life. Thus Levinas stands, minimally, within the negative ‘theological’ tradition inaugurated by Maimonides; more acutely, perhaps, because Levinas's task is not so much to reconcile Judaism and Aristotelianism, as it is to describe phenomenologically the indescribable: breaking out of totality and Being. We will have more to say on this when we discuss time and transcendence in Otherwise than Being

5. Transcendence as the Other-in-the-same

Otherwise than Being grew up around its core fourth chapter, entitled “Substitution” and published first in 1968.[24] It is a justifiable simplification to say that substitution is responsibility, explored this time as a multi-faceted interiority, an inner life with a host of affective tones. These tones require extensive recourse to discursive figures borrowed from psychology, poetics, and even ‘dogmatics’ (“obsession,” “persecution,” “recurrence,” “too tight in its skin,” “exile,” “maternity,” “love,” “expiation,” and “kenosis”). The central wager of Otherwise than Being is to express affectivity in its immediacy, with minimal conceptualization. Consequently, transcendence becomes transcendence-in-immanence before it is transcendence toward the other as untotalizable exteriority.

5.1 The Logic of Otherwise than Being

Otherwise than Being opens with a general overview of the argument, in which Being and transcendence will now be called essence and disinterest. Emphasizing the processual quality of Being, Levinas will now refer to it equivalently as Being or essence. Responsibility will be focused more sharply as the condition of possibility of all signification. The themes of conversation and teaching recede into the background. A more strategic use of the body as flesh, that is, simultaneously an inside and outside locus, is evident. Subjectivity is now the coming to pass of responsibility itself. That means that subjectivity is properly itself because it is regularly dispossessed of itself from within. The other has become other-in-the-same. But the other-in-the-same is not different from the factical other. It is that Levinas has returned to Husserl's investigation of transcendence-in-immanence and his phenomenology of the living present.

The second chapter approaches Heidegger's theme of language as the way in which Being becomes, the way it temporalizes. Levinas adopts Heidegger's argument that the logos gathers up Being and makes it accessible to us. But Levinas will argue that the lapse of time between lived immediacy and its representation cannot really be gathered by a logos. Therefore, the lapse poses a challenge to language itself and falls, much the way that transcendence did, outside the realm of Being as process. This is Levinas's ultimate critique of Heidegger, which passes through language rather than through Being itself.

The three most remarkable innovations of Otherwise than Being include: (1) The proposed phenomenological reduction to the birth of meaning in a self, carrying what is not itself (the other, affectively). This is a radicalization of Husserl's idealism, in which meaning arises thanks to the inner dialogue whose language is more rarefied than that composed of everyday signs. (2) The exploration of sensibility as the locus at which ‘inside’ and ‘outside’ merge. If sensibility already played an important role in Totality and Infinity, sensibility will now be traced back to the density of the flesh itself. And the flesh serves Levinas as his pre-consciousness, whose ontological meaning counts above all else. (3) The exploration of the self, minus the intentional ego, through an affective ‘complex’, unfolds in a language that is best communicated through enactment. It can be likened to prophetic witness. It is as though Levinas were describing the affective investiture of a subject called to witness. This is also the sense of the subject carrying more than it can express, and writhing under the constraints of that investiture.

Chapters four and five of the work have a tone more somber than that of any work Levinas had written up to that point. If responsibility expresses the intersubjective genealogy of the affective subject—arising between Being and the Good—then this affective constitution will be called traumatic in 1974 (OBBE, 56). Affectivity is now expressed, above all, in light of suffering. Nevertheless, the split subject continues ‘to be’ as sincerity. But the concepts of desire, especially ‘metaphysical Desire’, have a diminished significance here. The lapse of time, irrecuperable to conceptual identification, will be expressed figuratively as the adverbial. Adverbs inflect Being (which the verb makes ‘resonate’ for us); they do not change it. The adverb expresses the autrement; literally, “other-ly” than Being, not another order of Being.

The final half of chapter five recurs to the performative register of language to express the tension of consciousness striving to gather itself in the midst of the subject's affective divisions and its investiture by the other. (Levinas calls this, at times, its ‘psychosis’, OBBE, 142.) Thus Levinas writes: “that is true of the discussion I am elaborating at this very moment” (OBBE, 170; emphasis added). To be sure, there is an inevitable artificiality to presenting as immediacy what is already past. But this is a wager we also find in religious language's continuous revivification of the present. It is likewise a wager in Levinas's philosophical discourse; one ventured in the hope that hyperbole and strategic negations will convey a meaning that would otherwise disappear in predicative statements. (Nietzsche already taught us that “the lightning does not flash,” which conveys the immediacy at which Levinas too is aiming.) The final chapter of Otherwise than Being thus makes a transition out of philosophy into a certain lyricism, repetition, and bearing witness. It is Levinas's step toward the affective conditions of possibility of prophetic speech.

5.2 Time and Transcendence in Otherwise than Being

In the 1974 work, Levinas's earlier concern with charges of psychologism (i.e., descriptions limited to subjective particularity, admitting no generalization as conditions of possibility) diminishes. The 1961 ontological language also changes. The ways in which existence echoes in language is taken up resolutely. The structure of human sensibility[25] is explored as passive ‘epidermal’ vulnerability.

As in his 1935 discussion of need and nausea, the complex of sensibility and affectivity overflows representation, while providing an index to the Being that is our own being. Interwoven layers of affectivity are unfolded in Otherwise than Being. Levinas explores the sensible-affective ‘proto-experience’ of the approach of the Other in light of moods, using deliberate tropes: “there is substitution for another, expiation for another. Remorse is the trope of the literal sense of sensibility. In its passivity is erased the distinction between being accused and accusing oneself” (OBBE, 125). As in Existence and Existents, where “light” dissolved, for phenomenological description, the a priori-a posteriori distinction, Otherwise than Being is a study of transcendence as the Other-in-the-same. The experience of the affective trace of ‘my’ relations with particular others is preserved, again not as psychological memory, but as a reminiscence of the flesh. We should recall that the spatial distinction between inside and outside falls as one effect of phenomenological bracketing. That spatial distinction—like the separation of an intending ‘I’ and its intended object—was the outcome of a cognitive, abstractive decision whose finality set a subject in a ‘here’ and a ‘within’, just as it set an object in a ‘there’ or an ‘outside’. Faithful to the spirit of Husserl's phenomenology, Levinas suspends that distinction.[26] The new concept of the Other-in-the-same does not abrogate the de facto approach of another human being, as described in Totality and Infinity. Rather, it problematizes that more ontological approach. There is good reason for this. As we know, responsibility is an event that repeats. It even increases as it repeats, according to a logic of expanding significance. That is why the question of immanence arises in regard to responsibility's enduring, and its rememoration. The status of a memory of sensuous events, which affect us before we can represent them, must frame sensibility as intrinsically meaningful, intrinsically beyond-itself. But that implies that the sensuous meaning-event is vulnerable to a skeptical challenge.

Levinas does not solve the question of memory and repetition in cognitive terms. As an interpretive phenomenologist, his concern is to pursue transcendence back behind Husserl's transcendental ego, that formal, passive accompaniment of all conscious contents.[27] Levinas's investigations into transcendence turn, here, on the challenge of expressing the depths of passive syntheses and the excessive quality of sensibility and affectivity.[28] While his question still concerns transcendence as spatio-temporal interruption, less attention is devoted to ontological matters like love of life, building a home, or witnessing the promise of a son. The opposition to Heidegger now takes place through an analysis of temporality and language, with the focus on the dynamism of verbs and their inflections by adverbs. Addressing Heidegger, Levinas argues, “Being is the verb itself. Temporalization is the verb form to be. Language issued from the verbalness of a verb would then not only consist in making Being understood, but also in making its essence vibrate…” Here, we see him thinking, with Heidegger, of language as gathering Being, but above all, as rendering Being as pure activity, which Levinas calls ‘vibration’. He continues, this time undermining Heidegger for whom there is no concept of the ad-verbial: “The lived sensation, being and time, is already understood in a verb. In sensibility the qualities of perceived things turn into time and into consciousness… [But,] do not the sensations in which the sensible qualities are lived resound adverbially…as adverbs of the verb to be? If they could be surprised on the hither side of the said, would they not reveal another meaning” (OBBE, 35)?

Given the hermeneutic insight that language does not pair up with a pre-existing, objective reality, but instead brings existence to light, language and temporalization have complementary functions vis-à-vis each other: they create meaning, and reality. If Being resonates in the verb to be, then transcendence must belong either to Being and verbality, or transcendence must differ from them. This is why Levinas proposes to capture the lapse of time between a lived moment and the return we make to it, with his concepts of adverbial modification and with “the Saying” (OBBE, 37-55). The Saying hearkens to his theme of sincerity, introduced in Existence and Existents. In Otherwise than Being, he will radicalize sincerity by insisting that the structure of sensibility-affectivity is to be always already fissured. It is this that opens us to venture communication. Sensuous vulnerability is the locus of the birth of signification, understood as approaching or speaking-to another (whether words are actually spoken or not). There is more, in living affectivity, than Heidegger's conception of Being coming to pass, can designate.

To adumbrate transcendence as alterity within a subject and, in so doing, to express metaphorically the lost lapse of time—which is the immediate present—Levinas recurs to Husserl's “so little explored manuscripts concerning the living present” (OBBE, 33).[29] He goes beyond Husserl by insisting that this lapse be called being-for-the-other. If transcendence is transcendence-in-immanence in 1974, it is not simply the continuous birth of intentional acts of consciousness that bestow meaning, as it was in Husserl.

Has this ultimate approach to transcendence charted a new apophatics, a new discourse of the unspeakable? Levinas does not refrain from thinking the lapse of time, which is also the gnawing of remorse, and the symptom of the Other-in-the-same. He calls this “Ipseity,” that most concrete and particular core of the subject. “The [I]pseity has become at odds with itself with its return to itself. The self-accusation of remorse gnaws away at the closed and firm core of consciousness, opening it, fissioning it” (OBBE, 125). But he now argues that what is said about transcendence and responsibility must also be unsaid, to prevent it from entering into a theme, since it transcends every thematic. While this is a deconstruction whose first ‘text’ is consciousness already inscribed, sensuously, by an ‘other’, this is also a hermeneutical crossroads. The history of Jewish philosophy, from Philo and Sa'adya Gaon to Maimonides, and then from Cohen to Rosenzweig, alone clarifies Levinas's strategies and figures. Levinas has recourse, for example, to Maimonides' approach to the Infinite, using a negative interpretation of affirmative propositions. Rather than saying “God is powerful,” Maimonides proposes that “God is not weak.” Rather than insisting that “God is one,” Maimonides says, “God is not multiple.”[30] In bracketing from our discourse all that which human language may not appropriately attribute to God, we create an infinite proposition (“A is not B”). A similar proposition is found in Levinas's characterization of transcendence. We can be otherwise, if we choose to do so, he argues. However, we cannot “otherwise than be”—since otherwise suggests the infinity, the open non-structure of human sensibility and affectivity, so long as these are understood as for-the-Other.

5.3 Sensibility, Facticity, and the Hermeneutic Circle

In the wake of Schleiermacher and Dilthey, Heidegger realized in the early 1920's that life as concrete, lived immediacy can be interpreted, but that we cannot be certain that what we are interpreting does not move perpetually within the circle of discursive conceptuality. Interpretation spawns interpretation (of itself), and a hermeneutic circle arises from this. Does that mean that factical experience is structurally inaccessible? Levinas's text here echoes his 1961 claims about the face as expression that pierces through phenomenality. The hyperbolic language of Otherwise than Being would have us ‘sense’ the excess of what he means to express—and its limit. This is not allegory; that is, it is not the signification, born of a Christian reading of the Bible, of higher realities hidden under everyday objects and events. It is almost the contrary: signification has its incipience in transcendence; transcendence is the intersubjective quality of sensibility. Levinas seeks the factical and moral depths from which signs arise. To combine Maimonides' negation strategies with an affirmative discourse that is not positivistic, does not result in ‘positing’ entities, Levinas seeks “to measure the pre-ontological weight of language instead of taking it only as a code.” He reminds us that “interpreting the fact that essence exposes and is exposed, that temporalization is stated, resounds and is said, [does] not give priority to the [words] said over the saying. It is first to awaken, in the said, the saying which is absorbed in it” (OBBE, 43). This is why to ‘say’ transcendence-in-immanence means to say and to unsay it. “For the saying is both an affirmation and a retraction of the said. The reduction could not be effected simply by parentheses…It is the ethical interruption of essence that energizes the reduction” (OBBE, 44). Levinas is thus performing a non-technical, interpretive reduction in his text. His radical reduction aims to get at the affective meaning of his ethical interruption of Being and consciousness. “Without a shell to protect oneself, stripped to the core as in an inspiration of air….It is a denuding beyond the skin, to the wounds one dies from…being as vulnerability” (OBBE, 49). Surprisingly, Levinas also calls this “Glory.” In the tradition of Jewish philosophy, glory (kavod) is the finite instance in which what is not-finite comes to pass. It is like a light out of which arises speaking (the dibbour, or Saying, of the Infinite). These thematic parallels are not accidental.[31]

The temporality specific to the sensuous passivity that precedes the passive synthesis of time as a unified flow, is stranger than Husserl's complex stream of consciousness with its retentions and protentions. Levinas compares his ‘temporality’ to aging. Like living, the time of sensibility occurs despite oneself. “The despite oneself marks this life in its very living. Life is life despite life—in its patience and its aging” (OBBE, 51, 54). This passivity, as pure “for-another,” adumbrates Levinas's temporal perspective on the genesis of signification. No longer do we heed spontaneously our own immanent voice, as in Husserl; no longer do we hearken to a silent call of Being, as in Heidegger (OBBE, 56, 62, 64). We are constituted, affectively, by the other within and without.

5.4 Being, the Third Party, and Politics

Being or existence remains on the parallel tracks of a naturalistic will to persist in being and its implications for culture and politics. Levinas's adaptation of the Spinozist conatus essendi predictably has nothing of the latter's monism or pantheism. Nevertheless, existence is not so markedly identified with war as it was in 1961. But Levinas will now argue that however we constitute “Nature”—phenomenologically, scientifically, culturally—sensuous vulnerability and the broken subject precede our constitutions, which all presuppose rationality and tradition. It is therefore possible to speak of a “pre-natural signification.” Levinas writes, “In renouncing [Husserl's] intentionality as a guiding thread toward the eidos [formal structure] of the psyche…our analysis will follow sensibility in its prenatural signification to the maternal, where, in proximity [to what is not itself], signification signifies [as sincerity] before it gets bent into perseverance in being in the midst of a Nature” (OBBE, 68).

The question remains, as it did in Totality and Infinity: How do responsibility and transcendence enter into the continuum of time and Being? And, how does an investiture of this intensity pass into reason? As in the 1961 work, we find, here, that the Third Party, another way of speaking of other people identified as other selves, also ‘looks at me through the eyes of the Other’. Here too the passage to reason, sociality, and measurable time occurs because the spatio-temporal lapse is as if spontaneously integrated by consciousness. Levinas accords Husserl his argument that sensibility and affect are always on the verge of becoming intentional consciousness. The responsibility and fraternity expressed now as the abyssal subject or other-in-the-same leaves a trace in social relations. Moreover, faithful to his project of 1961, the form of the trace is not traditionally metaphysical. It is found in our concern for reparatory justice, even for modest equity. This concern for justice does not change the Hobbesian or Machiavellian nature of human drives or political virtù. But neither could the adverbial change the verbal quality of being in its continuous becoming. In 1974 however, the difficulty of holding together the time and passivity likened to aging (OBBE, 54), with the flowing time of consciousness and its projections toward future possibilities, is more obvious in the text. Thus, Levinas inquires, “does a face abide in representation and in proximity; is it community and difference?” (OBBE, 154). Insoluble, this proves a question for us as well. “The third party introduces a contradiction in the saying whose signification before the other until then went in one direction. It is of itself the limit of responsibility and the birth of the question: What do I have to do with justice? A question of consciousness” (OBBE, 157).

With the consolidation of consciousness and the return to a philosophy of representation, the indispensable ‘fiction’ Levinas has created here dissolves: speaking here and now in writing; figural language pointing not toward another ‘world’ or another being, but to the intensities and openness of pre-conscious affectivity itself—all this returns to a poetics of the inexpressible. Now, attempts to express lived facticity occurred not infrequently in philosophy over the course of the last century. The text as first person witness may well date from Kierkegaard and Nietzsche. But the inevitable thematization of intersubjectivity, from a standpoint outside the face-to-face encounter, simply underscores the necessary double reading Levinas demands of us: conceptualization and performance.[32] Yet the question of justice requires an additional transcendental move that Levinas will not make. That is, what the Other means to the Third Party; or why Third Parties insist that ‘I’ too receive just treatment. These are questions that require a systematic perspective outside the passive now in which ‘I’ emerge, over-full with what is not-me. For that reason, Levinas is not interested in pursuing a deduction of questions of equity.

The site at which comparison, justice, and normativity can be deduced is beyond Levinas's immediate concern. Illeity and fraternity lose the quality that defines them, that excessive and intensive sensibility-affectivity, when they are incorporated into conceptualizing discourse. The hiatus, here, is well known: it is that already found between intuition and conceptual adequation; truth, in Plato's sense of an unmediated intuition of an Idea versus knowledge, as positing and possession of entities.

The notion of a just politics has meant different things according to the form of the State (absolute, noninterventionist, liberal). Given his occasional evocations of a pluralist Being in Totality and Infinity, Levinas's argument that justice is marked by the trace of responsibility accords relatively well with liberal theories of political justice and sovereignty. Anglo-Saxon theorists of sovereignty always emphasized that individuals live in multiple social associations, which impose a host of responsibilities on them. This pluralist cultural existence diminishes conservative emphases on sovereignty as concentrated in the State itself. But Levinas never decided whether politics meant war or a real possibility of peace. In his 1984 essay “Peace and Proximity,” Levinas is more favorable to the State which, as liberal, evinces palpable aspects of the trace in its policies. “It is not without importance to know—and this is perhaps the European experience of the twentieth century—whether the egalitarian and just State in which the European is fulfilled—and which it is a matter…above all of preserving—proceeds from a war of all against all—or from the irreducible responsibility of the one for the other.”[33]

For the Jewish philosophical tradition, justice forms the core of the prophetic message. In that respect it has a distinctive political dimension. If the prophets demanded justice (as well as repentance) of their wayward communities, their hyperbolic invocation of justice concerned humanity as a whole. But the prophetic message did not aim at the enactment of justice in the public sphere, whether agora or parliament. As Hermann Cohen recognized, the foundational pillars of “Athens” and “Jerusalem” carried with them two distinct finalities for political justice: the polis or humanity.[34] This best explains why Levinas's remarks on politics are rare and, at times, idiosyncratic. Politics and the Third Party are, by 1974, largely synonymous with “humanity.” This is a significant displacement from his condemnation of politics as the polemos of Being itself, in 1961.

6. Concluding Remarks

Levinas's works subsequent to Otherwise than Being refine its complex thematics. There are few significant radicalizations, outside a firmer resolve to speak of the ambiguity intrinsic to the signifier “God,” and the verbal totalization of Being as “essence.” Commentators have differed on the importance of the two major works (Totality and Infinity and Otherwise than Being). It is plausible to see in them two sides of a single coin: that of responsibility and intersubjective fraternity, understood as meaningful outside of a biological framework or the discovery of biological paternity. Others argue that Otherwise than Being is Levinas's mature work, a study on the creativity of language endebted to, yet different from, Heidegger's investigations of the poetic lògos, which gathered Being and brought it to light. As we pointed out, Derrida called Totality and Infinity a “treatise on hospitality,” and devoted, in sum, more attention to it than to Otherwise than Being. But Levinas had essentially one philosophical project: to interpret existence and transcendence in light of the birth of ethical meaning. To that end he consistently revisited Husserl's phenomenological method. He reconceived Heidegger's ontological difference as the difference between existence and the Good. He had extensive, often undeclared recourse to the profound, anti-totalizing intuitions into religious life found in Hermann Cohen and Franz Rosenzweig's philosophies. Yet Levinas never remained wholly within any one philosophical system. That does not mean that Otherwise than Being was not motivated by the difficulties highlighted in Totality and Infinity by Jacques Derrida and others. There is little question that the sophistication of Otherwise than Being lies in its three innovations: 1) the analyses and figural expression of transcendence-in-immanence; 2) the critique of language as the site in which existence arises, and 3) the ‘wager’ of stepping out of philosophical reasoning into a performative register that ‘says’ and ‘unsays’ itself.

A common thread thus runs through his philosophy and his Talmudic readings. Transcendence is the spontaneity of responsibility for another person. It is experienced in concrete life and expressed in a host of discourses, even before a de facto command is actually received from that other. This curious proposition hearkens to the much debated meaning of “receiving the Torah before knowing what was written in it.”[35] Levinas calls this sort of responsiveness the “Good beyond Being.” Responsibility enacts that Good, that trace of the infinite, because such instances of answering to or for another are everyday events, even though they are not typical of natural, self-interested behaviors. We do not choose to be responsible. Responsibility arises as if elicited, before we begin to think about it, by the approach of the other person. Because this theme is found in both his philosophy and his interpretations of Talmudic passages, Levinas's thought has, at times, left both Talmud scholars and philosophers dissatisfied. For the first, his thought is thoroughly humanistic, with Infinity proving a more rarefied concept of divinity than Maimonides' apophatics. No stranger to Mishnah and Gemara, his interpretations are, nevertheless, less focused on inter- and intra-textuality than on the ethical tenor of the teachings. To the philosopher, Levinas's thought may not escape the hermeneutic circle of facticity, which Heidegger first adumbrated. His philosophy's antifoundational approach to responsibility as the prethematic structure of the self, and as transcendence, appears to lie between phenomenology and a religious élan with no religious finality. Thus Illeity, or the ethical height of the other person, expresses in a concept my affective experience of a power, and an excess, greater than I can ‘contain’. It is precisely in these tensions, between the Jewish religious and philosophical traditions, and his phenomenological-existential thought, that Levinas's originality lies.


Works by Levinas:

Principal Philosophical Works of Levinas:

A list of works, translated into English but not appearing in any collections, may be found in Critchley, S. and Bernasconi, R., Eds. The Cambridge Companion to Levinas (New York, NY: Cambridge University Press, 2002), pp. 269-270.

Collections of Philosophical Essays and Lectures:

Levinas's Talmudic Writings and Studies on Judaism

Collections of Essays

Secondary Literature

Works on Levinas

Collections of Articles on Levinas:


An extensive bibliography is available online — see the Other Internet Resources below.

Other Internet Resources

Centers and Sites:

Personal Websites

Related Entries

Derrida, Jacques | Heidegger, Martin | Husserl, Edmund | phenomenology


The chronology and bibliography were prepared by Gabriel Malenfant, Université de Montréal. Heartfelt thanks to Gabriel Malenfant and to Maxime Doyon (Albert-Ludwigs-Universität Freiburg) for their suggestions and assistance.