Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.

Jacques Derrida

First published Wed Nov 22, 2006

Jacques Derrida (1930-2004) was the founder of “deconstruction,” a way of criticizing not only both literary and philosophical texts but also political institutions. Although Derrida at times expressed regret concerning the fate of the word “deconstruction,” its popularity indicates the wide-ranging influence of his thought, in philosophy, in literary criticism and theory, in art and, in particular, architectural theory, and in political theory. Indeed, Derrida's fame nearly reached the status of a media star, with hundreds of people filling auditoriums to hear him speak, with films and televisions programs devoted to him, with countless books and articles devoted to his thinking. Beside critique, Derridean deconstruction consists in an attempt to re-conceive the difference that divides self-reflection (or self-consciousness). But even more than the re-conception of difference, and perhaps more importantly, deconstruction works towards preventing the worst violence. It attempts to render justice. Indeed, deconstruction is relentless in this pursuit since justice is impossible to achieve.

1. Life and Works

Derrida was born on July 15, 1930 in El-Biar (a suburb of Algiers), Algeria, into a Sephardic Jewish family. As is well-known, Algeria at this time was a French colony. Because Derrida's writing concerns auto-bio-graphy (writing about one's life as a form of relation to oneself), many of his writings are auto-biographical. So, for instance in Monolingualism of the Other (1998), Derrida recounts how, when he was in the “lycée” (high school), the Vichy regime in France proclaimed certain interdictions concerning the native languages of Algeria, in particular Berber. Derrida calls his experience of the “interdiction” “unforgettable and generalizable” (1998, p. 37). In fact, the “Jewish laws” passed by the Vichy regime interrupted his high school studies.

Immediately after World War II, Derrida started to study philosophy. In 1949, he moved to Paris, where he prepared for the entrance exam in philosophy for the prestigious École Normale Supérieure. Derrida failed his first attempt at this exam, but passed it in his second try in 1952. In one of the many eulogies that he wrote for members of his generation, Derrida recounts that, as he went into the courtyard toward the building in which he would sit for the second try, Gilles Deleuze passed him, smiling and saying, “My thoughts are with you, my very best thoughts.” Indeed, Derrida entered the École Normale at a time when a remarkable generation of philosophers and thinkers was coming of age. We have already mentioned Deleuze, but there was also Foucault, Althusser, Lyotard, Barthes, and Marin. Merleau-Ponty, Sartre, deBeauvoir, Levi-Strauss, Lacan, Ricœur, Blanchot, and Levinas were still alive. The Fifties in France was the time of phenomenology, and Derrida studied closely Husserl's then published works as well as some of the archival material that was then available. The result was a “Mémoire” (a Masters thesis) from the academic year 1953-54 called The Problem of Genesis in Husserl's Philosophy; Derrida published this text in 1990. Most importantly, at the École Normale, Derrida studied Hegel with Jean Hyppolite. Hyppolite (along with Maurice de Gandillac) was to direct Derrida's doctoral thesis, “The Ideality of the Literary Object”; Derrida never completed this thesis. His studies with Hyppolite however led Derrida to a noticeably Hegelian reading of Husserl, one already underway through the works of Husserl's assistant, Eugen Fink. Derrida claimed in his 1980 speech “The Time of a Thesis” (presented on the occasion of him finally receiving his doctorate) that he never studied Merleau-Ponty and Sartre and that especially he never subscribed to their readings of Husserl and phenomenology in general. With so much Merleau-Ponty archival material available, it is possible now however to see similarities between Merleau-Ponty's final studies of Husserl and Derrida's first studies. Nevertheless, even if one knows Merleau-Ponty's thought well, one is taken aback by Derrida's one hundred and fifty page long Introduction to his French translation of Husserl's “The Origin of Geometry” (1962). Derrida's Introduction looks to be a radically new understanding of Husserl insofar as Derrida stresses the problem of language in Husserl's thought of history.

The 1960's is a decade of great achievement for this generation of French thinkers. 1961 sees the publication of Foucault's monumental Folie et déraison (Madness and Civilization is the English language title). At this time, Derrida is participating in a seminar taught by Foucault; on the basis of it, he will write “Cogito and the History of Madness” (1963), in which he criticizes Foucault's early thought, especially Foucault's interpretation of Descartes. “Cogito and the History of Madness” will result in a rupture between Derrida and Foucault, which will never fully heal. In the early 60's, Derrida reads Heidegger and Levinas carefully. Then in 1964, Derrida publishes a long two part essay on Levinas, “Violence and Metaphysics.” It is hard to determine which of Derrida's early essays is the most important, but certainly “Violence and Metaphysics” has to be a leading candidate. What comes through clearly in “Violence and Metaphysics” is Derrida's great sympathy for Levinas's thought of alterity, and at the same it is clear that Derrida is taking some distance from Levinas's thought. Despite this distance, “Violence and Metaphysics” will open up a lifetime friendship with Levinas. In 1967 (at the age of thirty-seven), Derrida has his “annus mirabilis,” publishing three books at once: Writing and Difference, Speech and Phenomena, and Of Grammatology. In all three, Derrida uses the word “deconstruction” (to which we shall return below) in passing to describe his project. The word catches on immediately and comes to define Derrida's thought. From then on up to the present, the word is bandied about, especially in the Anglophone world. It comes to be associated with a form of writing and thinking that is illogical and imprecise. It must be noted that Derrida's style of writing contributed not only to his great popularity but also to the great animosity some felt towards him. His style is frequently more literary than philosophical and therefore more evocative than argumentative. Certainly, Derrida's style is not traditional. In the same speech from 1980 at the time of him being awarded a doctorate, Derrida tells us that, in the Seventies, he devoted himself to developing a style of writing. The most famous or infamous example is his 1974 Glas (“Death Knell” would be an approximate English translation); here Derrida writes in two columns, with the left devoted to a reading of Hegel and the right devoted to a reading of the French novelist-playwright Jean Genet. Another example would be his 1980 Postcard from Socrates to Freud and Beyond; the opening two hundred pages of this book consist of love letters addressed to no one in particular. It seems that sometime around this time (1980), Derrida reverted back to the more linear and somewhat argumentative style, the very style that defined his texts from the Sixties. He never however renounced a kind of evocation, a calling forth that truly defines deconstruction. Derrida takes the idea of a call from Heidegger. Starting in 1968 with “The Ends of Man,” Derrida devoted a number of texts to Heidegger's thought. In particular, during the 1980's, Derrida wrote a series of essays on the question of sex or race in Heidegger (“Geschlecht I-IV”). While frequently critical, these essays often provide new insights into Heidegger's thought. The culminating essay in Derrida's series on Heidegger is his 1992 Aporias.

Throughout the Sixties, having been invited by Hyppolite and Althusser, Derrida taught at the École Normale. In 1983, he became “Director of Studies” in “Philosophical Institutions” at the École des Hautes Études en Sciences Sociales in Paris; he will hold this position until his death. Starting in the Seventies, Derrida held many appointments in American universities: Johns Hopkins, Yale, SUNY at Buffalo. From 1987, Derrida taught one semester a year at the University of California at Irvine. Derrida's close relationship with Irvine led to the establishment of the Derrida archives there. Also during the Seventies, Derrida associated himself with GREPH (“Le Groupe de Recherche sur l'Enseignement Philosophique,” in English: “The Group Investigating the Teaching of Philosophy”). As its name suggests, this group investigated how philosophy is taught in the high schools and universities in France. Derrida wrote several texts based on this research, many of which were collected in Du droit à la philosophie (1990, an approximate English title would be: “Concerning the Right to Philosophy”). In 1982, Derrida was also one of the founders of the Collège Internationale de Philosophie in Paris, and served as its first director from 1982 to 1984.

In the 1990's, Derrida's works went in two simultaneous directions that tend to intersect and overlap with one another: politics and religion. These two directions were probably first clearly evident in Derrida's 1989 “Force of Law.” But one can see them better in his 1993 Specters of Marx, where Derrida insisted that a deconstructed (or criticized) Marxist thought is still relevant to today's world despite globalization and that a deconstructed Marxism consists in a new messianism, a messianism of a “democracy to come.” But, even though Derrida was approaching the end of his life, he produced many interesting texts in the Nineties and into the new century. For instance, Derrida's 1996 text on Levinas, “A Word of Welcome,” lays out the most penetrating logic of the same and other through a discussion of hospitality. In his final works on sovereignty, in particular, Rogues (2003), Derrida shows that the law always contains the possibility of suspension, which means that even the most democratic of nations (the United States for example) resembles a “rogue state” or perhaps is the most “roguish” of all states. Based on lectures first presented during the summer of 1998, L'animal que donc je suis (The Animal that Therefore I am) appeared as the first posthumous work in 2006; concerning animality, it indicates Derrida's continuous interest in the question of life.

Sometime in 2002, Derrida was diagnosed with pancreatic cancer. He died on October 8, 2004.

2. “The Incorruptibles”

As we noted, Derrida became famous at the end of the 1960's, with the publication of three books in 1967. At this time, other great books appear: Foucault's Les mots et les choses (The Order of Things is the English language title) in 1966; Deleuze's Difference and Repetition in 1968. It is hard to deny that the philosophy publications of this epoch indicate that we have before us a kind of philosophical moment (a moment perhaps comparable to the moment of German Idealism at the beginning of the 19th century). Hélène Cixous calls this generation of French philosophers “the incorruptibles.” In the last interview Derrida gave (to Le Monde on August 19, 2004), he provided an interpretation of “the incorruptibles”: “By means of metonymy, I call this approach [of “the incorruptibles”] an intransigent, even incorruptible, ethos of writing and thinking …, without concession even to philosophy, and not letting public opinion, the media, or the phantasm of an intimidating readership frighten or force us into simplifying or repressing. Hence the strict taste for refinement, paradox, and aporia.” Derrida proclaims that today, more than ever, “this predilection [for paradox and aporia] remains a requirement.” How are we to understand this requirement, this predilection for “refinement, paradox, and aporia”?

In an essay from 1998, “Typewriter Ribbon,” Derrida investigates the relation of confession to archives. But, before he starts the investigation (which will concern primarily Rousseau), he says, “Let us put in place the premises of our question.” He says, “Will this be possible for us? Will we one day be able to, and in a single gesture, to join the thinking of the event to the thinking of the machine? Will we be able to think, what is called thinking, at one and the same time, both what is happening (we call that an event) and the calculable programming of an automatic repetition (we call that a machine). For that, it would be necessary in the future (but there will be no future except on this condition) to think both the event and the machine as two compatible or even in-dissociable concepts. Today they appear to us to be antinomic” (Without Alibi, p. 72). These two concepts appear to us to be antinomic because we conceive an event as something singular and non-repeatable. Moreover, Derrida associates this singularity to the living. The living being undergoes a sensation and this sensation (an affect or feeling for example) gets inscribed in organic material. The idea of an inscription leads Derrida to the other pole. The machine that inscribes is based in repetition; “It is destined, that is, to reproduce impassively, imperceptibly, without organ or organicity, the received commands. In a state of anaesthesis, it would obey or command a calculable program without affect or auto-affection, like an indifferent automaton” (Without Alibi, p. 73). The automatic nature of the inorganic machine is not the spontaneity attributed to organic life. It is easy to see the incompatibility of the two concepts: organic, living singularity (the event) and inorganic, dead universality (mechanical repetition). Derrida says that, if we can make these two concepts compatible, “you can bet not only (and I insist on not only) will one have produced a new logic, an unheard of conceptual form. In truth, against the background and at the horizon of our present possibilities, this new figure would resemble a monster.” The monstrosity of this paradox between event and repetition announces, perhaps, another kind of thinking, an impossible thinking: the impossible event (there must be resemblance to the past which cancels the singularity of the event) and the only possible event (since any event in order to be event worthy of its name must be singular and non-resembling). Derrida concludes this discussion by saying: “To give up neither the event nor the machine, to subordinate neither one to the other, neither to reduce one to the other: this is perhaps a concern of thinking that has kept a certain number of ‘us’ working for the last few decades” (Without Alibi, p. 74). This “us” refers to Derrida's generation of thinkers: “the incorruptibles.” What Derrida says here defines a general project which consists in trying to conceive the relation between machine-like repeatability and irreplaceable singularity neither as a relation of externality (external as in Descartes's two substance or as in Platonism's two worlds) nor as a relation of homogeneity (any form of reductionism would suffice here to elucidate a homogeneous relation). Instead, the relation is one in which the elements are internal to one another and yet remain heterogeneous. Derrida's famous term “différance” (to which we shall return below) refers to this relation in which machine-like repeatability is internal to irreplaceable singularity and yet the two remain heterogeneous to one another.

Of course, Cixous intends with the word “incorruptibles” that the generation of French philosophers who came of age in the Sixties, what they wrote and did, will never decay, will remain endlessly new and interesting. This generation will remain pure. But, the term is particularly appropriate for Derrida, since his thought concerns precisely the idea of purity and therefore contamination. Contamination, in Derrida, implies that an opposition consisting in two pure poles separated by an indivisible line never exists. In other words, traditionally (going back to Plato's myths but also Christian theology), we think that there was an original pure state of being (direct contact with the forms or the Garden of Eden) which accidentally became corrupt. In contrast, Derrida tries to show that no term or idea or reality is ever pure in this way; one term always and necessarily “infects” the other.

Nevertheless, for Derrida, a kind of purity remains as a value. In his 1992 The Monolingualism of the Other, Derrida speaks of his “shameful intolerance” for anything but the purity of the French language (as opposed to French contaminated with English words like “le weekend”). Derrida says, “I still do not dare admit this compulsive demand for a purity of language except within boundaries of which I can be sure: this demand is neither ethical, political, nor social. It does not inspire any judgment in me. It simply exposes me to suffering when someone, who can be myself, happens to fall short of it. I suffer even further when I catch myself or am caught ‘red-handed’ in the act. … Above all, this demand remains so inflexible that it sometimes goes beyond the grammatical point of view, it even neglects ‘style’ in order to bow to a more hidden rule, to ‘listen’ to the domineering murmur of an order which someone in me flatters himself to understand, even in situations where he would be the only one to do so, in a tête-à-tête with the idiom, the final target: a last will of the language, in sum, a law of the language that would entrust itself only to me. …I therefore admit to a purity which is not very pure. Anything but a purism. It is, at least, the only impure ‘purity’ for which I dare confess a taste” (Monolingualism, p. 46). Derrida's taste for purity is such that he seeks the idioms of a language. The idioms of a language are what make the language singular. An idiom is so pure that we seem unable to translate it out of that language. For example, Derrida always connects the French idiom “il faut,” “it is necessary,” to “une faute,” “a fault” and to “un défaut,” “a defect”; but we cannot makes this linguistic connection between necessity and a fault in English. This idiom seems to belong alone to French; it seems as though it cannot be shared; so far, there is no babble of several languages in the one sole French language. And yet, even within one language, an idiom can be shared. Here is another French idiom: “il y va d'un certain pas.” Even in French, this idiom can be "translated." On the one hand, if one takes the “il y va” literally, one has a sentence about movement to a place (“y”: there) at a certain pace (“un certain pas”: a certain step). On the other hand, if one takes the “il y va” idiomatically (“il y va”: what is at issue), one has a sentence (perhaps more philosophical) about the issue of negation (“un certain pas”: “a certain kind of not”). This undecidability in how to understand an idiom within one sole language indicates that, already in French, in the one French language, there is already translation and, as Derrida would say, “Babelization.” Therefore, for Derrida, “a pure language” means a language whose terms necessarily include a plurality of senses that cannot be reduced down to one sense that is the proper meaning. In other words, the taste for purity in Derrida is a taste for impropriety and therefore impurity. The value of purity in Derrida means that anyone who conceives language in terms of proper or pure meanings must be criticized.

3. Basic Argumentation and its Implications: Time, Hearing-Oneself-Speak, the Secret, and Sovereignty

Already we are very close to Derrida's basic argumentation. The basic argumentation always attempts to show that no one is able to separate irreplaceable singularity and machine-like repeatability (or “iterability,” as Derrida frequently says) into two substances that stand outside of one another; nor is anyone able to reduce one to the other so that we would have one pure substance (with attributes or modifications). Machine-like repeatability and irreplaceable singularity, for Derrida, are like two forces that attract one another across a limit that is indeterminate and divisible. Yet, to understand the basic argumentation, we must be, as Derrida himself says in Rogues, “responsible guardians of the heritage of transcendental idealism” (Rogues, p. 134; see also Limited Inc, p. 93). Kant had of course opened up the possibility of this way of philosophizing: arguing back (Kant called this arguing back a “deduction”) from the givenness of experience to the conditions that are necessarily required for the way experience is given. These conditions would function as a foundation for all experience. Following Kant (but also Husserl and Heidegger), Derrida then is always interested in necessary and foundational conditions of experience.

So, let us start with the simplest argument that we can formulate. If we reflect on experience in general, what we cannot deny is that experience is conditioned by time. Every experience, necessarily, takes place in the present. In the present experience, there is the kernel or point of the now. What is happening right now is a kind of event, different from every other now I have ever experienced. Yet, also in the present, I remember the recent past and I anticipate what is about to happen. The memory and the anticipation consist in repeatability. Because what I experience now can be immediately recalled, it is repeatable and that repeatability therefore motivates me to anticipate the same thing happening again. Therefore, what is happening right now is also not different from every other now I have ever experienced. At the same time, the present experience is an event and it is not an event because it is repeatable. This “at the same time” is the crux of the matter for Derrida. The conclusion is that we can have no experience that does not essentially and inseparably contain these two agencies of event and repeatability.

This basic argument contains four important implications. First, experience as the experience of the present is never a simple experience of something present over and against me, right before my eyes as in an intuition; there is always another agency there. Repeatability contains what has passed away and is no longer present and what is about to come and is not yet present. The present therefore is always complicated by non-presence. Derrida calls this minimal repeatability found in every experience “the trace.” Indeed, the trace is a kind of proto-linguisticality (Derrida also calls it “arche-writing”), since language in its most minimal determination consists in repeatable forms. Second, the argument has disturbed the traditional structure of transcendental philosophy, which consists in a linear relation between foundational conditions and founded experience. In traditional transcendental philosophy (as in Kant for example), an empirical event such as what is happening right now is supposed to be derivative from or founded upon conditions which are not empirical. Yet, Derrida's basis argument demonstrates that the empirical event is a non-separable part of the structural or foundational conditions. Or, in traditional transcendental philosophy, the empirical event is supposed to be an accident that overcomes an essential structure. But with Derrida's argument, we see that this accident cannot be removed or eliminated. We can describe this second implication in still another way. In traditional philosophy we always speak of a kind of first principle or origin and that origin is always conceived as self-identical (again something like a Garden of Eden principle). Yet, here we see that the origin is immediately divided, as if the “fall” into division, accidents, and empirical events has always already taken place. In Of Spirit, Derrida calls this kind of origin “origin-heterogeneous”: the origin is heterogeneous immediately (Of Spirit, pp. 107-108). Third, if the origin is always heterogeneous, then nothing is ever given as such in certainty. Whatever is given is given as other than itself, as already past or as still to come. What becomes foundational therefore in Derrida is this “as”: origin as the heterogeneous “as.” The “as” means that there is no knowledge as such, there is no truth as such, there is no perception as such. Faith, perjury, and language are already there in the origin. Fourth, if something like a fall has always already taken place, has taken place essentially or necessarily, then every experience contains an aspect of lateness. It seems as though I am always late for the origin since it seems to have always already disappeared. Every experience then is always not quite on time or, as Derrida quotes Hamlet, time is “out of joint.” Late in his career, Derrida will call this time being out of joint “anachronism” (see for instance On the Name, p. 94). As we shall see in a moment, anachronism for Derrida is the flip side of what he calls “spacing” (espacement); space is out of place. But we should also keep in mind, as we move forward that the phrase “out of joint” alludes to justice: being out of joint, time is necessarily unjust or violent.

So far, we can say that the argument is quite simple although it has wide-ranging implications. It is based on an analysis of experience, but it is also based in the experience of what Derrida has called “auto-affection.” We find the idea of auto-affection (or self-affection) in ancient Greek philosophy, for example in Aristotle's definition of God as “thought thinking itself.” Auto-affection occurs when I affect myself, when the affecting is the same as the affected. As we said above, Derrida will frequently write about autobiography as a form of auto-affection or self-relation. In the very late L'animal que donc je suis, Derrida tells us what he is trying to do with auto-affection: “if the auto-position, the auto-monstration of the auto-directedness of the I, even in man, implied the I as an other and had to welcome in the self some irreducible hetero-affection (which I [that is, Derrida] have attempted elsewhere [my emphasis]), then this autonomy of the I would be neither pure nor rigorous; it would not be able to give way to a simple and linear delimitation between man and animal” (L'animal que donc je suis, p. 133, my English translation). Always, Derrida tries to show that auto-affection is hetero-affection; the experience of the same (I am thinking about myself) is the experience of the other (insofar as I think about myself I am thinking of someone or something else at the same time). But, in order to understand more fully the basic argumentation, let us look at three of these “other places” where Derrida has “attempted” to show that an irreducible hetero-affection infects auto-affection.

The first occurs in La voix et le phénomène (literally the title is Voice and Phenomenon; the title of the English translation is Speech and Phenomena), Derrida's 1967 study of Husserl. Here, Derrida argues that, when Husserl describes lived-experience (Erlebnis), even absolute subjectivity, he is speaking of an interior monologue, auto-affection as hearing-oneself-speak. According to Derrida, hearing-oneself-speak is, for Husserl, “an absolutely unique kind of auto-affection” (Speech and Phenomena, p. 78). It is unique because there seems to be no external detour from the hearing to the speaking; in hearing-oneself-speak there is self-proximity. It seems therefore that I hear myself speak immediately in the very moment that I am speaking. According to Derrida, Husserl's own description of temporalization however undermines the idea that I hear myself speak immediately. On the one hand, Husserl describes what he calls the “living present,” the present that I am experiencing right now, as being perception, and yet Husserl also says that the living present is thick. The living present is thick because it includes phases other than the now, in particular, what Husserl calls “protention,” the anticipation (or “awaiting,” we might say) of the approaching future and “retention,” the memory of the recent past. As is well known, Derrida focuses on the status of retention in Voice and Phenomenon. Retention in Husserl has a strange status since Husserl wants to include it in the present as a kind of perception and at the same time he recognizes that it is different from the present as a kind of non-perception. For Derrida, Husserl's descriptions imply that the living present, by always folding the recent past back into itself, by always folding memory into perception, involves a difference in the very middle of it (Speech and Phenomena, p. 69). In other words, in the very moment, when silently I speak to myself, it must be the case that there is a miniscule hiatus differentiating me into the speaker and into the hearer. There must be a hiatus that differentiates me from myself, a hiatus or gap without which I would not be a hearer as well as a speaker. This hiatus also defines the trace, a minimal repeatability. And this hiatus, this fold of repetition, is found in the very moment of hearing-myself-speak. Derrida stresses that “moment” or “instant” translates the German “Augenblick,” which literally means “blink of the eye.” When Derrida stresses the literal meaning of “Augenblick,” he is in effect “deconstructing” auditory auto-affection into visual auto-affection. When I look in the mirror, for example, it is necessary that I am “distanced” or “spaced” from the mirror. I must be distanced from myself so that I am able to be both seer and seen. The space between, however, remains obstinately invisible. Remaining invisible, the space gouges out the eye, blinds it. I see myself over there in the mirror and yet, that self over there is other than me; so, I am not able to see myself as such. What Derrida is trying to demonstrate here is that this “spacing” (espacement) or blindness is essentially necessary for all forms of auto-affection, even tactile auto-affection which seems to be immediate.

Now, let us go to another “other place,” which can be found in “How to Avoid Speaking.” Here Derrida discusses negative theology by means of the idea of “dénégation,” “denegation” or “denial.” The French word “dénégation” translates Freud's term “Verneinung.” With its negative prefix (“ver”), this German term implies a negation of a negation, a denial then but one that is also an affirmation. The fundamental question then for negative theology, but also psychoanalysis, and for Derrida is how to deny and yet also not deny. This duality between not telling and telling is why Derrida takes up the idea of the secret. In “How to Avoid Speaking,” Derrida says, and this is an important comment for understanding the secret in Derrida: “There is a secret of denial [dénégation] and a denial [dénégation] of the secret. The secret as such, as secret, separates and already institutes a negativity; it is a negation that denies itself. It de-negates itself” (Languages of the Unsayable, p. 25, my emphasis). Here Derrida speaks of a secret as such. A secret as such is something that must not be spoken; we then have the first negation: “I promise not to give the secret away.” And yet, in order to possess a secret really, to have it really, I must tell it to myself. Here we can see the relation of hearing-oneself-speak that we just saw in Voice and Phenomenon. Keeping a secret includes necessarily auto-affection: I must speak to myself of the secret. We might however say more, we might even say that I am too weak for this speaking of the secret to myself not to happen. I must have a conceptual grasp of it; I have to frame a representation of the secret. With the idea of a re-presentation (I must present the secret to myself again in order to possess it really), we also see retention, repetition, and the trace or a name. A trace of the secret must be formed, in which case, the secret is in principle shareable. If the secret must be necessarily shareable, it is always already shared. In other words, in order to frame the representation of the secret, I must negate the first negation, in which I promised not to tell the secret: I must tell the secret to myself as if I were someone else. I thereby make a second negation, a “de-negation,” which means I must break the promise not to tell the secret. In order to keep the secret (or the promise), I must necessarily not keep the secret (I must violate the promise). So, I possess the secret and do not possess it. This structure has the consequence of there being no secret as such. A secret is necessarily shared. As Derrida says in “How to Avoid Speaking,”

This denial [dénégation] does not happen [to the secret] by accident; it is essential and originary. … The enigma … is the sharing of the secret, and not only shared to my partner in the society but the secret shared within itself, its ‘own’ partition, which divides the essence of a secret that cannot even appear to one alone except in starting to be lost, to divulge itself, hence to dissimulate itself, as secret, in showing itself: dissimulating its dissimulation. There is no secret as such; I deny it. And this is what I confide in secret to whomever allies himself to me. This is the secret of the alliance. (Languages of the Unsayable, p. 25)

Now, finally, let us go to one of the most recent of Derrida's writings, to his 2002 “The Reason of the Strongest,” the first essay in the book called Rogues. There Derrida is discussing the United Nations, which he says combines the two principles of Western political thought: sovereignty and democracy. But, “democracy and sovereignty are at the same time, but also by turns, inseparable and in contradiction with one another” (Rogues, p. 100). Democracy and sovereignty contradict one another in the following way. And here Derrida is speaking of pure sovereignty, the very “essence of sovereignty” (Rogues, p. 100). On the one hand, in order to be sovereign, one must wield power oneself, take responsibility for its use by oneself, which means that the use of power, if it is to be sovereign, must be silent; the sovereign does not have to give reasons; the sovereign must exercise power in secret. In other words, sovereignty attempts to possess power indivisibly, it tries not to share, and not sharing means contracting power into an instant — the instant of action, of an event, of a singularity. We can see the outline here of Derrida's deconstruction not only of the hearing-oneself-speak auto-affection but also of the auto-affection of the promising-to-oneself to keep a secret. On the other hand, democracy calls for the sovereign to share power, to give reasons, to universalize. In democracy the use of power therefore is always an abuse of power. Derrida can also say that sovereignty and democracy are inseparable from one another (the contradiction makes them heterogeneous to one another) because democracy even though it calls for universalization (giving reasons in an assembly) also requires force, freedom, a decision, sovereign power. For Derrida, in democracy, a decision (the use of power) is always urgent; and yet (here is the contradiction), democracy takes time, democracy makes one wait so that the use of power can be discussed. Power can never be exercised without its communication; as Derrida says, “As soon as I speak to the other, I submit to the law of giving reason(s), I share a virtually universalizable medium, I divide my authority” (Rogues, p. 101). There must be sovereignty, and yet, there can be no use of power without the sharing of it through repetition. More precisely, as Derrida says, “Since [sovereignty] never succeeds in [not sharing] except in a critical, precarious, and unstable fashion, sovereignty can only tend, for a limited time, to reign without sharing. It can only tend toward imperial hegemony. To make use of the time is already an abuse” (Rogues, p. 102, Derrida's emphasis). This tendency defines what Derrida calls “the worst,” a tendency toward the complete appropriation or extermination of all the others.

4. Elaboration of the Basic Argumentation: The Worst and Hospitality

Throughout his career, Derrida elaborates on the basic argumentation in many ways. But Derrida always uses the argumentation against one idea, which Derrida calls “the worst” (le pire). We can extract a definition of the worst from “Faith and Knowledge” (Religion, p. 65). It revolves around an ambiguous phrase “plus d'un,” which could be translated in English as “more than one,” “more of one,” or “no more one.” On the one hand, this phrase means that in auto-affection, even while it is “auto,” the same, there is more than one; immediately with one, there is two, the self and other, and others. On the other hand, it means that there is a lot more of one, only one, the most one. The worst derives from this second sense of “plus d'un.” The worst is a superlative; it is the worst violence. Derrida, it seems, distinguishes the worst violence from what Kant had called “radical evil.” Radical evil is literally radical, evil at the root. It consists in the small, “infinitesimal difference” (see Of Grammatology, p. 234) between me and an other, even between me and an other in me. Derrida would describe this infinitesimal hiatus as the address, the “à” or the “to”; it is not only difference, across the distance of the address, it is also repetition. And, it is not only a repetition; this self-divergence is also violence, a rending of oneself, an incision. Nevertheless, radical evil is not absolute evil (see Philosophy in a Time of Terror, p. 99). The worst violence occurs when the other to which one is related is completely appropriated to or completely in one's self, when an address reaches its proper destination, when it reaches only its proper destination. Reaching only its proper destination, the address will exclude more, many more, and that “many more,” at the limit, amounts to all. It is this complete exclusion or this extermination of the most – there is no limit to this violence — that makes this violence the worst violence. The worst is a relation that makes of more than one simply one, that makes, out of a division, an indivisible sovereignty. We can see again that the worst resembles the “pure actuality” of Aristotle's Prime Mover, the One God: the sphere, or better, the globe of thought thinking itself (Rogues, p. 15).

What we have just laid out is the structure of the worst in Derrida's thinking. But the structure, for Derrida, can always happen as an event. Derrida thinks that today, “in a time of terror,” after the end of the Cold War, when globalization is taking place, the fragility of the nation-state is being tested more and more. Agencies such as the International Criminal Court, the demand for universal human rights encroach on nation-state sovereignty. But the result of this universalization or “worlding” (“mondialisation” is the French word for globalization) is that the concept of war, and thus of world war, of enemy, and even of terrorism, along with the distinctions between civilian and military or between army, police, and militia, all of these concepts and distinctions are losing their pertinence. As Derrida says here in Rogues “what is called September 11 will not have created or revealed this situation, although it will have surely media-theatricalized it” (Rogues, pp. 154-55). Now, with globalization, there is no identifiable enemy in the form of a “state” territory with whom one (in Rogues Derrida uses this phrase: “the United States and its allies”) would wage what could still be called a “war,” even if we think of this as a war on international terrorism. The balance of terror of the Cold War that insured that no escalation of nuclear weapons would lead to a suicidal operation, Derrida says, “all that is over.” Instead, “a new violence is being prepared and in truth has been unleashed for some time now, in a way that is more visibly suicidal or auto-immune than ever. This violence no longer has to do with world war or even with war, even less with some right to wage war. And this is hardly re-assuring – indeed, quite the contrary” (Rogues, p. 156).

What does it mean to be “more suicidal”? To be more suicidal is to kill oneself more. The “more” means that, since there is only a fragile distinction between states (there is no identification of the enemy), one's state or self includes more and more of the others. But, if one's self includes others that threaten (so-called “terrorist cells,” for example), then, if one wants to immune oneself, then one must murder more and more of those others that are inside. Since the others are inside one's state or one's self, one is required to kill more and more of oneself. This context is very different from the rigid and external opposition, symbolized by the so-called “Iron Curtain,” that defined the Cold War. There and then, “we” had an identifiable enemy, with a name, which allowed the number of the enemies to be limited. But here and now, today, the number of “enemies” is potentially unlimited. Every other is wholly other (“tout autre est tout autre” [cf. The Politics of Friendship, p. 232]) and thus every single other needs to be rejected by the immune system. This innumerable rejection resembles a genocide or what is worse an absolute threat. The absolute threat can no longer be contained when it comes neither from an already constituted state nor even from a potential state that might be treated as a rogue state (Rogues, p. 105). What Derrida is saying here is that the worst is possible, here and now, more possible than ever.

As I said, Derrida always uses the basic argumentation that we have laid out against the idea of the worst; today the tendency towards the worst is greater than ever. The purpose in the application – this purpose defines deconstruction — is to move us towards, not the worst violence, not the most violence, but the least violence (Writing and Difference, p. 130). How does the application of the argumentation against the worst work? Along with globalization, the post-Cold War period sees, as Derrida says in “Faith and Knowledge,” a “return of the religious” (Religion, pp. 42-43). So, in “Faith and Knowledge,” Derrida lays out the etymology of the Latin word “religion” (he acknowledges that the etymology is problematic). The etymology implies that there are “two sources” of religion: “religio,” which implies a holding back or a being unscathed, safe and sound; and “re-legere,” which implies a linking up with another through faith (Religion, p. 16). We can see in this etymology the inseparable dualities we examined above: singular event and machine-like repeatability; auto-affection as hetero-affection. Most importantly, Derrida is trying to understand the “link” that defines religion prior to the link between man as such and the divinity of God. What we can see in this attempt to conceive the link as it is prior to its determination in terms of man and God is an attempt to make the link be as open as possible. Derrida is attempting to “un-close,” as much as possible, the sphericity or englobing of thought thinking itself – in order to open the link as wide as possible, open it to every single other, to any other whatsoever. Throughout his career, Derrida is always interested in the status of animality since it determines the limit between man and others. As his final book demonstrates, L'animal que donc je suis, Derrida is attempting to open the link even to animals. Animals are other and, because “every other is wholly other” (tout autre est tout autre), the link must be open to them too. Here despite the immense influence they have had on his thought, Derrida breaks with both Heidegger and Levinas both of whom did not open the link this wide (see Points, p. 279). Here, with the “door” or “border” open as wide as possible, we encounter Derrida's idea of “unconditional hospitality,” which means letting others in no matter what, without asking them for papers, without judging them, even when they are uninvited. All are to be treated not as enemies who must be expelled or exterminated, but as friends.

This unconditional openness of the borders is not the best (as opposed to what we were calling the worst above). It is only the less bad or less evil, the less violence. Why? The unconditional opening is not possible. There are always conditions. Among all the others we must decide, we must assign them papers, which means that there is always still, necessarily violence at the borders. At once, in hospitality, there is the force that moves towards to the other to welcome and the force to remain unscathed and pulled back from the other, trying to keep the door closed. Here too, in hospitality, we see Derrida's idea of a “messianism without messiah.” Because letting all the others in is impossible, this de-closing is always to come in the future like the messiah coming or coming back (Derrida plays on the French word for the future, “l'avenir,” which literally means “to come,” “à venir”). We must make one more point. The impossibility of unconditional hospitality means that any attempt to open the globe completely is insufficient. Being insufficient, every attempt therefore requires criticism; it must be “deconstructed,” as Derrida would say. But this deconstruction would be a deconstruction that recognizes its own insufficiency. Deconstruction, to which we now turn, never therefore results in good conscience, in the good conscience that comes with thinking we have done enough to render justice.

5. Deconstruction

As we said at the beginning, “deconstruction” is the most famous of Derrida's terms. He seems to have appropriated the term from Heidegger's use of “destruction” in Being and Time. But we can get a general sense of what Derrida means with deconstruction by recalling Descartes's First Meditation. There Descartes says that for a long time he has been making mistakes. The criticism of his former beliefs both mistaken and valid aims towards uncovering a “firm and permanent foundation.” The image of a foundation implies that the collection of his former beliefs resembles a building. In the First Meditation then, Descartes is in effect taking down this old building, “de-constructing” it. We have also seen how much Derrida is indebted to traditional transcendental philosophy which really starts here with Descartes' search for a “firm and permanent foundation.” But with Derrida, we know now, the foundation is not a unified self but a divisible limit between myself and myself as an other (auto-affection as hetero-affection: “origin-heterogeneous”).

Derrida has provided many definitions of deconstruction. But three definitions are classical. The first is early, being found in the 1971 interview “Positions” and in the 1972 Preface to Dissemination: deconstruction consists in “two phases” (Positions, pp. 41-42, Dissemination, pp.4-6). At this stage of his career Derrida famously (or infamously) speaks of “metaphysics” as if the Western philosophical tradition was monolithic and homogeneous. At times he also speaks of “Platonism,” as Nietzsche did. Simply, deconstruction is a criticism of Platonism, which is defined by the belief that existence is structured in terms of oppositions (separate substances or forms) and that the oppositions are hierarchical, with one side of the opposition being more valuable than the other. The first phase of deconstruction attacks this belief by reversing the Platonistic hierarchies: the hierarchies between the invisible or intelligible and the visible or sensible; between essence and appearance; between the soul and body; between living memory and rote memory; between mnēmē and hypomnēsis; between voice and writing; between finally good and evil. In order to clarify deconstruction's “two phases,” let us restrict ourselves to one specific opposition, the opposition between appearance and essence. Nietzsche had also criticized this opposition but it is clearly central to phenomenological thinking as well. So, in Platonism, essence is more valuable than appearance. In deconstruction however, we reverse this, making appearance more valuable than essence. How? Here we could resort to empiricist arguments (in Hume for example) that show that all knowledge of what we call essence depends on the experience of what appears. But then, this argumentation would imply that essence and appearance are not related to one another as separate oppositional poles. The argumentation in other words would show us that essence can be reduced down to a variation of appearances (involving the roles of memory and anticipation). The reduction is a reduction to what we can call “immanence,” which carries the sense of “within” or “in.” So, we would say that what we used to call essence is found in appearance, essence is mixed into appearance. Now, we can back track a bit in the history of Western metaphysics. On the basis of the reversal of the essence-appearance hierarchy and on the basis of the reduction to immanence, we can see that something like a decision (a perhaps impossible decision) must have been made at the beginning of the metaphysical tradition, a decision that instituted the hierarchy of essence-appearance and separated essence from appearance. This decision is what really defines Platonism or “metaphysics.” After this retrospection, we can turn now to a second step in the reversal-reduction of Platonism, which is the second “phase” of deconstruction. The previously inferior term must be re-inscribed as the “origin” or “resource” of the opposition and hierarchy itself. How would this re-inscription or redefinition of appearance work? Here we would have to return to the idea that every appearance or every experience is temporal. In the experience of the present, there is always a small difference between the moment of now-ness and the past and the future. (It is perhaps possible that Hume had already discovered this small difference when, in the Treatise, he speaks of the idea of relation.) In any case, this infinitesimal difference is not only a difference that is non-dualistic, but also it is a difference that is, as Derrida would say, “undecidable.” Although the minuscule difference is virtually unnoticeable in everyday common experience, when we in fact notice it, we cannot decide if we are experiencing the past or the present, if we are experiencing the present or the future. Insofar as the difference is undecidable, it destabilizes the original decision that instituted the hierarchy. After the redefinition of the previously inferior term, Derrida usually changes the term's orthography, for example, writing “différence” with an “a” as “différance” in order to indicate the change in its status. Différance (which is found in appearances when we recognize their temporal nature) then refers to the undecidable resource into which “metaphysics” “cut” in order to makes its decision. In “Positions,” Derrida calls names like “différance” “old names” or a “paleonyms,” and there he also provides a list of these “old terms”: “pharmakon”; “supplement”; “hymen”; “gram”; “spacing”; and “incision” (Positions, p. 43). These names are old because, like the word “appearance” or the word “difference,” they have been used for centuries in the history of Western philosophy to refer to the inferior position in hierarchies. But now, they are being used to refer to the resource that has never had a name in “metaphysics”; they are being used to refer to the resource that is indeed “older” than the metaphysical decision.

This first definition of deconstruction as two phases gives way to the refinement we find in the “Force of Law” (which dates from 1989-1990). This second definition is less metaphysical and more political. In “Force of Law,” Derrida says that deconstruction is practiced in two styles (Deconstruction and the Possibility of Justice, p. 21). These “two styles” do not correspond to the “two phases” in the earlier definition of deconstruction. On the one hand, there is the genealogical style of deconstruction, which recalls the history of a concept or theme. Earlier in his career, in Of Grammatology, Derrida had laid out, for example, the history of the concept of writing. But now what is at issue is the history of justice. On the other hand, there is the more formalistic or structural style of deconstruction, which examines a-historical paradoxes or aporias. In “Force of Law,” Derrida lays out three aporias, although they all seem to be variants of one, an aporia concerning the unstable relation between law (the French term is “droit,” which also means “right”) and justice.

Derrida calls the first aporia, “the epoche of the rule” (Deconstruction and the Possibility of Justice, pp. 22-23). Our most common axiom in ethical or political thought is that to be just or unjust and to exercise justice, one must be free and responsible for one's actions and decisions. Here Derrida in effect is asking: what is freedom. On the one hand, freedom consists in following a rule; but in the case of justice, we would say that a judgment that simply followed the law was only right, not just. For a decision to be just, not only must a judge follow a rule but also he or she must “re-institute” it, in a new judgment. Thus a decision aiming at justice (a free decision) is both regulated and unregulated. The law must be conserved and also destroyed or suspended, suspension being the meaning of the word “epoche.” Each case is other, each decision is different and requires an absolutely unique interpretation which no existing coded rule can or ought to guarantee. If a judge programmatically follows a code, he or she is a “calculating machine.” Strict calculation or arbitrariness, one or the other is unjust, but they are both involved; thus, in the present, we cannot say that a judgment, a decision is just, purely just. For Derrida, the “re-institution” of the law in a unique decision is a kind of violence since it does not conform perfectly to the instituted codes; the law is always, according to Derrida, founded in violence. The violent re-institution of the law means that justice is impossible. Derrida calls the second aporia “the ghost of the undecidable (Deconstruction and the Possibility of Justice, pp. 24-26). A decision begins with the initiative to read, to interpret, and even to calculate. But to make such a decision, one must first of all experience what Derrida calls “undecidability.” One must experience that the case, being unique and singular, does not fit the established codes and therefore a decision about it seems to be impossible. The undecidable, for Derrida, is not mere oscillation between two significations. It is the experience of what, though foreign to the calculable and the rule, is still obligated. We are obligated – this is a kind of duty — to give oneself up to the impossible decision, while taking account of rules and law. As Derrida says, “A decision that did not go through the ordeal of the undecidable would not be a free decision, it would only be the programmable application or unfolding of a calculable process” (Deconstruction and the Possibility of Justice, p. 24). And once the ordeal is past (“if this ever happens,” as Derrida says), then the decision has again followed or given itself a rule and is no longer presently just. Justice therefore is always to come in the future, it is never present. There is apparently no moment during which a decision could be called presently and fully just. Either it has not a followed a rule, hence it is unjust; or it has followed a rule, which has no foundation, which makes it again unjust; or if it did follow a rule, it was calculated and again unjust since it did not respect the singularity of the case. This relentless injustice is why the ordeal of the undecidable is never past. It keeps coming back like a “phantom,” which “deconstructs from the inside every assurance of presence, and thus every criteriology that would assure us of the justice of the decision” (Deconstruction and the Possibility of Justice, pp. 24-25). Even though justice is impossible and therefore always to come in or from the future, justice is not, for Derrida, a Kantian ideal, which brings us to the third aporia. The third is called “the urgency that obstructs the horizon of knowledge” (Deconstruction and the Possibility of Justice, pp. 26-28). Derrida stresses the Greek etymology of the word “horizon”: “As its Greek name suggests, a horizon is both the opening and limit that defines an infinite progress or a period of waiting.” Justice, however, even though it is un-presentable, does not wait. A just decision is always required immediately. It cannot furnish itself with unlimited knowledge. The moment of decision itself remains a finite moment of urgency and precipitation. The instant of decision is then the moment of madness, acting in the night of non-knowledge and non-rule. Once again we have a moment of irruptive violence. This urgency is why justice has no horizon of expectation (either regulative or messianic). Justice remains an event yet to come. Perhaps one must always say “can-be” (the French word for “perhaps” is “peut-être,” which literally means “can be”) for justice. This ability for justice aims however towards what is impossible.

Even later in Derrida's career he will formalize, beyond these aporias, the nature of deconstruction. The third definition of deconstruction can be found in an essay from 2000 called “Et Cetera.” Here Derrida in fact presents the principle that defines deconstruction:

Each time that I say ‘deconstruction and X (regardless of the concept or the theme),’ this is the prelude to a very singular division that turns this X into, or rather makes appear in this X, an impossibility that becomes its proper and sole possibility, with the result that between the X as possible and the ‘same’ X as impossible, there is nothing but a relation of homonymy, a relation for which we have to provide an account…. For example, here referring myself to demonstrations I have already attempted …, gift, hospitality, death itself (and therefore so many other things) can be possible only as impossible, as the im-possible, that is, unconditionally (Deconstruction: a User's Guide, p. 300, my emphasis).

Even though the word “deconstruction” has been bandied about, we can see now the kind of thinking in which deconstruction engages. It is a kind of thinking that never finds itself at the end. Justice – this is undeniable – is impossible (perhaps justice is the “impossible”) and therefore it is necessary to make justice possible in countless ways.


Works by Derrida

English translations

References and further reading

Other Internet Resources

Related Entries

Deleuze, Gilles | Foucault, Michel | Heidegger, Martin | Husserl, Edmund | Levinas, Emmanuel | phenomenology | postmodernism | Ricoeur, Paul