Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy
This is a file in the archives of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.


First published Thu Sep 5, 2002; substantive revision Tue Mar 3, 2009

Libertarianism holds that agents initially fully own themselves and have moral powers to acquire property rights in external things under certain conditions. It is normally advocated as a theory of justice in the sense of the duties that we owe each other. So understood, it is silent about any impersonal duties (i.e., duties owed to no one) that we may have.

Libertarianism can be understood as a basic principle or as a derivative one. For example, one might defend libertarianism on the basis of rule utilitarianism or rule contractarianism (see, e.g., Narveson 1988). Here, however, we shall focus on libertarianism as a natural rights doctrine.

Libertarianism is often thought of as “right-wing” doctrine. This, however, is mistaken for at least two reasons. First, on social—rather than economic—issues, libertarianism tends to be “left-wing”. It opposes laws that restrict consensual and private sexual relationships between adults (e.g., gay sex, non-marital sex, and deviant sex), laws that restrict drug use, laws that impose religious views or practices on individuals, and compulsory military service. Second, in addition to the better-known version of libertarianism—right-libertarianism—there is also a version known as “left-libertarianism”. Both endorse full self-ownership, but they differ with respect to the powers agents have to appropriate unappropriated natural resources (land, air, water, etc.). Right-libertarianism holds that typically such resources may be appropriated by the first person who discovers them, mixes her labor with them, or merely claims them—without the consent of others, and with little or no payment to them. Left-libertarianism, by contrast, holds that unappropriated natural resources belong to everyone in some egalitarian manner. It can, for example, require those who claim rights over natural resources to make a payment to others for the value of those rights. This can provide the basis for a kind of egalitarian redistribution.

The best known early statement of (something close to) libertarianism is Locke (1690). The most influential contemporary work is Nozick (1974).

1. Self-Ownership

Libertarianism holds that agents are, at least initially, full self-owners. Agents are (moral) full self-owners just in case they morally own themselves in just the same way that they can morally fully own inanimate objects. Full ownership of an entity consists of a full set of the following ownership rights: (1) control rights over the use of the entity: both a liberty-right to use it and a claim-right that others not use it, (2) rights to compensation if someone uses the entity without one's permission, (3) enforcement rights (of prior restraint if someone is about to violate these rights), (4) rights to transfer these rights to others (by sale, rental, gift, or loan), and (5) immunities to the non-consensual loss of these rights. Full ownership is simply a logically strongest set of ownership rights over a thing.[1] There is some indeterminacy in this notion (since there can be more than one strongest set of such rights), but there is a determinate core set of rights (see below).

At the core of full self-ownership, then, is full control self-ownership, the full right to control the use of one's person. Something like control self-ownership is arguably needed to recognize the fact there are some things (e.g., various forms of physical contact) that may not be done to a person without her consent, but which may be done with that consent.

Full-self ownership is sometimes thought to guarantee that the agent has a certain basic liberty of action, but this is not so. For if the rest of the world (natural resources and artifacts) is fully (“maximally”) owned by others, one is not permitted to do anything without their consent—since that would involve the use of their property. The protection that self-ownership affords is a basic protection against others doing certain things to one, but not a guarantee of liberty. Even this protection, however, may be merely formal. A plausible thesis of self-ownership must allow that some rights (e.g., against imprisonment) may be lost if one violates the rights of others. Hence, if the rest of world is owned by others, then anything one does without their consent violates their property rights, and, as a result of such violations, one may lose some or all of one's rights of self-ownership. This point shows that, because agents must use natural resources (occupy space, breathe air, etc.), self-ownership on its own has no substantive implications. It is only when combined with assumptions about how the rest of the world is owned (and the consequences of violating those property rights) that substantive implications follow.

Let us now consider four important objections to full self-ownership. One objection is that it permits voluntary enslavement. For agents have, it claims, not only the right to control the use of their person, but also the right to transfer that right (e.g., by sale or gift) to others. Some libertarians—such as Rothbard (1982)—deny that such transfer is even possible, since others cannot control one's will. This, however, seems to be a mistake, since what is at issue is the moral right to control permissible use (by giving or denying permission), not the psychological capacity to control. Many authors—such as Locke (1690) and Grunebaum (1987)—deny that the rights over oneself are so transferable, typically on the ground that such transfers undermine one's autonomy. These authors thus reject full self-ownership, although they endorse a partial form. Those who defend the right of self-enslavement—Steiner (1994), for example—typically defend it on the ground (roughly) that the right to exercise one's autonomy is more fundamental than the protection or promotion of one's autonomy.

A second objection to full self-ownership is that it denies that individuals have an obligation to perform actions that help others, except through voluntary commitment. Some authors who endorse a form of self-ownership—such as Locke (1690) and Grunebaum (1987)—hold that one's rights of self-control are limited by an obligation to provide aid to others when the aid is necessary for their basic survival. Such authors thus reject full self-ownership. Those who reject the obligation to help the needy typically do so on the ground that it induces a form of partial slavery.

A third substantive objection to full self-ownership is that it includes a right to make gifts of one's services, and that such gifts, when given from members of an older generation to members of a younger generation, can significantly disrupt the conditions of equality of opportunity. (Note that the right to make gifts of external things is not at issue here, since it does not follow from full self-ownership alone.) The right to make gifts of personal services can be defended by emphasizing how such gifts are an essential part of intimate personal relationships. Moreover, if a person has the right to perform an action for her own benefit, then she arguably also has the right to perform it for someone else's benefit. A possible reply here is that, although the donor may well have the power to make gifts of her services, others may not have a right to the full benefit of those services (e.g., the benefits may not be immune to taxation).

A fourth objection to full self-ownership is that it (like rights in general) can lead to inefficient outcomes. Where there are externalities or public goods (such as police protection), each person may be better off if some of each person's rights are infringed (e.g., if each person is required to provide service each week on a police patrol). Given the problems generated by prisoners' dilemmas and other kinds of market failure, in large societies it will typically be impossible to obtain everyone's consent to perform such services. Given the importance of such services, it is arguably permissible to force individuals to provide certain services (in violation of full self-ownership) as long as everyone benefits appropriately.

2. The Power to Appropriate Natural Resources: Libertarianism, Left and Right

Libertarianism is committed to full self-ownership. A distinction can be made, however, between right-libertarianism and left-libertarianism, depending on the stance taken on how natural resources can be owned.

One possible view holds that initially no one has any liberty right to use, or any moral power to appropriate, natural resources. A radical version of joint-ownership left-libertarianism, for example, holds that individuals may use natural resources only with the collective consent (e.g., majority or unanimous) of the members of society. Given that all action requires the use of some natural resources (land, air, etc.), this leaves agents no freedom of action (except with the permission of others), and this is clearly implausible. A less radical version of joint-ownership left-libertarianism allows that agents may use natural resources, but holds that they have no moral power to appropriate natural resources without the collective consent of the members of society (e.g., Grunebaum 1987). Although this leaves agents a significant range of freedom of action, it leaves them little security in their plans of action. They have the security that others are not permitted to use their person (e.g., assault them) without their consent, but they have only limited security in their possessions of external things (except with the consent of others). Agents are permitted to cultivate and gather apples, but others are permitted to take them when this violates no rights of self-ownership (e.g., when they can simply take them from the collected pile).

Given the central importance of security of some external resources, it is implausible that agents have no power to appropriate without the consent of others. More specifically, it is most implausible to hold that the consent of others is required for appropriation when communication with others is impossible, extremely difficult, or expensive (as it almost always is). And even when communication is relatively easy and costless, there is no need for the consent of others as long as one appropriates no more than one's fair share. Joint-ownership left-libertarianism is thus implausible.

A plausible account of liberty rights and powers of appropriation over natural resources must, I claim, be unilateralist in the sense that, under a broad range of conditions (although perhaps subject to various conditions), (1) agents are initially permitted to use natural resources without anyone's consent, and (2) agents initially have the power to appropriate (acquire rights over) natural resources without anyone's consent. This is just to say that initially natural resources are not protected by a property rule (requiring consent for permissible use or appropriation).

According to a unilateralist conception of the power to appropriate, agents who first claim rights over a natural resource acquire those rights—perhaps provided that certain other conditions are met. These additional conditions may include some kind of an interaction constraint (such as that the agent “mixed her labor” with the resource or that she was the first to discover the resource) and some kind of “fair share” constraint. In what follows, for simplicity, I shall ignore the interaction constraint and focus on the fair share constraint.

Let us, then, consider some unilateralist versions of libertarianism. Radical right libertarianism— advocated, for example, by Rothbard (1978, 1982), Narveson (1988, ch. 7; 1999), and Feser (2005)—holds that that there are no fair share constraints on use or appropriation.[2] Agents may destroy whatever natural resources they want (as long as they violate no one's self-ownership) and they have the power to appropriate whatever natural resources they first claim. On this view, natural resources are initially not merely unprotected by a property rule (i.e., permissible use does not require anyone's permission); they are also unprotected by a compensation liability rule (i.e., no compensation is owed if one uses). A main objection to this view is that no human agent created natural resources, and there is no reason that the lucky person who first claims rights over a natural resource should reap all the benefit that the resource provides. Nor is there any reason to think the individuals are morally permitted to ruin or monopolize natural resources as they please. Some sort of fair share condition restricts use and appropriation.

Consider Lockean libertarianism, which allows unilateral use and appropriation but requires the satisfaction of some version of the Lockean proviso that “enough and as good” be left for others. Lockean libertarianism views natural resources as initially unprotected by any property rule (no consent is needed for use or appropriation) but as protected by a compensation liability rule. Those who use natural resources, or claim rights over them, owe compensation to others for any costs imposed.

Nozickean right-libertarianism—advocated, for example, by Nozick (1974)—interprets the Lockean proviso as requiring that no individual be made worse off by the use or appropriation of a natural resource compared with non-use or non-appropriation.[3] One might object that this sets the compensation payment too low. It bases compensation on each person's reservation price, which is the lowest payment that would leave the individual indifferent with non-use or non-appropriation. Use or appropriation of natural resources typically brings significant benefits even after providing such compensation. There is little reason, one might argue, to hold that those who first use or claim rights over a natural resource should reap all the excess benefits that those resources provide.

Sufficientarian (centrist) libertarianism—such as something in the spirit of the quasi-libertarian Simmons (1992, 1993)—interprets the Lockean proviso as requiring that others be left an adequate share of natural resources (on some conception of adequacy).[4] There are different criteria that can be invoked for adequacy, but the most plausible ones are based on the quality of one's life prospects: enough for life prospects worth living, enough for basic subsistence life prospects, or enough for “minimally decent” life prospects. Depending on the nature of the world and the conception of adequacy, the sufficientarian proviso may be more, or less, demanding than the Nozickean proviso. If natural resources are sufficiently abundant relative to the individuals, then Nozickean proviso will be more demanding (since many individuals would get more than an adequate share without the use or appropriation), but if natural resources are sufficiently scarce, then the sufficientarian proviso will be more demanding than the Nozickian one.

Although sufficientarian libertarianism may be more sensitive than Nozickean libertarianism to the quality of life prospects left to others, some libertarians, left-libertarians, argue that it nevertheless fails to recognize the extent to which natural resources belong to all of us in some egalitarian manner. Suppose that there are enough natural resources to give everyone fabulous life prospects, and someone appropriates (or uses) natural resources leaving others only minimally adequate life prospects and generating ultra fabulously life prospects for herself. Left-libertarians argue that it is implausible to hold that those who use or first claim a natural resource are entitled to reap all the benefits in excess of what is needed to leave others adequate life prospects. Natural resources were not created by any human agent and their value, they argue, belongs to all of us in some egalitarian manner.

Let us now consider left-libertarianism. It holds that natural resources initially belong to everyone in some egalitarian manner. We have already rejected one version—joint-ownership left-libertarianism—for failing to be unilateralist (i.e., because it requires the permission of others for use or appropriation of unowned natural resources). We shall now focus on Lockean (and hence unilateralist) versions of left-libertarianism.

Equal share left-libertarianism—advocated, for example, by Henry George (1879) and Hillel Steiner (1994)—interprets the Lockean proviso as requiring that one leave an equally valuable per capita share of the value of natural resources for others. Individuals are morally free to use or appropriate natural resources, but those who use or appropriate more than their per capita share—based on the competitive value (based on demand and supply; e.g., market clearing price or auction price) under morally relevant conditions—owe others compensation for their excess share.

Even equal share libertarianism, one might argue, is not sufficiently egalitarian. Although it requires that the competitive value of natural resources be distributed equally, it does nothing to offset disadvantages in unchosen internal endowments (e.g., the effects of genes or childhood environment). Equal share libertarianism is thus compatible with radically unequal life prospects.[5]

Consider, then, equal opportunity left-libertarianism advocated, for example, by Otsuka (2003).[6] It interprets the Lockean proviso as requiring that one leave enough for others to have an opportunity for wellbeing that is at least as good as the opportunity for wellbeing that one obtained in using or appropriating natural resources. Individuals who leave less than this are required to pay the full competitive value of their excess share to those deprived of their fair share. Unlike the equal share view, those whose initial internal endowments provide less favorable effective opportunities for wellbeing are entitled to larger shares of natural resources. Although this version of libertarianism is highly egalitarian, it limits the egalitarianism to the distribution of the value of the natural resources. Full self-ownership still places constraints on the promotion of equality: Individuals are not morally required to provide personal services or body parts merely because they have more valuable personal endowments.

3. Enforcement Rights: Prior Restraint and Rectification

So far, we have addressed the core libertarian rights of full self-ownership and the right to appropriate natural resources. A complete libertarian theory must also specify what enforcement rights individuals have when others violate their rights. The idea of full self-ownership does not include a full specification of enforcement rights. This is because the relevant idea is universal full self-ownership (i.e., every agent being a full self-owner), and this notion is indeterminate with respect to enforcement rights (as well as compensation rights). For a given individual, a maximal set of self-ownership rights would include both a full immunity against loss even if the agent violates the rights of others (and hence others would not be permitted to use non-consensual force against her ever) and maximal enforcement rights against others (which would permit the agent to use force against others in order to prevent their violation of her rights). This set of rights, however, is not universalizable. If one agent has the strong immunity to loss of rights, then other agents cannot have the strong enforcement rights (which require the offending agent to have lost some of her rights of self-ownership). Thus, full (universalizable) self-ownership can include no enforcement rights (but a full immunity to loss), or full enforcement rights (but no immunity to loss for rights violations), or anything in between. (On the issue of indeterminacy, see Fried (2004, 2005) and Vallentyne, Steiner, and Otsuka (2005).

One possible position is extreme pacificism, according to which individuals are never permitted to use non-consensual force against others. Another is moderate pacificism, according to which individuals are permitted to use non-consensual force against others only when necessary in self-defense (or the defense of others). This moderate view would allow the use of force against a person to prevent her from wrongfully using force against others, but it would not allow the use of force to rectify past violations (e.g., punish or extract compensation from the rights-violator). Most libertarian positions would allow the use of force for cases of rectification. Many would allow the use of force for retributive punishment, but some—Barnett (1998), for example—reject retributive punishment and insist that compensation for wrongful harms is the sole justification for the rectificatory use of force.

4. Anarchism and the Minimal State

Libertarianism holds that many of the powers of the modern welfare state are morally illegitimate. Agents of the state violate the rights of citizens when they punish, or threaten to punish, a person for riding a motorcycle without a helmet, for taking drugs, for refusing to serve in the military, for engaging in consensual sexual relations in private, or for gambling. Furthermore, agents of the state violate the rights of citizen when they force, or threaten to force, individuals to transfer their legitimately held wealth to the state in order to provide for pensions, to help the needy, or to pay for public goods (e.g., parks or roads). (Left-libertarians object to such transfers to the extent that these are in excess of what is owed for the appropriation of natural resources.) Some libertarian-leaning theorists—such as Hayek (1960)—argue that it is legitimate to force people to pay their fair share of the costs of providing basic police services (i.e., protection of the libertarian rights and prosecution of those who violate them), but it's hard to see how this could be legitimate on right-libertarian grounds. If one does not voluntarily agree to share one's wealth in this way, the mere fact that one reaps a benefit from the services does not, on libertarian grounds, generate an enforceable duty to pay one's fair share.[7]

One objection, then, that libertarians raise against the modern welfare state is that it uses force, or the threat thereof, to restrict people's freedom to engage in activities that do not violate anyone's rights. A second objection is that the modern welfare state—and most states generally—uses force, or the threat thereof, to restrict people's freedom to use force to protect and enforce their own rights. Although most states recognize a right to use force in self-defense, few states recognize a legal right to forcibly extract compensation from, or punish, a person who has violated one's rights. The state may punish those who attempt to impose the relevant rectification—even if the private citizens impose the very same rectification that the state would impose. Non-pacifist libertarians, however, deny this. Each individual has the right to enforce his rights in various ways, and these are not lost unless the individual voluntarily gives them up. The objection here, then, is not that agents of the state enforce people's rights (which they are perfectly entitled to do if the protected person so wishes), but rather that the state uses force to prevent citizens from directly enforcing their own rights.

The above objections to the modern welfare state would be made both by right-libertarians and left-libertarians. Left-libertarians, however, can endorse certain “state-like” activities that right-libertarians reject. For on most left-libertarian views, individuals have an enforceable duty to pay others for the value of the rights that they claim over natural resources. Individuals seeking economic justice could form organizations that, under certain conditions, could force individuals to give them the payment they owe for their rights over natural resources, and could then transfer the payments to the individuals who are owed payments (after deducting a fee for the service, if the person agrees). The organization could also provide various public goods such as basic police services, national defense, roads, parks, and so on. By providing such public goods, the value of the rights claimed over natural resources by individuals will increase (e.g., rights over land for which police protection is provided are more valuable than rights over that land without police protection). Such public goods could be provided when and only when they would be self-financing based on the increased rents that they generate.

Such “justice-promoting” organizations thus engage in many of the activities of the modern states, and left-libertarianism can accept the legitimacy of such activities. There are, however, three important qualifications. First, organizational activities are limited to enforcing people's libertarian rights and to enhancing people's opportunities by providing public goods. Force is never used to restrict activities that violate no libertarian rights. Second, no monopoly on such activities is claimed. There may be many organizations providing such services. Third and finally, the agents of the organization are permitted to use force to make an agent make her payment for the value of rights over natural resources only if such use is, in some suitable sense, the most reliable way of ensuring that she discharges her duty. Corrupt or inefficient organizations are not permitted to use force to collect such payments. Furthermore, even honest and efficient organizations are not so permitted when the individual owing the payment will voluntarily make the payment directly to the relevant parties. (For elaboration, see Vallentyne, 2007.)

Libertarianism, then, is not only critical of the modern welfare state, but of states in general. Given that so much of modern life seems to require a state, libertarianism's anarchist stance is a powerful objection against it. In reply, libertarians argue that (1) many of the effects of states are quite negative, (2) many of the positive effects can be obtained without the state through voluntary mechanisms, and (3) even if some positive effects cannot be so obtained, the ends do not justify the means in these cases.

5. Some Miscellaneous Issues

5.1 Non-Autonomous Sentient Beings

Libertarianism asserts that each autonomous agent initially fully owns herself and that agents have moral power to acquire property rights in natural resources and artifacts. What is the status of non-autonomous beings—such as children and many animals—that have moral standing (e.g., because sentient)? One possible reply is to deny that there are any non-autonomous beings wth moral standing (e.g., because only beings capable of having moral duties—agents—are owed any duties). Non-autonomous beings are simply things to be used. As such, they can be the full private property of agents. Few people, however, will accept that position. Children are not the full private property of their parents. Dogs may not be tortured for fun. Another possibility is to hold that non-autonomous sentient beings are also full self-owners, where the rights involved are understood as protecting their interests rather than their choices (see, for example, Vallentyne 2002). This, of course, would have the wild implication that rats are protected by rights of self-ownership. Perhaps there is some plausible intermediate position, but if so, it has not yet been developed adequately.

5.2 Historical Principles and the Real World

According to libertarianism, the justice of the current distribution of legal rights over resources depends on what the past was like. Given that the history of the world is full of systematic violence (genocide, invasion, murder, assault, theft, etc.), we can be sure that the current distribution of legal rights over resources did not come about justly and that adequate reparations have not been made. At the same time, however, we have little knowledge of the specific rights violations that took place in the past (e.g., we have little knowledge of all but the most egregious rights violations that took place more than one hundred years ago). Thus, we have little knowledge of what justice today requires.

The epistemic problem confronting libertarianism is similar to that confronting utilitarianism and other consequentialist theories. Consequentialist theories require knowledge of the entire future that will result from each possible action, and we have very little such knowledge. Libertarianism requires knowledge of the entire past, and we also have very little such knowledge. The appropriate answer in both cases is that the facts determine what is just, and we should simply make out best judgements about what is just based on what we know. Moral reality is complex, and it's not surprising that it's extremely difficult to know what is permissible.

In the case of libertarianism, an additional response is possible. One could hold that there is a moral statute of limitations for rights violations. After the passage of enough time—or perhaps, after the passage of enough time during which no claim for rectification is made—the right of rectification for a specific past rights-violation may cease to be valid. If the period of time is short enough (e.g., 100 years), this would radically reduce the epistemic problem. It's not clear, however, that there is a plausible principled libertarian justification (as opposed to a practical one) for such a statute of limitations.

6. Conclusion

Libertarianism is attractive because (1) it provides significant moral liberty of action, (2) it provides and significant moral protection against interference from others and because it is sensitive to what the past was like (e.g., what agreements were made and what rights violations took place). It faces, however, the serious objection that it gives too much protection from interference and not enough attention to making the future better (e.g., by meeting people's basic needs, making people's lives go better, or promoting equality). As with all prominent moral and political theories, the overall assessment of libertarianism is a matter of on-going debate.




Related Topics

Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]

Related Entries

anarchism | liberalism | liberty | Locke, John | property | rights


For helpful comments, I thank Brad Hooker, Thomas Pogge, Hillel Steiner, and Nic Tideman.